Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri 6 May, 2005

An implicature is something meant, implied, or suggested distinct from what is said. Implicatures can be part of sentence meaning or dependent on conversational context, and can be conventional or unconventional. Conversational implicatures have become one of the principal subjects of pragmatics. Figures of speech provide familiar examples. An important conceptual and methodological issue in semantics is how to distinguish senses and entailments from conventional implicatures. Implicature has been invoked for a variety of purposes, from defending controversial semantic claims in philosophy to explaining lexical gaps in linguistics. H. P. Grice, who coined the term “implicature,” and classified the phenomenon, developed an influential theory to explain and predict conversational implicatures, and describe how they are understood. The “Cooperative Principle” and associated “Maxims” play a central role. Other authors have focused on principles of politeness and communicative efficiency. Questions have been raised as to how well these principle-based theories account for the intentionality of speaker implicature and conventionality of sentence implicature. Critics observe that speakers often have goals other than the cooperative and efficient exchange of information, and that conventions are always arbitrary to some extent.

1. The Phenomenon

H. P. Grice (1913–1988) was the first to systematically study cases in which what a speaker means differs from what the sentence used by the speaker means. Consider the following dialogue.

  1. Alan: Are you going to Paul's party?
    Barb: I have to work.

If this was a typical exchange, Barb meant that she is not going to Paul's party. But the sentence she uttered does not mean that she is not going to Paul's party. Hence Barb did not say that she is not going, she implied it. Grice introduced the technical terms implicate and implicature for the case in which what the speaker meant, implied, or suggested is distinct from what the speaker said.[1] Thus Barb “implicated” that she is not going; that she is not going was her “implicature.” Implicating is what Searle (1975: 265–6) called an indirect speech act. Barb performed one speech act (meaning that she is not going) by performing another (meaning that she has to work).

By “saying,” Grice meant not the mere utterance of words. What Barb said is what she stated, namely, that she has to work, something she could have stated by saying different words. As Grice realized, “say” is used more or less strictly.[2] Thus if Carl says “The largest planet is a gas giant,” we will sometimes count him as saying (and thus not implicating) that Jupiter is a gas giant. We will follow Grice in using “say” more narrowly, requiring that what a speaker says be closely related to what the sentence uttered conventionally means. So we will take Carl to have implicated that Jupiter is a gas giant by saying that the largest planet is.

Our sample implicature is said to be conversational. The implicature is not part of the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered, but depends on features of the conversational context. In our example, a key feature was the question Alan asked. Had he asked “What are you going to do today?”, Barb could have implicated something completely different—“I am going to work”—by saying the same thing. Grice contrasted a conversational implicature with a conventional implicature, by which he meant one that is part of the meaning of the sentence used.

  1. (a) He is an Englishman; he is, therefore, brave.
    (b) His being an Englishman implies that he is brave.

Grice observed that speakers who use (2a) implicate (2b). They imply, but do not say, that his being an Englishman implies that he is brave. Barb's sentence can be used with its conventional meaning without implicating what she did. But (2a) cannot be used with its conventional meaning without implicating (2b). The meaning of “therefore” creates this implicature.

There is another sense in which even conversational implicatures can be conventional. Consider:

  1. (a) Some athletes smoke
    (b) Not all athletes smoke.

It would be conventional for people who say “Some athletes smoke” to conversationally implicate that not all athletes smoke. Because they do not say that not all athletes smoke, they would not be lying if they thought that all athletes did smoke. They might be guilty of misleading their audience, but not of lying. The implicature is not conventional in Grice's sense. For “Not all athletes smoke” is not part of the meaning of “Some athletes smoke.” Hence there is no contradiction in saying “Some athletes smoke; indeed, all do.” A conventional implicature in Grice's narrow sense is part of the conventional meaning of the sentence used. Consequently it is a semantic rather than pragmatic phenomenon. A conventional implicature in the more general sense is something that is customarily implicated, and thus may be semantic or pragmatic. Grice called conventional conversational implicatures “generalized” implicatures.

If an implicature is conventional in either sense, we may say that the sentence carries that implicature. Thus even though Barb implicates that she is not going to Paul's party, “I have to work” does not itself implicate this. Conversely, “Some athletes smoke” implicates that not all do even if Carl has never implicated this when he has used the sentence.[3]

Conversational implicatures differ from Grice's conventional implicatures in being cancelable and reinforceable. Whereas (2a) cannot be used without implicating (2b), the indicated implicature of (3a) can be canceled. The speaker may do this by adding “Indeed, all do,” “and possibly all do,” or “if not all” after uttering (3a). Or the context itself may cancel the implicature, as when it is obvious to all that the speaker is deliberately engaging in understatement. Similarly, conjoining one sentence to a second that means what the first merely implicates reinforces the implicature, and does not sound redundant. Consider “Some athletes smoke, but not all do.” This makes explicit what is normally implicit when someone utters (3a). In contrast, conjoining (2b) to (2a) just sounds redundant.

As our examples make clear, it is not possible to understand speakers fully without knowing what they have implicated as well as what they have said. Semantics, conceived as the study of the meaning of words and sentences, does not exhaust the study of meaning. The study of implicature (conventional or unconventional) is included in pragmatics. The phenomenon of conventional semantic implicature shows further that the study of truth conditions does not exhaust semantics. It is well known that sentences of the form “p but q” have the same truth conditions as “p and q,” but differ markedly in meaning. “But” signals an implicature which “and” lacks: roughly, that it may be unexpected or surprising to say that q after having said that p.

Implicature is important even in truth conditional semantics. For example, logicians customarily take English sentences of the form “p or q” to be true provided “p” or “qor both are true. Thus “It is not the case that cats meow or dogs bark” would be counted as false. But there are also cases in which speakers use “p or q” to mean that “p” or “q” is true but not both. Some maintain that “or” is ambiguous in English, with an inclusive and an exclusive sense. But another possibility is that the exclusive interpretation is a conventional conversational implicature rather than a second sense. One piece of evidence supporting this hypothesis is that the exclusive interpretation seems cancelable. Thus “Bush will visit France or Germany or both” does not have a reading on which “France or Germany” rules out “both.” Another is that “Bill will not visit France or Germany” has no interpretation on which it is true because Bill will visit both places. A methodological issue is to describe the evidence that would be needed to decide whether a particular interpretation is a sense or a conventional conversational implicature. A foundational issue to is describe exactly what the difference between the two consists in.

Sentences of the form “The F is G” imply in a distinctive way that there is one and only one F. Russell (1905) proposed that “The F is G” is equivalent to “There is one and only one F and it is G.” Strawson (1950) objected that this made a statement like “The present king of France is bald” clearly false. In an intuitive sense, the statement presupposes rather than asserts that there is a unique king of France. Since this presupposition is false, the statement is out of place, and should just be withdrawn. Following Frege (1892), Strawson defined a presupposition as a necessary condition for a statement being either true or false. “The present king of France is bald” has no truth value, because there is no king of France. Strawson's view thus complicates logical theory by denying bivalence. A third position, advocated by Kartunnen & Peters (1979), is that the uniqueness implication is a conventional implicature.[4] This allows them to maintain that “The F is G” has the Russellian truth conditions, while acknowledging that it is not synonymous with “There is one and only one F and it is G.” They can allow that the non-truth conditional component of meaning makes it as inappropriate for us to say that “The present king of France is bald” is false as it is for us to say that “Sandra Day O'Connor is a woman but smart” is true. To make matters even more complex, the existence and uniqueness implications of negations of “The F is G” have signal properties of conversational implicatures, as Grice (1981) noted. Thus “The present king of France did not visit Washington” ordinarily presupposes that there is a present king of France. But this presupposition is cancelled in “Since there is no such person, the king of France did not visit Washington.”

Implicature is often invoked in this way to defend controversial semantic claims. A recent example is provided by the debate between Millians and Fregeans about names. The Millian is a referential theorist who holds that the meaning of a name is its referent. An immediate consequence of this view is that coreferential names are synonymous, and that names without a referent are meaningless. It seems evident, though, that “Superman” and “Clark Kent” are far from meaningless, and would not be synonymous even if the story of Superman were true. As evidence for both claims, we can observe that “Lois Lane believes that Clark Kent is Clark Kent” seems true, while “Lois Lane believes that Clark Kent is Superman” seems false. Hence the two sentences, and the two names that differentiate them, must have different meanings. Millians have recently proposed that the source of these linguistic intuitions is a difference in implicature between the sentences, not a difference in meaning.[5] One version observes that when we use a sentence to say something about the world, we often implicate something about the sentence itself. In particular, when we use sentences of the form “S believes that p,” we often implicate that S believes that the sentence “p” is true. Since “Clark Kent is Clark Kent” and “Clark Kent is Superman” are different sentences on any theory, the two belief sentences mentioned above can definitely be used with different metalinguistic implicatures. Grice observed that implicatures are generally attached to the meaning of the expressions used, so that “it is not possible to find another way of saying the same thing, which simply lacks the implicature in question”(1975: 39). Grice thus used “non-detachability” as a test of implicature. He allowed exceptions to the rule, though, “where some special feature of the substituted version is itself relevant to the determination of an implicature (in virtue of one of the maxims of Manner).” Metalinguistic implicatures – those that refer to the particular words the speaker used—are clearly detachable. Whether this Gricean defense of Millianism succeeds is a matter of debate.

Implicature has also been used to explain lexical gaps. Horn observed that the lexicon of a natural language has an economical asymmetry.[6] Logical concepts tend not to be lexicalized if they are commonly conveyed by implicature. Consider “no,” for example. When this appears in “___ S are P,” the result is a sentence meaning “All S are not-P.” There is no English word, however, that in the same context would produce a sentence meaning “Not all S are P.” Horn attributes this to the fact that “Some S are P” conveys “Not all S are P” by implicature, while no English sentence conveys “All S are not-P” by implicature. Similarly, there is an English word meaning “not either” (“neither”), but no term meaning “not both.” Horn correlates this with the fact that “p or q” implicates “¬(p&q),” while no sentence form implicates “¬(porq).”

2. Gricean Theory

In addition to identifying and classifying the phenomenon of implicature, Grice developed a theory designed to explain and predict conversational implicatures. He also sought to describe how such implicatures are understood. Grice (1975: 26–30) postulated a general “Cooperative Principle,” and four “maxims” specifying how to be cooperative. It is common knowledge, he asserted, that people generally follow these rules for efficient communication.

Cooperative Principle. Contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation.

Maxim of Quality. Make your contribution true; so do not convey what you believe false or unjustified.

Maxim of Quantity. Be as informative as required.

Maxim of Relation. Be relevant.

Maxim of Manner. Be perspicuous; so avoid obscurity and ambiguity, and strive for brevity and order.

Grice viewed these rules not as arbitrary conventions, but as instances of more general rules governing rational, cooperative behavior. For example, if a woman is helping a man build a house, she will hand him a hammer rather than a tennis racket (relevance), more than one nail when several are needed (quantity), straight nails rather than bent ones (quality), and she will do all this quickly and efficiently (manner).

Implicatures like that in dialogue (1) are explained in terms of the Maxim of Relation, and are therefore called “relevance implicatures.” Barb would have infringed the Maxim of Relation, it is claimed, unless her contribution were relevant to the purpose of the conversation. If Barb is being cooperative, then she is trying to answer Alan's question. Given that working is incompatible with partying, Barb must have intended to communicate that she is not going to the party. Implicatures like that in (3) are explained in terms of the Maxim of Quantity, and so are called “quantity implicatures.” Assuming that the accepted purpose of the conversation requires the speaker to say whether or not all athletes smoke, a speaker who said “Some athletes smoke” would be infringing the Maxim of Quantity if she meant only what she said. So she must have meant more. If she believed that all athletes smoke, she would have said so. Since she did not, she must have meant that some but not all athletes smoke. As a bonus, she achieved brevity, in conformity to the Maxim of Manner.

Grice thought that some implicatures arise by flouting the maxims. This happens when what a cooperative speaker says so patently violates the maxims that the hearer must infer that the speaker is implying something different. Irony and metaphor are thought to arise from flouting the Maxim of Quality. Thus Candy might answer Alan ironically as follows.

  1. Alan: Are you going to Paul's party?
    Candy: I don't like parties.

If Alan knows full well that Candy is a party animal, he could reason that if she meant what she said, she would be lying, thus violating the Maxim of Quality. So she must have meant something else. If she meant that she does like parties, then she would be in conformity with the Maxim. And via the Maxim of Relation, she would have answered Alan's question.

Generalizing from these examples, Grice provided a theoretical account of what it is to conversationally implicate something that has been widely adopted, sometimes with subtle variations. A representative formulation goes as follows, with S the speaker, and H the hearer.

Theoretical Definition: S conversationally implicates p iff S implicates p when:
(i) S is presumed to be observing the Cooperative Principle (cooperative presumption);

(ii) The supposition that S believes p is required to make S's utterance consistent with the Cooperative Principle (determinacy); and

(iii) S believes (or knows), and expects H to believe that S believes, that H is able to determine that (ii) is true (mutual knowledge).[7]

Given this account, Barb's implicature in (1) is conversational provided: Barb was presumed to be contributing what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation; the supposition that she believes she is not going to the party is required to make her utterance consistent with the Cooperative Principle; and she believes, and expects Alan to believe that she believes, that Alan is able to determine that that supposition is required.

In addition to holding that conversational implicatures are constituted by their relation to the Cooperative Principle, Grice held that they could be identified or “calculated” using the principle.

Calculability Assumption: Conversational implicatures must be capable of being worked out.[8]

To “work out” an implicature is to infer it in a specific way from the Cooperative Principle using particular facts about the meaning of the sentence uttered and the context of utterance.

The presence of a conversational implicature must be capable of being worked out; for even if it can in fact be intuitively grasped, unless the intuition is replaceable by an argument, the implicature (if present at all) will not count as a conversational implicature; it will be a conventional implicature. To work out that a particular conversational implicature is present, the hearer will rely on the following data: (1) the conventional meaning of the words used, together with the identity of any references that may be involved; (2) the Cooperative Principle and its maxims; (3) the context, linguistic or otherwise, of the utterance; (4) other items of background knowledge; and (5) the fact (or supposed fact) that all relevant items falling under the previous headings are available to both participants and both participants know or assume this to be the case. A general pattern for the working out of a conversational implicature might be given as follows:

He has said that q; there is no reason to suppose that he is not observing the maxims, or at least the Cooperative Principle; he could not be doing this unless he thought that p; he knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I can see that the supposition that he thinks that p is required; he has done nothing to stop me thinking that p; he intends me to think, or is at least willing to allow me to think, that p; and so he has implicated that p.” (Grice 1975: 31; my emphasis)

Grice's Theoretical Definition entails that S's conversationally implicating that p depends on the determinacy of S's believing that p, and on S's believing that H can determine that S's belief is required. The Calculability Assumption goes further, entailing that H is able to reason from the fact that S's belief is required to the conclusion that S has implicated that p. The definition says that an implicature is conversational provided conditions (i) – (iii) are satisfied. It does not entail that H can validly infer that S implicated p from (i) – (iii). The Calculability Assumption does that.

Grice goes further. In addition to postulating that the conversationality of an implicature depends on determinacy and the other two conditions, and that the implicature can be recognized on the basis of those conditions, Grice claimed that these three conditions give rise to or generate the implicatures. The implicatures exist because conditions (i) – (iii) are satisfied.

Generative Assumption: Conversational implicatures exist because of the fact that the cooperative presumption, determinacy, and mutual knowledge conditions hold.[9]

Whereas the Calculability Assumption is epistemological, the Generative Assumption is ontological, explaining the constitution of conversational implicatures. On Grice's view, the factors that give rise to conversational implicatures are precisely those that enable hearers to recognize them.

From his assumption that conversational implicatures can be explained and predicted on the basis of facts about the Cooperative Principle, Grice drew a methodological conclusion that has come to be known as “Grice's Razor.”

Grice's Razor: Other things equal, it is preferable to postulate conversational implicatures rather than senses, conventional semantic implicatures, or semantic presuppositions because conversational implicatures can be derived from independently motivated psycho-social principles. [10]

The pithy formulation is “Senses are not to be multiplied beyond necessity,” alluding to Ockham. If a phenomenon can be explained and predicted in terms of such principles, then it is theoretically more economical to do so than to posit senses and the like, which cannot be so explained. Grice's Razor has been applied to many cases, including “or,” described above. The principle enjoins us to classify the exclusive interpretation of “p or q” as an implicature rather than as a second sense. The thought is that given the inclusive sense, it can be predicted using the Cooperative Principle that speakers will commonly use “p or q” to implicate that not both are true. So there is no need to postulate a second sense.

3. Theoretical Difficulties

While Grice viewed his ideas as tentative and exploratory, followers have taken the theory to be well established. Indeed, it has served as a paradigm for research in pragmatics. Gricean theory has been invoked repeatedly to defend semantic claims made in all areas of philosophy. But many problems have emerged (see Davis 1998).

A relatively minor objection is that the Calculability and Generative Assumptions do not provide a foundation for Grice's Razor. This methodological principle assumes that conversational implicatures can be derived from psycho-social principles, meaning that they can be inferred from and explained by them. The only psycho-social principles Grice formulates are the Cooperative Principle and associated Maxims.[11] But these are not what explain conversational implicatures if the other parts of Grice's theory is correct. The Generative Assumption says that what explains conversational implicatures is the cooperative presumption, along with determinacy and mutual knowledge. The Calculability Assumption similarly says that conversational implicatures can be inferred from these three conditions. The cooperative presumption is not the Cooperative Principle itself, however. The presumption is the belief or assumption that the speaker is observing the Cooperative Principle. The fact that a particular audience does or should presume something about a principle is not itself a general principle, and is not explained by that principle. Similarly, the fact that speakers generally contribute what the conversation requires does not tell us that a particular belief is required, and so does not explain the determinacy condition. The Generative Assumption would be falsified, in fact, if “Cooperative Principle” replaced “cooperative presumption.” For speakers contribute what the conversation requires, and thus observe the Cooperative Principle, by implicating things.

Furthermore, Grice's Razor is concerned with sentence implicatures, while the Generative and Calculability Assumptions are concerned with speaker implicatures. Grice presumably thought that what generally accounts for “particularized” implicatures would account for “generalized” implicatures. Indeed, the fact that speakers generally observe the Cooperative Principle could at least partly explain why speakers generally use sentences of the form “Some S are P” to implicate that not all S are P. Hence general conversational principles might help explain sentence implicatures. However, the fact that speakers generally contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of a conversation does not entail that a particular speaker is doing so on a given occasion. Hence the Cooperative Principle cannot give us much insight as to why the speaker implicated what he did then. What could explain that is the fact that the speaker intended to contribute what is required by the Cooperative Principle; but such a fact is not itself a general principle. For similar reasons, what really explains why speakers use a sentence form with a particular implicature is not that they do contribute what the conversation requires, but that they intend to (see §8). Even the intention to observe the Cooperative Principle does little to explain an implicature. Nothing in the Cooperative Principle or the Maxims, for example, tells us why a speaker would say “Some athletes smoke” and implicate “Not all athletes smoke” rather than vice versa. The same information gets “contributed” either way. Finally, it should be noted that words have senses because of linguistic conventions. Linguistic conventions are sustained by the fact that people want to contribute what is required by their conversational purposes. So the Cooperative Principle explains and predicts senses at least as well as it does implicatures.

The Generative Assumption states that conversational implicatures exist because of the fact that the cooperative presumption, determinacy, and mutual knowledge conditions hold. The Calculability Assumption states that a speaker's implicatures can be inferred from these conditions. A more serious objection is that the satisfaction of these three conditions seems insufficient to infer what a speaker implicates—that is, means, implies, or suggests. Critics observe that nothing in conditions (i) – (iii) tells us what the speaker S intends. The cooperative presumption condition tells us what others believe about S. The determinacy condition tells us S must have the belief that p. And the mutual knowledge condition tells us that determinacy is mutually believed. But as Grice (1957, 1969) himself emphasized, what a speaker means, implies, or suggests depends on the speaker's intentions. Even if we add the requirement that the cooperative presumption be true, and that S intends to contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation, nothing in the determinacy or mutual knowledge conditions entails that S intends to get H to believe p, to indicate that p, to communicate the idea that p, or anything of this sort. Without such intentions, it cannot be true that S implicated that p.[12]

4. The Differentiation Problem

Many have argued that Gricean theory “overgenerates” implicatures.[13] For nearly every implicature that appears to be correctly predicted by Gricean theory, others appear to be falsely predicted. The schema used to “work out” observed implicatures can usually be used just as well to work out nonexistent implicatures. So the schema as formulated is not a reliable method of inferring implicatures. By a simple application of Mill's Methods, such failures of differentiation would mean that the observed implicatures do not exist because of the Gricean factors. For a variety of examples, see Davis (1998: Ch. 2). To illustrate the problem here, we will focus on the case that has been most extensively studied, and is most favorable to Grice's theory.

Example (3) is a typical quantity implicature, in which a weaker statement is used to implicate that a stronger claim is false. Quantity implicatures are also called “scalar” implicatures, because the weaker and stronger statements form a logical scale. Griceans attempt to explain these implicatures in terms of the Maxim of Quantity, according to which one is to be just as informative as required. The idea is that if the speaker were in a position to make the stronger statement, he would have. Since he did not, he must believe that the stronger statement is not true.

To show that these regular scalar inferences are indeed implicatures we need now to produce a Gricean argument deriving the inference…. A short version of the argument might go as follows:

The speaker has said A(e2); if S was in a position to state that a stronger item on the scale holds—i.e. to assert A(e1)—then he would be in breach of the first maxim of Quantity if he asserted A(e2). Since I the addressee assume that S is cooperating, and therefore will not violate the maxim of Quantity without warning, I take it that S wishes to convey that he is not in a position to state that the stronger item e1 on the scale holds, and indeed knows that it does not hold

More generally, and somewhat more explicitly:

  1. S has said p
  2. There is an expression q, more informative than p (and thus q entails p), which might be desirable as a contribution to the current purposes of the exchange (and here there is perhaps an implicit reference to the maxim of Relevance)
  3. q is of roughly equal brevity to p; so S did not say p rather than q simply in order to be brief (i.e. to conform to the maxim of Manner)
  4. Since if S knew that q holds but nevertheless uttered p he would be in breach of the injunction to make his contribution as informative as is required, S must mean me, the addressee, to infer that S knows that q is not the case (K¬q), or at least that he does not know that q is the case (¬Kq).

The important feature of such arguments to note is that they derive an implicature by reference to what has not been said: the absence of a statement A(e1), in the presence of a weaker one, legitimates the inference that it is not the case that A(e1), via the maxim of Quantity. (Levinson 1983: 134–135)[14]

In the typical case represented by (3), S says “Some athletes smoke” (e2, p), and implicates “Not all athletes smoke.” The stronger statement S does not make (e1, p) is “All athletes smoke.” This is not the only stronger statement S does not make, however. There are countless other comparably brief but more informative statements that S does not make. Indeed, “Some athletes smoke” is the low point on several different scales.

Some athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke

Several athletes smoke

At least 1% of athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke occasionally

Many athletes smoke

At least 10% of athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke often

Most athletes smoke

At least 50% of athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke regularly

Nearly all athletes smoke

At least 50% of athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke constantly

All athletes smoke

100% of athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke

Some athletes smoke

Some athletes and maids smoke

Some athletes smoke Marlboros

I know some athletes smoke

Some athletes, maids, and cops smoke

Some athletes smoke filterless Marlboros

Everyone knows some athletes smoke

The reasoning Levinson has sketched provides no basis for discriminating among all the stronger statements the speaker might have made that would have been relevant and comparable in brevity. So if the reasoning predicts that people who say “Some athletes smoke” implicate “Not all athletes smoke,” then it also predicts that they implicate “Less than 1% of athletes smoke,” “No athletes smoke constantly,” “No athletes smoke filterless Marlboros,” and other things they do not in fact implicate. Among the infinity of statements stronger than “Some athletes smoke,” “All athletes smoke” is highly unusual in that people typically implicate its denial.

Many other differences in implicature are difficult to explain in terms of Gricean theory. Suppose H asks S “Do any athletes smoke?” If S answered “Some do,” S would typically implicate that not all smoke. A logically equivalent answer, however, would be “Yes.” But if S gave that answer, S would typically not implicate that all athletes smoke. A “Yes” answer leaves it open whether or not all athletes smoke. Since a speaker who answers a yes-no question “Yes” is being fully cooperative, it is unclear why being cooperative would require the speaker who answers “Some do” to provide any more information than “Yes” provides.

Similarly, Leech (1983: 91) noted that “John cut someone” implicates “John did not cut himself,” and accounted for this as a quantity implicature, using the sort of reasoning Levinson sketched. But a parallel statement like “John broke an arm” fails to implicate “John did not break his own arm.” On the contrary, it implicates that John did break his own arm. Harnish (1976) observed that “Bill and Tom moved the piano” commonly implicates that Bill and Tom moved the piano together. Griceans have attempted to account for this using the Maxim of Quantity, attributing it to the fact that the speaker did not make the stronger statement that they moved the piano separately. But the speaker equally well did not make the stronger statement that they moved the piano together. So why did the speaker not implicate that they moved the piano separately (i.e., not together)?

Another problem is to differentiate quantity implicatures from “close-but” implicatures (Davis 1998: §2.1, §3.6). Suppose someone asks “Did the Ethiopians win any gold medals?” The answer “They won some silver medals” would implicate not “They did not win every silver medal” but rather “They did not win any gold medals.” But “They won some gold medals” is not stronger than (i.e., does not entail) “They won some silver medals,” while “They won every silver medal” is stronger than “They won some silver medals.”

Finally, stress plays a role in signaling or generating implicatures that Gricen theorists have not addressed(cf. Van Kuppevelt 1996). With no stress, “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would not ordinarily have a quantity implicature. But “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would normally implicate that not all music Beethoven wrote was wonderful. “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would normally implicate that not every composer wrote some wonderful music. And “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would normally implicate that some of Beethoven's nonmusical writings are not wonderful. Accounting for the differences in implicature described in this section is an outstanding problem for pragmatic theory.

5. The Determinacy Problem

Grice's determinacy condition states that S conversationally implicates p only if S has to believe p if S's utterance is to be consistent with the Cooperative Principle. Determinacy is a key premise in the working out schema. It is hard to find contexts, though, in which the determinacy condition is satisfied. There are normally many alternative ways for a speaker to be cooperative, and contribute what is required by the purpose of the conversation. Grice takes for granted, and so will we, that the conventional meanings of the words used, along with the identity of any references, are held fixed. He assumes too, although not explicitly, that the speaker means by the words what the words mean conventionally, and thus is not misspeaking or using a code.

We noted above that Griceans account for irony in terms of flouting the Maxim of Quality. Thus when the party animal Candy answered Alan in (4) by saying “I don't like parties,” he could reason that if she meant what she said, she would be lying, and thus violating the Maxim of Quality. So she must have meant something different. If she meant that she loves parties, then she would be in conformity with the Maxim. So that must be what she meant. This reasoning, however, takes Barb's belief that she loves parties as given, and infers what she must have meant to be cooperative. It was not the Cooperative Principle that required her to believe that she loves parties. She would have made a perfectly suitable contribution to the conversation if she had meant and believed that she does not like parties. In general, the determinacy requirement is unsatisfied in the case of irony and other figures of speech because the speaker could have been speaking literally, believing what was said. There is also the possibility of using another figure of speech. For example, Candy would have made a suitable contribution to the conversation with Alan if she had been engaging in understatement instead of irony, meaning and believing that she hates parties.

The possibility of speaking figuratively also undermines the determinacy requirement when the speaker is actually being literal. In (1), Barb was speaking literally. But she could have been speaking ironically, meaning and believing that she did not have to work, thereby giving an affirmative answer to Alan's questions. In general, whether S observes the Maxim of Quality, and therefore the Cooperative Principle, depends on how what S believes relates to what S implicates. These are independent variables. But Grice's theory claims that what S implicates is that which the Cooperative Principle requires S to believe, making implicature the dependent variable. The problem is that independent of what S means and implicates, the Cooperative Principle does not tell us what S believes.

Metaphors are often difficult to interpret. Suppose a woman says “Iraq is Bush's Vietnam,” referring to George W. Bush and the second Gulf War. Did she mean that the U.S. will lose the Iraq war the way it lost the Vietnam War? That the reasons for going to war in Iraq were as misguided as those that got the U.S. into Vietnam? Or did she perhaps mean that even if the U.S. does not emerge with a clear victory, the Iraq war is still worth fighting? That the war would be won if only liberal opponents stopped eroding public support? According to Gricean theory, what the woman implicated is that which she has to believe to conform to the Cooperative Principle. But in many conversations, she could mean and believe any of these things and still be making a useful contribution. Grice said that “the conversational implicatum in such cases will be a disjunction of such specific explanations; and if the list of these is open, the implicatum will have just the kind of indeterminacy that many implicata do in fact have.”(1975: 39–40)[15] But if our woman is typical, she will not have implicated the disjunction of the possibilities suggested above. And to say that an implicature is indeterminate is to deny the determinacy condition.

The possibility of ignorance illustrates another way in implicatures are not determined by Gricean conditions. Recall that when Levinson was trying to derive quantity implicatures using the working out schema, he indicated that if a man says “Some athletes smoke” in a context in which it would be desirable to know whether or not all athletes smoke, then he must know that not all athletes smoke, or at least not know that all athletes smoke. The fact that these may both be possible means that the determinacy condition is unsatisfied. The speaker does not have to believe that not all died to conform to the Cooperative Principle. He could also be in conformity as long as he does not believe that all died. Indeed,there are cases in which speakers who assert “Some S are P” implicate “It is not known whether all S are P” rather than not “Not all S are P.” Suppose that after a plane crash, the NTSB spokesman says “Search and rescue teams have just arrived on the scene. Some of the passengers have survived.” The spokesman would most naturally have implicated "It is not known whether all survived" rather than "Not all survived." Accounting for implicatures when there are alternative ways to be cooperative is another outstanding problem for pragmatic theory.

6. Conflicting and Inapplicable Principles

When the Gricean maxims conflict, there is no way to determine what is required for conformity to the Cooperative Principle. In the case of irony, for example, Manner clashes with Quality. When Candy says “I don't like parties” we cannot interpret her as meaning what she said because on that interpretation she would be violating the Maxim of Quality. But we cannot interpret Candy as meaning the opposite of what she said, because on that interpretation, she would be violating the Maxim of Manner. It is hardly perspicuous to use a sentence to mean the opposite of what the sentence means. Indeed, it is hard to see how any implicatures could be worked out on the basis of the maxims, because it would always be more perspicuous to “explicate” a proposition rather than implicate it.

We use irony and other figures, of course, in part because we have conversational goals other than the efficient communication of information. We observe not only the Cooperative Principle, but also the Principle of Style.

Principle of Style: Be stylish, so be beautiful, distinctive, entertaining, and interesting.

A clear and simple prose style—“just the facts, please”—can be boring, tedious and dull. We liven up our writing with figures of speech and other devices. In the process, we sacrifice perspicuity (violating Manner). We sometimes “embellish” a narration to make it more interesting (violating Quality) and delete boring or ugly details even when they are important (violating Quantity).

The Gricean maxims often clash with the Principle of Politeness, emphasized by Leech (1983).[16]

Principle of Politeness: Be polite, so be tactful, generous, praising, modest, agreeable, and sympathetic.

Speakers frequently withhold information that would be offensive or disappointing to the hearer, violating the Maxim of Quantity. Speakers often exaggerate in order to please or flatter, and utter “white lies” in order to spare the hearer's feelings, violating the Maxim of Quality. People pick “safe topics” (e.g., the weather) to stress agreement and communicate an interest in maintaining good relations—but violating the Maxim of Relation. Euphemisms avoid mentioning the unmentionable, but in the process violate Manner and Quantity.

Given the possibility of clashes among these principles, speakers often conversationally implicate something even though they are presumed to be observing the Principles of Style or Politeness rather than the Cooperative Principle. In case (1), Alan may correctly presume that Barb is simply making an excuse, or even trying to mislead him into thinking that she is not going. Barb may realize that Alan will presume such a thing. That does not stop her from meaning that she has to work and implicating that she will not be at Paul's party.

Even when style or politeness are not issues, the Cooperative Principle may fail to apply because there is no conversation, or because one has no mutually accepted purpose. Speakers and writers can use quantity implicatures and a wide range of figures of speech when they are not conversing with anyone. When there is a conversation, the speaker may try to change the subject, engage in idle chit-chat, or fight with his or her interlocutor. An extreme case arises when a witness is being cross-examined. The prosecutor's purpose is to extract as much incriminating evidence from the witness as possible. The witness's purpose is exactly the opposite. Consider a variation on (1) in which Alan is the prosecutor and Barb the witness in a case in which Barb is charged with murdering someone at Paul's party. Alan asks “Were you at Paul's party.” Barb might well answer “I had to work,” implicating that she was not at the party. She may implicate this even though everyone presumes that she is not being cooperative, instead making a desperate effort to mislead the prosecutor into believing that she was elsewhere. There may even be quantity implicatures, as when Alan asks “Did you talk to your friends at the party?” and Barb answers “Some of them,” implying that she did not talk to all.

What H presumes about S is relevant to whether S communicates with H. For S communicates with H only if H understands S. To understand S is to know what S means, and that requires knowing something about S. But implicatures are not necessarily communicated. Indeed, speakers can engage in implicature without even tying to communicate, as when they deliberately speak in a language their audience cannot understand, or when they have no audience at all.

7. “Relevance” Theory

The most influential alternative to Grice's theory is the “Relevance” Theory developed by Sperber and Wilson.[17]

We have proposed a definition of relevance and suggested what factors might be involved in assessments of degrees of relevance. We have also argued that all Grice's maxims can be replaced by a single principle of relevance—that the speaker tries to be as relevant as possible in the circumstances—which, when suitably elaborated, can handle the full range of data that Grice's maxims were designed to explain. (Wilson & Sperber 1986: 381).

The multiplicity of principles in the Gricean framework could be eliminated by omitting the maxims and putting forward only the Cooperative Principle. The question is whether any principle general enough to hold in all cases of implicature is capable of yielding specific predictions.

We will work with the relatively accessible formulation found in Wilson & Sperber (1986: 381–382). “Relevance” is used in a highly technical sense, roughly meaning communicative efficiency. “The relevance of a proposition increases with the number of contextual implications it yields and decreases as the amount of processing needed to obtain them increases” (382). The “contextual implications” of a proposition are propositions that can be deduced, by a restricted set of rules, from it together with the set of “contextual assumptions,” and that cannot be deduced from it or the contextual assumptions alone (381). “Contextual assumptions” are items of background knowledge relevant to the conversation, including “the propositions that have most recently been processed,” others logically and conceptually related to them, and input information from the perceptual environment (381–382). These remarks suggest that a speaker examines alternative propositions, evaluates the number of contextual implications per unit processing cost for each, and chooses to convey that proposition with the highest ratio. Putting this in the style of Grice's principles yields:

Principle of Relevance (Communicative Efficiency): Make your contribution be the one with the maximum ratio of contextual implications to processing cost.

The Sperber and Wilson principle is an application of cost-benefit analysis. The intuitive idea is that speakers try to provide as much new information (or misinformation) for the processing cost as possible.[18]

The Principle of Relevance does not imply any of Grice's principles. Nothing guarantees that the contribution with the greatest number of contextual implications per unit processing cost is: required by the accepted purpose of the conversation; true or justified, and thus informative; germane to the topic of the conversation (relevant in the ordinary sense); or perspicuous and brief (lengthy formulations are permitted as long as they have enough implications).

The Principle of Relevance seems to clash with the Principle of Politeness as badly as the Cooperative Principle does. Suppose that we are trying to figure out what to say after listening to our daughter struggle through her clarinet recital. It seems reasonable to assume that “Your performance was horrendous” is at least as easy to process as “Your performance was not perfect.” And it implies everything that the latter does in any context. So “Your performance was horrendous” would seem to have the greater ratio of contextual implications to processing cost. But considerations of their child's feelings, among other things, will lead most parents to prefer the less efficient contribution. The Principle of Relevance also clashes just as badly with the Principle of Style. Indeed, nothing in the Sperber and Wilson theory accounts for why a speaker would say “Some athletes smoke” and implicate “Not all do” rather than vice versa.

Relevance theory also seems to overgenerate implicatures. Suppose for example, that in a discussion of a new prescription drug benefit, someone comments “It will take some money to fund that program.” The speaker would normally have engaged in understatement, implicating “The program will be very expensive.” Relevance theorists account for this by saying that because the proposition explicitly said is trivial, and thus has few contextual implications, the hearer will “recover” the more informative proposition (See Carston 1987: 714 and Blakemore 1992: 60, 77-83). But any number of propositions are more informative than the one implicated, such as “The program will take trillions to fund.” If the reasoning were valid, we should expect all tautological sentences to have non-tautological implicatures; but such implicatures are the exception rather than the rule.

We have observed that sentences of the form “Some S are P” are used to implicate “Not all S are P” in a wide variety of contexts. Relevance theorists need to show that “Not all S are P” has the maximum ratio of contextual implications to processing costs in every one of these contexts. But many of the alternatives indicated above seem to be more informative while being just as easy to process.

Given the definition of “contextual implications,” there is one case in which the ratio of contextual implications to processing costs must be zero—that in which the proposition can be deduced from the contextual assumptions alone. For in that case, it has no contextual implications. Relevance theory thus predicts that speakers never implicate any item of background knowledge. This prediction is not borne out. Imagine that A and B are walking out in a torrential rain. A says “It is raining really hard.” B responds “There is indeed some rain coming down,” engaging in understatement. What B implicated is that there is lots of rain coming down. But this is an item of background knowledge, having just been asserted by A and processed by B—and obvious from perception. Consider also a variant on (1) in which Barb answers: “I'm going wherever Carl is going and Carl is going to Paul's party,” thereby implicating that she is going to Paul's party. When determining what the speaker implicated, what is said should presumably be counted as part of the background context. Since what Barb implicated can be deduced from what Barb said all by itself, it has no implications that cannot be deduced from the context alone. So the implication to cost ratio of what Barb implicated is zero, despite the fact that she did implicate it.

It is doubtful that the set of contextual implications is countable; if it is, it is only because of an ad hoc restriction on the allowable rules of deductive inference. And in general, we have no way of measuring processing cost. So “the maximum ratio of contextual implications to processing costs” is generally either undefined or unknowable. Consequently, it is hard to see how the Principle of Relevance can be used to account for any implicatures.

On other occasions, Sperber and Wilson formulate the Principle of Relevance in terms of “optimal relevance” rather than “maximal.” “An ostensive stimulus is optimally relevant to an addressee if and only if it has enough contextual effects to be worth his attention and puts him to no unjustified processing effort in accessing them”(1987: 743). By being qualitative, this may avoid the measurement problem. But calculability and determinacy go with it. Optimal relevance so defined does not pick out a unique contribution to the conversation. Many propositions will be informative enough to be worth processing other than those that are actually implicated.

Like Grice, Sperber and Wilson postulate that the speaker is presumed to be observing their key conversational principle. Relevance theorists need to show that hearers commonly have opinions about such maximal or optimal “relevance.” A final problem for either formulation of the principle is that the body of contextual assumptions or background information, in terms of which contextual implications are defined, is indeterminate. For example, in the case of irony discussed above in which Candy answered Alan by saying “I don’t like parties,” is the fact that Candy loves parties part of the context, or a potential contribution to the conversation? Relevance theory must provide answers to such questions if it is going to yield specific predictions.

8. Speaker Implicature and Intention

We have reviewed a number of outstanding problems for theories that seek to derive conversational implicatures from general conversational principles. What alternatives are there for explaining conversational implicatures, and describing how they are understood? That depends on whether we are concerned with speaker implicature or sentence implicature.

For a speaker to implicate something, we said at the outset, is for the speaker to mean (imply, suggest) something without saying it. It seems clear that what a speaker means is determined by the speaker's intentions. When Steve utters “Kathryn is a Russian teacher,” whether Steve means that Kathryn is a teacher of Russian nationality or a teacher of the Russian language, and whether he is speaking literally or ironically, depends entirely on what Steve intends to convey. Which intentions determine speaker meaning is a matter of debate. On Grice's (1957) view, to mean that p by e is to utter e with the intention of producing the belief that p in one's audience. Thus whether Steve means that Kathryn is a teacher of Russian or a teacher from Russia depends on which belief he is trying to produce in his audience. Grice's definition seems to have many counterexamples. Speakers who issue reminders are not trying to produce belief. People talking to themselves, or answering a teacher's question, are not even trying to produce activated or occurrent belief. People talking to babies or pets do not expect their audience to recognize what they mean, and people talking to the dead know that their audience cannot think or recognize anything. People sometimes speak in a particular language despite the fact—and occasionally because of the fact—that they know their audience does not understand it. The assumption made by Grice and his followers that speaker meaning is the attempt to communicate seems fundamentally mistaken. These problems can be avoided by specifying different intentions. On my view (Davis 2003: Ch. 5), for example, to mean that p is to directly express the belief that p. To express a belief or other mental state is to do something with the intention of providing an indication that one is in that state.[19] If Steve expressed the belief that Kathy is a teacher from Russia, then he intended his utterance of the sentence “Kathy is a Russian teacher” to be an indication that he believes she is a teacher from Russia. He can do this without trying to communicate with anyone.

Given that speaker meaning is a matter of speaker intention, it follows that speaker implicatures can be recognized or predicted by any of the methods we use to infer intentions from behavior, and can be explained by the usual factors we invoke to account for intentions. Suppose that while walking in the driving snow with Uli, Swede says “It is a good day!” We may wonder whether he was speaking literally, and meaning just what he said; or speaking ironically, and meaning the opposite of what he said; or perhaps engaging in understatement, and meaning that it is a wonderful day. We need to know what thought Swede intended to convey (or to impart). One thing we can do is ask him. If Swede tells us that he was using irony, that would be good evidence that he intended to express the belief, and thus implicated, that the weather is terrible. His intonation might be another indication. The fact that Swede is often ironic in similar situations would be supporting evidence. On the other hand, if we know that Swede loves snow, and freely expresses his feelings, that evidence would make it more likely that he intended to express the belief, and thus implicated, that the weather is wonderful. Finally, if Swede's companion has just suggested that they go in because the weather is lousy, the hypothesis that Swede intended to express the opposite belief because he wanted to stay out may provide the best explanation of his saying “It's a good day.” In that case, we would infer that he meant what he literally said.

While the existence of conversational implicatures does not depend in any way on the assumption that the speaker is observing the Cooperative Principle, conversational principles may play a role in the recognition of implicatures. Indeed, the Cooperative Principle and associated maxims, along with the principles of Style and Politeness, seem to play the same indirect role in implicature recognition that known tendencies play in inductive inference generally. Since speakers tend to observe the Cooperative Principle, and hearers know this in a vague and tacit sort of way, hearers tend to assume that particular speakers are cooperating, in the absence of evidence to the contrary. If the hypothesis that S is implicating p fits better with the assumption that S is being cooperative than the hypothesis that S is not, the hearer may conclude that S is implicating p, by hypothetical induction. Further support for the hypothesis may be provided by the recollection that S and other speakers have implicated similar things in similar circumstances before. The existence of an applicable implicature convention would be especially powerful evidence. The hypothesis may receive final confirmation after the fact from S's testimony.

When S is being uncooperative, we have to use other generalizations. Uncooperative behavior is no more difficult to recognize than cooperative behavior. We are familiar, for example, with the ways in which defendants manipulate language in an effort to avoid self-incrimination. When trying to infer what such a speaker is implicating, we use something other than Grice's working out schema. In general, we need to distinguish contextual clues to what a speaker intended from contextual determinants. As is the case with mental phenomena generally, the evidence we use to detect implicatures is not what makes them exist.

The standard picture originating with Gricean theory is that what the speaker says is determined by semantics, while what the speaker implicates is determined by what the speaker says together with a non-linguistic, pragmatic mechanism. A problem for this view, called “Grice's Circle” by Levinson (2000: Ch. 3), is that many of the processes involved in determining what is said, such as fixing pronominal reference, disambiguating, and unpacking ellipses, “involve exactly those inferential mechanisms that characterize Gricean pragmatics.”[20] For example, if an ambiguous term is used in a context, we naturally assume—without specific counterevidence—that the intended meaning was the one relevant to the topic of conversation. In a discussion of snow, “There is a large bank on Main Street” is naturally interpreted as referring to a snow bank. Once the grander claims of Gricean theory are set aside, however, it is unsurprising that conversational principles play much the same role in inferring both what is said and what is implicated. For what a speaker says is determined not only by the linguistic meaning of the words the speaker uttered, but also by what the speaker meant by them on that occasion. And speaker meaning is determined by speaker intention. Whether a speaker using the above sentence says that there is a snow bank or a commercial bank on Main Street is partly determined what the speaker means by “bank” on that occasion. But what the speaker means by that individual word is not dependent in any way on what the speaker used the whole sentence to say or implicate. So there is no circle of dependence.

Saul (2001, 2002) and M. S. Green (2002) have recently suggested that implicature should be conceived more normatively, making calculability a defensible condition for its application. Alternatively, we might view calculability as a condition for the speaker to properly implicate something, on the more common intentional conception. These seem like fruitful lines to explore.

9. Sentence Implicature and Convention

What is it for a sentence to implicate something? Why does “Some athletes smoke” implicate “Not all athletes smoke” but not “It is not the case that at least 13% of all athletes smoke?” The answer to this question seems clearly to be convention. Speakers conventionally use sentences of the form “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” but not to implicate “Less than 13% of all S are P.” All the signs of conventionality are present.[21] There is a regularity in usage and interpretation. English speakers commonly use sentences of the form “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” but they rarely if ever use them to implicate “Less than 13% of all S are P.” Speakers are commonly understood accordingly.[22] These regularities are socially useful, serving, among other things, the purpose of communication. They seem to be as self-perpetuating as other conventional practices. People use “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” and are so understood, in part because people have regularly done so in the past. And finally, the regularities are arbitrary. Plenty of other practices could have served the same purpose quite naturally, and would have perpetuated themselves in the same way if only they had gotten started. It could have been conventional for English speakers to use “Some S are P” to implicate the denial of any stronger sentence, such as “At least 13% of S are P” or others listed above in the athlete example. Implicature conventions are not as arbitrary as lexical conventions, though. In all known cases, there is some antecedent relation between what the sentence means and the implicature that makes it natural to use one to convey the other. But there are always alternative implicatures that would be natural too. Conventional regularities are seldom perfect. Thus even though it is conventional to use “bank” to mean “river bank,” speakers more often use it to mean something else. Thus the fact that people sometimes use “Some S are P” without the usual implicature is compatible with it being conventional.

Quantity implicatures are examples of conventional conversational implicatures.[23] When Grice talked about conventional implicatures, he was referring to conventional semantic implicatures, like example (2). These implicatures exist because of the conventions that give individual words their meanings. Sentence(2a) implicates (2b) because it is conventional for English speakers to use “therefore” with a certain meaning. In the case of “Some athletes smoke,” there are not only the lexical conventions that give the words “some,” “athletes,” and “smoke” their meanings, and the syntactic conventions that give sentences of the form “Some S are P” their meaning. There is also a second-order convention whereby speakers use a sentence to mean “Some S are P” and thereby to imply “Not all S are P.” Conversational implicatures are always indirect: we imply one thing by meaning another. In some cases, this indirectness is conventional. A language is defined by first-order lexical and syntactic conventions, not by second-order implicature conventions. In this respect implicature conventions are like naming conventions, word formation rules, speech act rituals (e.g., saying “This is N” when answering a telephone), and indirect speech act conventions (e.g., asking “Is it possible for me to get a ride?” to request a ride).

Quantity implicatures are distinctive in that the convention attaches a distinctive implicature to a particular sentence form. Other examples are tautology implicatures (e.g., “An N is an N” implicates “One N is as good as another”), conjunction implicatures (e.g., “p and q” implicates “p before q” or “q because p”), and disjunction implicatures (“p or q” implicates “But not both” or “I don't know which”). Quantity implicatures are also distinctive in that the same convention appears in all known languages (Horn 1989). Tautology implicatures, in contrast, display the linguistic relativity typical of semantic conventions. Thus the French translation of “An N is an N” is used without implicature, the way English speakers use “No N is a non-N,” while the Polish translation is used to implicate “There is something uniquely good about an N” (Wierzbicka 1987: 102).

Many important implicature conventions associate implicatures with sentences of any form. The most familiar examples are the figures of speech. It is conventional to use a sentence to mean the opposite (irony), or something stronger (litotes), or something similar (metaphor). There is also a convention whereby a sentence is used to implicate requested information by making a statement closely related to it by implication, which gives rise to relevance implicatures like (1). Since these conventions do not attach implicatures to particular sentence forms, they do not give rise to sentence implicatures.

It is plausible that conversational implicature conventions arose in much the same way idioms do.[24] “Kicked the bucket” started life as a metaphor, and thus an implicature. Some speakers used it as a metaphor to implicate that someone died. The metaphor caught on and became conventional. Although it has not to my knowledge been historically attested, it is plausible that the use of “Some S are P” (or its translation in some earlier language) to implicate “Not all S are P” similarly started life as a nonce implicature that caught on and spread. The difference is that with idioms, the metaphor “died,” and what previously was implied came to be meant directly, creating a non-compositional meaning for the expression. Consequently, idiomatic meanings have been “detached,” whereas conventional implicatures are “non-detachable.” The study of the origin of implicature conventions falls in the domain of historical linguistics.

An impressive and growing body of research has attempted to discern general regularities in the multitude of conversational implicature conventions associated with a language. One set of studies, conducted by Wierzbicka (1991, 2003), seeks to understand how implicature conventions reflect broader “cultural scripts.” Another seeks to describe what happens to the implicatures of a sentence when it is embedded in compound sentences (Gazdar 1979; Levinson 2000: §2.5.1). The most influential is the notion of a “Horn scale,” named after Horn (1972, 1989). Horn observed that the quantifiers all, most, many, some form a scale with the following properties. Instances of “___ S are P” with one term entail instances with any term to the right, but not to the left; the terms are thus ordered by logical strength. Moreover, the result of substituting one term implicates the denial of the result of substituting any term to the left, but not to the right. In the context “It is not the case that ___ S are P,” the logical and pragmatic relations are reversed. Other Horn scales are necessarily, actually, possibly, certainly, probably, possibly, and must, should, may. Levinson (2000: 156) looked for a generalization that would cover these cases but not scales like Between 100% and 90%, at least 10%, some which have the same logical relations as Horn scales but not the pragmatic relations. One is that the items on a Horn scale are widely and frequently used monolexemes (Levinson 2000: 156). This does not exclude all exceptions. For example, “several” is monolexemic and both frequently and widely used. It is weaker than “many” but stronger than “some.” Yet “Some S are P” does not implicate “It is not the case that several S are P.” Can Levinson's generalization be refined, or is “several” just an exception? If the generalizations are explanatory rather than merely descriptive—that is, if they tell us why we have some implicature conventions but not others – then they can presumably be refined. A priori, though, there is no more reason to expect that our implicature conventions are completely systematic than there is to expect that lexical conventions are. All languages are “irregular” to some extent. For example, the regular pattern for adjectives in English is that of tall, taller, tallest. But there are exceptions, such as good, better, best. No one expects that anything other than a historical explanation exists for these facts.

The claim that conversational principles generate sentence implicatures is problematic, as we have seen. If they did, conversational implicature conventions would not exist because the regularities would be non-arbitrary. But conversational principles do specify common interests that conversational implicature conventions serve: communication of information, politeness, style, and efficiency. Since conventional practices sustain themselves by serving socially useful purposes, the fact that speakers strive to be cooperative, polite, stylish, and efficient sustains implicature conventions. We also noted earlier that conversational principles can serve as generalizations used in the process of inferring implicatures, and we can add that flouting a principle often serves as a signal that an implicature convention is in play.


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