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Heredity and Heritability

First published Thu 15 Jul, 2004

A heritable trait is most simply an offspring's trait that resembles the parents' corresponding trait. Inheritance or heredity was a focus of systematic research before its inclusion as a key concept within evolutionary theory. An influential 18th and early 19th century theory of heredity was preformationism. This view took several forms, each maintaining that organisms were passed on from one generation to the next, miniature and yet fully formed, and development was simply the growth of the miniature organism. Subsequent accounts of heredity included the theory that organisms inherited traits that their parents had developed through response to various environmental pressures. This view was widely held during the 19th century and usually attributed to Lamarck. A different concept of heredity was crucial to Darwin's view that evolutionary change results from natural selection acting upon inherited traits under variation. Weismann's experimental refutation of the inheritance of acquired traits paved the way for the combination of Darwin and Mendel's views of the nature of heredity. The systematic study of heredity in the 20th century focused on the gene as the unit of heredity. (There is a vast amount of helpful work on the history of heredity including Fox-Keller (2002), Griesemer (1994), Morange (1998), Moss (2003), Sapp (2003), Sarkar (1998), Wade (1992), Winther (2000; 2001) and contributors to Buerton et al. (Eds.) (2000).) Two traditions now dominate the study of heredity: population genetics and molecular biology. The notion of a quantitative measure of the heritability of any given trait comes from population genetics. The idea that what is inherited is a stock of DNA, or the information contained in the DNA sequence, comes from molecular biology.

Philosophical discussions of heredity have focused on the sustainability of heritability analyses and more recently on the units of heredity. Here I introduce the concept of heritability and the problems associated with it. Next the units of heredity discussion is introduced. Here I consider alternatives to the view that DNA is the most important hereditary material. The information view of heredity is introduced and discussed and finally, several alternative or supplementary views of heredity are introduced.

1. Terminological issues

The term “heritable” applies to traits that are similar in parents and offspring. We inherit numerous attributes from our parents including their religious beliefs and, if we are lucky, their vast fortunes. The kinds of hereditary traits that biologists are interested in are those that are reliably transmitted from one generation to the next as a matter of biology. Darwin (1859/1968), working without the advantages that genetics would later bring, discussed hereditary traits at the level of phenotypes. Darwin demonstrated that natural selection sorts among hereditary variations, for example, the height of an organism, its weight, the color of its coat and so on. Most contemporary discussions of heredity constrain hereditary traits to those that can be demonstrated to be passed on genetically. The concept of “heritability” was introduced “to quantify the level of predictability of passage of a biologically interesting phenotype from parent to offspring” (Feldman, 151). Heritability is usually assessed by complex statistical analysis, careful experimentation or both.

Discussions of heredity invite confusions between mechanisms responsible for individual development and mechanisms responsible for the transmission of traits from one generation to the next. Genes are the standard units of inheritance discussed in biology. Genes are also taken to be the most important causal component in the development of an organism's traits. Methods derived from population genetics to assess heritability provide no information about the causal mechanisms contributing to the development of an individual's traits. Population geneticists study the patterns of transmission of traits in populations from one generation to the next. Molecular biologists identify coding sequences of DNA and hence the proteins that these sequence produce in the developing organism. Working together, molecular biologists and population geneticists can produce a convergent account of a particular gene, providing both its pattern of transmission and an account of its role in development. For example, medical geneticists may discover a pattern of inheritance for a disease in a family that leads them to hypothesize that there is a gene (or a number of genes) responsible for the development of the trait in individual humans. Molecular analysis may then lead to the discovery of a sequence of DNA that codes for an unusual protein that is in part responsible for the development of the symptoms of the disease.

2. Population genetics and the attempt to measure the heritability of traits

Mendelian genetics provides laws that govern the passing on of discrete traits from one generation to the next. For example, Mendel experimentally demonstrated particular patterns of inheritance for smooth and wrinkled peas in a population of pea plants. Discrete or discontinuous traits contrast with continuous or quantitative traits. Height in humans or leaf number in trees are continuous traits. Continuous traits vary on a continuum that can be represented as a normal distribution, graphed as a bell curve. Most interesting philosophical issues about heredity and heritability arise from the study of continuous traits.

The study of quantitative or continuous traits can be carried out by looking simply at phenotypes. For example, if a population of plants varies in height we can ask how much of this variation is due to genes. Assessing the proportion of the variation of a trait in a population that is due to genes is achieved by a statistical method called the analysis of variance. Once this analysis has been carried out a simple formula provides a number between 0 and 1 that is the heritability measure for the trait in question. I will use a few simple examples to illustrate the important concepts involved in producing heritability measures.

Before we consider the analysis of variance and its contribution to heritability measures, it is helpful to understand the general concept of heritability. Heritability is a measure of genetic influence. If a trait has high heritability, its varying from individual to individual in a population can be explained genetically. An imaginary example illustrates one way of assessing heritability. Say we have two students from a class and student a is 6'2" and student b is 4'2". To discover the influence of genes on height, we could clone both students and then swap the clones' environments and see what happens. In the figure below, the environments that a and b grew up in are Ea and Eb. Clones of a and b are Ca and Cb.




Cb = 4'2"

Ca = 6'2"

Height is genetic


Cb = 5'8"

Ca = 5'8"

Height results from genes and environment


Cb = 6'2"

Ca = 4'2"

Height results entirely from environment

A scenario like 2 is the most likely outcome. Of course we can't clone humans (or faithfully replicate the environments they grow up in). We can do this with plants and other kinds of experimental organisms and as a result we can get a good sense of the contribution of genes to variation in a phenotypic trait.

Heritability can be estimated in humans by comparing resemblance in the phenotypic traits of twins. Twin studies make the following assumptions: Monozygotic, (identical), twins share all their genes and their environment but dizygotic, (fraternal), twins share half their genes and their environment. For any given trait, say height, we get the following results:

Finally, we can get a sense of the heritability of a trait by finding the slope of the regression line on the plots of offspring value for a trait graphed with parental value. If the slope is 1, the trait is entirely genetic and if the slope is 0, then the trait is not genetic at all. If the variation among individuals is due to variation in their genes, then offspring ought to resemble their parents. Heritability is always a value between 1 and 0. In the graph below values for mid-parent height and mid-offspring height are plotted for a small sample population (mid-parent height is the average of the height of both parents). The slope of the regression line is .75, which indicates high heritability. (It should be stressed that this is a very informal presentation of this kind of estimation of heritability and for this approach to provide any useful results important constraints on the nature of the population and the relevant environment would have to be satisfied.)

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So far we have introduced methods of measuring or calculating heritability that are somewhat intuitive. The problem with these methods is that they do not acknowledge all that is involved in the production of variation in the quantitative traits of organisms in a population. If we stick to the example of variation in height in a sample population of humans, we will discover that in most representative samples, heights are distributed more or less normally. The variance in height is defined as the average of the squared difference between each measured height and the mean height for the population. Variance in phenotype or phenotypic variance is symbolized as VP. (From here until the end of this section I adopt a specific strategy for presenting the equations used in spelling out heritability relations. I start out (with equation 1) below) by presenting the simplest version of the relevant equations. Simple equations such as 1) below are rarely ever satisfied but are routinely presented as adequate in elementary introductions to behavioral genetics. Subsequent equations in the sequence below render the relevant situation more accurately. Population geneticists endorse variants of 1″) below and do not endorse 1).)

(1) VP = VG + VE

Equation (1) simply says that the phenotypic variance is the variance due to genes plus the variance due to the organisms' environment. Behavioral geneticists and psychologists introduce heritability in the following way: Heritability is the proportion of phenotypic variance that is attributable to genotypic variance: heritability = VG/VP

This notion of heritability is called broad sense heritability, hb2 , and is “the proportion of phenotypic differences due to all sources of genetic variance” Plomin 1990, 234). Narrow sense heritability, h2, is “the proportion of phenotypic variance due solely to additive genetic variance” (Plomin 1990, 234).

(2) hb2 = VG/VP and
(3) h2 = VA/VP

“Additive genetic variation (VA) is variation among individuals due to the additive effects of genes” (Freeman & Heron, 206). For example, variation in height of organisms could result from the contribution of several alleles at a locus where each allele contributes more height to the organism. For example, allele A could contribute .5 units to an organism's height, allele a another .5 units and so on. A contrast with additive genetic variance is dominance variance (VD). In this case, say two alleles (A and a) are responsible for the organism's height. An organism with aa is 1.0 units high, an organism with AA is 2.0 units high but an organism with Aa is also only 2.0 units high. Total genetic variance, VG, is actually the sum of all the genetic variance. In the simplified case presented here this is

(4) VG = VA + VD

The implied equation for VP from the discussion so far is:

(1′) VP = VA + VD + VE

But this equation still oversimplifies the situation and owes too much to Mendelianism. Variance in phenotype can result from gene interaction effects, or epistactic variance, VI. This occurs when alleles at one locus have an effect on the phenotype that is dependent upon alleles at one or more other loci. Further, there may be a contribution to phenotypic variance from gene/environment interaction, VG X E. This occurs when the effect of the environment on the phenotype differs between genotypes. Finally, VP can be effected by non-random correlations between genotypes and environments referred to as gene environment covariation, COV(G,E). For example, if plants with a genotype that tends to produce large plants also select nutrient rich environments and plants with a genotype that tends to produce small plants also select nutrient poor environments the variance in height would be increased. If the relation was switched the variance would decrease (Futuyma 1998). Factoring all the above in we now have the following:

(1″) VP = VA + VD + VI + VE + VG X E + COV(G,E) and
(4′) VG = VA + VD + VI

The assumption made by most evolutionary biologists is that VI, VG X E and COV(G,E) are generally small and the most important component of variance from an evolutionary standpoint is VA. As a result, evolutionary biologists are usually interested in h2 (= VA/VP). In contrast, psychologists and behavioral geneticists are more interested in hb2 (= VG/VP). Psychologists are interested in the contribution of genes to human psychological traits whereas evolutionary biologists use heritability measures to predict and measure the response of a trait to selection. Philosophical discussion over measuring heritability has arisen mostly from the use of hb2 measures in behavioral genetics and psychology. Much of this discussion takes off from a paper by Lewontin (1974) in which he argues that the analysis of variance cannot provide us with answers to questions about how much genes contribute to variance in a given trait.

3. Philosophical issues arising from heritability analysis

Discussions of the viability of heritability measures were most heated in the 1970's and 1980's. In the 1970's discussions about IQ and race came to a head (this issue was revisited in the 1990's with the publication of Herrnstein and Murray (1999)) and in the late 1970's and early 1980's sociobiology came under critical scrutiny. Both proponents of the hereditary nature of IQ and sociobiologists made a connection between human behavioral traits and genes. Hereditarians in the IQ debates explicitly relied upon heritability analyses such as those introduced above. Critics of sociobiology and hereditarianism over IQ included biologists, philosophers and many social scientists as well as many left leaning political and social activists (See Gould (1981), Paul (1998) and Segerstråle (2000) for some of the relevant history here).

The point of departure for many philosophers criticizing heritability analysis is Lewontin's (1974) paper on the analysis of variance. (It is worth noting that Lewontin's paper is somewhat informal and should perhaps be best viewed as Lewontin's attempt to pass on the received wisdom among population geneticists at the time to a wider audience. The formal arguments Lewontin alludes to are presented in a number of places including Layzer (1974) (and later Kempthorne (1978)) and precursors to these arguments can be found in Hogben (1933) and can also be found in R.A. Fishers work.) Lewontin claimed that equation 1″) above presented the most accurate picture of the contributions to phenotypic variance. He went on to argue that VI, VG X E and COV (G,E) were not negligible. In fact, he argues that these are always part and parcel of the variance in traits. As a result, apportioning the phenotypic variance between genes and environment is no easy matter and standard analyses of variance simply cannot come up with useful and informative values for hb2 and h2. Lewontin also pointed out that many proponents of heritability measures mistakenly attribute the heritability values to individuals rather than populations. Finally, he argued that norms of reaction gave a more accurate picture of the relations between genes, environment and phenotypic traits. A norm of reaction is a graph of a quantitative phenotype plotted as a function of environment for different genotypes. Many philosophers and biologists have extended and refined Lewontin's criticism of the analysis of variance (e.g., Block 1995, Kitcher 1985, Sarkar 1998, Sober 1988) and most have shared his conclusions that heritability measures are hard to come by and that norms of reaction are a superior way to examine gene environment interactions.

One response to these kinds of criticisms is to emphasize caution in the use of heritability measures and to re-emphasize Lewontin's point that such measures do not provide information about the traits of individuals (See e.g., Plomin et al. 1990; 1997, Hamer & Copeland 1998). Kitcher (1985) pointed out in response to this line of defense that words of caution do not seem to be enough and many behavioral geneticists and psychologists still talk as if they can discover the genetic components of human behavioral traits by using heritability analyses. A second line of response is to argue that norms of reaction are almost impossible to generate for complex human traits and as a result, are not a serious contender in the business of ascertaining the genetic causes of human traits. Lewontin himself introduced this problem for norms of reaction. In organisms whose genotypes and environments can be exhaustively manipulated a norm of reaction for a particular trait can be produced. Lewontin cites early work on Drosophila larvae's responses to temperature as pioneering work of this kind. The problem for most human traits, particularly human behavioral traits, is that we have no clear sense of either what the relevant genes to examine are or what the range of relevant environments is. This response need not necessarily blunt Lewontin's critical attack on heritability measures, as in cases were a norm of reaction can be reliably produced, we do have more information about the relations between genes and environment than can be provided by a standard analysis of variance. Further, attempts to experimentally partition the contribution of genetic variance to phenotypic variance run into problems for human traits similar to the problems presented by attempts to generate norms of reaction. The examples in Section 2. above are artificial for a reason: it is hard to establish the relevant genotypes and environments that lead to variance in human traits. The current consensus among philosophers of biology is that heritability analyses are misleading about the genetic causes of human traits. New work on norms of reaction (see e.g., Pigliucci 2001) reinforces Lewontin's point about the information that can be gained from such analyses.

4. Molecular biology, DNA and the inheritance of information

Evolutionary biologists attempt to account for the process of evolutionary change, including speciation and changes to organisms through time within a species. There was much progress in conceptualizing evolutionary change when it was characterized in terms of changing gene frequencies in the 1930's and 1940's. Many evolutionary biologists discuss evolution entirely from a genetic perspective. After genes were established as the relevant heritable material the next step was to conceptualize the relevant heritable material in terms of molecular structure. In 1953 the structure of DNA was discovered and with this discovery came a mechanism for accounting for the duplication of heritable material and its transmission from one generation to the next. Richard Dawkins (1976; 1981; 1985) refers to DNA molecules as replicators, they are capable of faithful self replication. Heredity can be understood on this view as the successful reproduction of replicators across generations.

Understanding more about the nature of DNA and RNA reveals a role that a concept of information can contribute to this notion of heredity. The bases in DNA and RNA can be helpfully construed as letters in an alphabet and the relation between the triplets of letters in the RNA and the resulting polypeptide chain can be construed as a coding relation. So, the DNA contains the code for the polypeptide. Rather than causing the production of the relevant protein, the DNA sequence contains the information that codes for it.

The replicator based notion of heredity can now be refined. Rather than the heritable material consisting of discrete strands of DNA passed on from one generation to the next, heredity can be characterized in terms of information. What is relevantly passed on from one generation to the next is the information in the DNA, encoded in the unique sequence of bases. The information gene concept is pervasive in the work of theoretical evolutionary biologists. Perhaps the most influential formulation of the concept of heredity in terms of information was that of the evolutionary theorist George Williams. For example, he says: “In evolutionary theory, a gene could be defined as any hereditary information for which there is a favorable or unfavorable selection bias equal to several or many times the rate of endogenous change” (Williams 1966, 25). And later: “A gene is not a DNA molecule; it is the transcribable information coded by the molecule"(Williams 1992, 11).

The idea that heredity is best understood as the passing on of information via DNA is expanded and defended by both biologists and philosophers including Dawkins (1976; 1981; 1985), Maynard Smith (1998; 2000a; 2000b) and Dennett (1995). The idea has also been subject to a large amount of critical scrutiny and alternatives to the genetic information view of heredity have been proposed and defended.

5. Alternative views of the units of heredity

We gain a sense of the dynamic of the debate over the units of heredity by considering a debate between Dawkins and one of his critics. Dawkins contrasted his replicators with vehicles, the organisms (or cells) that carry around the hereditary material. (Many philosophers of biology now refer to the replicator/vehicle distinction as the replicator/interactor distinction, a refinement of Dawkins' distinction due to Hull (1981).) With this distinction, issues of heredity relevant for evolution are deemed to be cleanly separated from issues of development that involve the unfolding of the information carried in the replicator molecules. Dawkins (1981) elaborates his position in response to a challenge by Bateson (1978). Bateson asks why a bird can't be a nest's way of making another nest, manipulating Dawkins' claim that a bird is a gene's way of making another gene. Dawkins responds that there is a “causal arrow going from gene to bird, but none in the opposite direction” (1981, 98). He goes on to defend the special status of genetic factors as factors that “replicate themselves, blemishes and all” (1981). Dawkins thinks that challenges such as Bateson's are rooted in several mistaken assumptions. First, Dawkins worries that a Lamarckian view about the inheritance of acquired traits is behind such objections and hence that Weismann's view that heritable materials are only in the germ-line is under threat. Second, Dawkins thinks that challenges such as Bateson's rest on a mistaken conflation of development and evolution. These themes are later reflected in Maynard Smith's (1998) suggestions for a combined evolutionary developmental biology that preserves a clear distinction between heritable (information bearing) material and the resources required for that information to be expressed in development.

Despite Dawkins' apparent easy rebuttal of Bateson's criticisms, many challenge the replicator view of inheritance, including proponents of developmental systems theory such as Oyama, Gray and Griffiths (Gray 1992; Griffiths & Gray 1994; Oyama 2000 and contributors to Oyama et al. 2002). Also, even philosophers who are opposed to the developmental systems approach now favor a multiple units of inheritance view (e.g., Sterelny et al. 1996). These challenges are grounded in a wide range of empirical work in many areas of biology and theoretical work on the role that the concept of information plays in understanding heredity. We first look at the kind of empirical data that supports a challenge to the replicator only view of heredity.

Here are some of the candidates for “extra-genetic” inheritance systems that Gray (1992) proposes:

Type of Inheritance

Epigenetic Factors (Jablonka and Lamb 1995)
Cytoplasmic Factors
Chemical traces from parental foraging
Gut micro-organisms
Social traditions:
  • Feeding methods
  • Migration routes and schooling sites
  • Home ranges and territories
  • Reproductive sites
  • Dominance rank
  • Song
Other features of the environment:
  • e.g., geographic range

Table 1. (Adapted from Gray 1992, 180 and amended.)

The idea that cellular materials, Gray's “cytoplasmic factors,” are inherited is straightforward to support empirically. In sexually reproducing organisms almost all of the cellular material in the zygote is inherited from the mother. This material includes all manner of organelles, enzymes and other essential materials that contribute to the subsequent division of the zygote to produce the cells of the mature organism (Many have pointed this out including Fox Keller 2000, Gray 2001, Griesemer 1994, Moss 2003 and Sterelny & Griffiths 1999). What Sterelny et al. (1996) call the “developmental matrix” can be much more inclusive than just these cellular materials. The developmental matrix includes all factors the contribute to the phenotype of the mature organism and many of these factors are inherited separately from the information contained in the germ-line DNA. The widest conception of the developmental matrix includes the organism's environment, parts of which have been shaped by previous generations of the organism (burrows and dams are obvious examples of organism structured environments) (Oddling Smee, Laland and Feldman 2003). Developmental systems theorists take these empirical findings about multiple inheritance systems to support their view that genes play no privileged role in evolution and development. Rather, “the developmental system as a whole is the only replicator” and “the full range of developmental resources is the complex system replicated in development” (Sterelny et al. 1996. See also Gray 1992 and Griffiths & Gray 1994). Critics of developmental systems theory have rejected their proposals as hopelessly holistic. Such responses are usually accompanied by the insistence that something must set genes apart as distinct and important units of inheritance. Much of this discussion has focused on the gene as carrier of information.

The informational definition of the gene is that genes contain information that is passed on from one generation to the next and that information codes for a particular protein or polypeptide. (More encompassing information gene concepts maintain that the gene codes for phenotypes more broadly construed.) As Sterelny and Griffiths put it: “The classical molecular gene concept is a stretch of DNA that codes for a single polypeptide chain” (1999, 132). Genes, on this view, contain information about the phenotype, the protein that is expressed. While most biologists believe that genes contain information about the relevant phenotype, none believe that the information in the genes is sufficient to produce the relevant phenotypes. The standard view is that genes contain the relevant or important information guiding the development of the organism.All other cellular machinery merely assists in the expression of the information. One way to put this idea is that genes introduce information to the developmental process while all other mechanisms make merely a causal contribution to development.

There are several alternative analyses of information that could be applied to genetic information and one comes from information theory. Information theory holds that “an event carries information about another event to the extent that it is causally related to it in a systematic fashion. Information is thus said to be conveyed over a “channel” connecting the “sender” [or signal] with the “receiver” when a change in the receiver is causally related to a change in the “sender” (Gray 2001, 190). On this view information is reduced to causal covariance or systematic causal dependence. Philosophers of biology refer to this characterization of genetic information as the “causal” view. Sterelny and Griffiths (1999) illustrate how the causal information concept could work in the context of molecular biology: “The idea of information as systematic causal dependence can be used to explain how genes convey developmental information. The genome is the signal and the rest of the developmental matrix provides channel conditions under which the life cycle of the organism contains (receives) information about the genome” (Sterelny & Griffiths 1999, 102).

Several have argued that the causal view suffers from serious problems. The arguments owe much to Bateson's argument against Dawkins and bear a structural resemblance to that argument. Sterelny and Griffiths (1999) point out that “it is a fundamental fact of information theory that the role of signal source and channel condition can be reversed” (102) as the signal/channel distinction is simply a matter of causal covariance. Further, the signal/channel distinction is a function of observers' interests. For example, we could choose to hold the developmental history of an organism constant and from this perspective the organism's phenotype would carry information about their genotype. But if we choose to “hold all developmental factors other than (say) nutrient quantity constant, the amount of nutrition available to the organism will covary with, and hence also carry information about its phenotype” (p. 102). The causal information concept is lacking, because it cannot distinguish the genes as the singular bearers of important or relevant information. Rather, on this view, genes are just one source of information; aspects of the organism's environment and cellular material also contain information. This position is called the “parity thesis” (Griffiths & Gray 1994). The parity thesis exposes the need for another information concept that elevates genes alone to the status of information bearers.

Alternative concepts of information have been examined in attempts to respond to this situation; one is referred to variously as intentional, semantic or teleosemantic information (the term “teleosemantic” is used in what follows). This notion of information has been defended most forcefully recently by Maynard Smith (1998; 2000a; 2000b) but versions of it are defended by philosophers including Dennett (1995) and Sterelny (1996; 2000). The term “teleosemantics” is borrowed from the philosophical program of reducing meaning to biological function (teleology) and then reducing biological function to natural selection (cf. Sterelny & Griffiths 1999).

Applying this view to the current problem results in the following: “a gene contains information about the developmental outcomes that it was selected to produce” (Sterelny & Griffiths 1999, 105). Maynard Smith puts the view as follows: "DNA contains information that has been programmed by natural selection" (Maynard Smith 2000a, 190). The gene contains information not just as a result of relevantly causally co-varying with the phenotype, but as a result of having the function of producing the relevant phenotype. Defenders of this view, claim that this allows for the information to stay the same even if the channel conditions change; if the channel conditions change, the information in the gene has simply been misinterpreted. This concept could solve the problem of rendering the genes the sole information bearers, as “if other developmental causes do not contain [teleosemantic] information and genes do, then genes do indeed play a unique role in development” (Sterelny and Griffiths 1999, 104).

Although the teleosemantic view shows promise, the debate has not ended here. The teleosemantic view opens up a possibility: if a developmental cause, part of the cellular machinery for example, is found to be heritable and performs the function of producing a particular developmental outcome, then by definition, it also contains teleosemantic information. Many, including Fox Keller (2000), Gray (1992), Griesemer (1994), Griffiths and Gray (1994), Jablonka (2002), Jablonka and Lamb (1995), Moss (2003) and Sarkar (1996; 2000) have argued that indeed there are such mechanisms. These authors draw various conclusions from the demonstrated presence of mechanisms that are not genes, are heritable and perform the function of producing a specific developmental outcome. Developmental systems theorists such as Griffiths and Gray take these findings to show that teleosemantic information succumbs to the parity thesis also. They go on to argue that no concept of information will distinguish genes as a special contributor to development. Genes are just fellow travelers alongside cellular machinery and the environment in shaping developmental outcomes. Others such as Fox Keller (2000), Jablonka (2002) and Sarkar (1996; 2000) are more cautious and hold out for a concept of information that renders genes a distinct kind of information bearer. For example, Jablonka (2002) presents alternative systems of inheritance, such as those presented in the table above, entirely in informational terms. She starts from the position that inheritance is information transfer but then argues that there are distinct forms of information passed on in the different inheritance systems. Genetic information is distinct from epigenetic information and both are distinct from the information passed on by social learning.

6. Prospects and recommendations for further reading

There is something of a consensus in most fields (e.g., philosophy of biology, evolutionary biology, psychology and behavioral genetics) that heritability measures (particularly hb2 measures) only have a very limited use. The consensus among philosophers of biology is that broad heritability measures are uninformative but there are a few dissenting voices (e.g Sesardic 1993). Kaplan (2000) provides an introduction to heritability and its use in behavioral genetics. Sarkar (1998) presents a sophisticated (and technically quite difficult) treatment of arguments against heritability. Freeman and Heron (1998) present a clear analysis of the problems with the use of heritability measures by proponents of the connection between IQ and race (understanding this analysis requires some knowledge of statistics). Block (1995) presents an overview of arguments against the use of heritability measures in the IQ and race literature. This overview is helpful and specifically designed for a non-technical audience. Sober (1988) presents a defense of Lewontin's (1974) landmark criticism of the use of the analysis of variance in assessing heritability. (Sober's paper is difficult and a worthy project would be to revisit the paper with a view to assessing the consistency of Sober's conclusions with Lewontin's.)

Sterelny and Griffiths (1999) contains a useful introduction to many of the issues about units of inheritance and the concept of genetic information. The units of heredity debate is currently in full swing. A recent issue of Philosophy of Science (67, No. 2, 2000) includes Maynard Smith's defense of his view of genetic information with responses by Sterelny, Godfrey-Smith and Sarkar. Most recently, Sarkar presents a defense of a modest informational gene concept and Godfrey-Smith counters with a more skeptical line about genetic information in an exchange in Hitchcock (2004). Oyama, Griffiths and Gray (2001) contains several essays attacking both Dawkin's replicator view and defending various alternative theories of inheritance. Niche construction is clearly laid out and defended at length in Odling-Smee, Laland and Feldman (2003). Initial reviews indicate that West-Eberhard (2003) may reignite debates over the plausibility Lamarckian inheritance. Debates about the units of inheritance shape discussion in the emerging field of evolutionary developmental biology and this emerging field presents many opportunities for philosophers to contribute to an ongoing discussion in biology (see e.g., contributors to Biology and Philosophy 18, No. 2).


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