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Nonconceptual Mental Content

First published Tue 21 Jan, 2003

The central idea behind the theory of nonconceptual mental content is that some mental states can represent the world even though the bearer of those mental states does not possess the concepts required to specify their content. This basic idea has been developed in different ways and applied to different categories of mental state. Not all of these developments and applications are consistent with each other, but each offers a challenge to the widely held view that the way in which a creature can represent the world is determined by its conceptual capacities.

1. Nonconceptual content: An initial characterisation

The notion of nonconceptual is fundamentally contrastive. In elucidating it we need to start with the notion of conceptual content. The paradigm case of a state with conceptual content is a propositional attitude. Having a propositional attitude involves standing in a certain relation to a content (a thought or a proposition). The content is what it is that is believed, desired, hoped for etc. Although propositional attitudes are ultimately directed at certain objects, properties and/or relations (which yield their truth-condition, and in terms of which their truth-value is to be determined), it is clear that only certain ways of characterising those objects/properties/relations can serve to specify the content of the relevant propositional attitude. It would be incorrect, for example, to characterize the content of my current belief that my car is parked in the driveway by using the concepts of particle physics to describe the state of affairs that would make it true. This would be incorrect because it completely fails to capture the way in which I think about the state of affairs of my car being in the driveway. The obvious question to ask, once this preliminary point is in play, is ‘What constraints are imposed upon specifications of the content of propositional attitudes by the requirement to respect the way in which the subject thinks about the truth-condition of the relevant attitude?"

Different theories of content will respond to this question in different ways, but the following is widely held to impose a minimal constraint upon any such response.

The conceptual constraint:
Specifications of the content of a sentence or propositional attitude state must not employ concepts that are not possessed by the utterer or thinker.

Certain theories of content and concepts directly entail the conceptual constraint. Within a broadly Fregean tradition, for example, the contents of propositional attitudes (and the meanings of sentences) are taken to consist of concepts -- and it is hard to see how one can stand in a relation to a complex of concepts without possessing each of them.

But the conceptual constraint does not depend upon adopting any particular theory of content. Its plausibility stems, rather, from the conjunction of two thoughts.

  1. In specifying what a thinker believes, what a perceiver perceives or what a speaker is saying by uttering a certain sentence in a particular context one has to be as faithful as possible to the way in which that thinker, perceiver or speaker apprehends the world.
  2. The way in which a speaker, perceiver or thinker apprehends the world in speaking about it or having beliefs about it is a function of the concepts he possesses.

This way of motivating the conceptual constraint has been explicitly put forward by several authors (see, for example, McDowell 1994 and Noë 1999), both of whom argue forcibly for the second thesis. Theorists of nonconceptual content, in contrast, accept the first constraint without the second. They hold that specifications of content must respect the way in which a thinker, speaker or perceiver apprehends the world and because or this they cannot be circumscribed by the concepts possessed by the thinker, speaker or perceiver. Theorists of nonconceptual content postulate the existence of ways of representing the world (a type of content) that is not a reflection of the concepts possessed by the thinker.

The conceptual constraint can be lifted in two different ways. It can be lifted globally by simply denying that any content specifications need confine themselves to the concepts possessed by the utterer/thinker. The currently popular identification of propositions with functions from possible worlds to truth values involves a global lifting of the conceptual constraint. Possible world semantics is intended to apply to all propositional attitudes and it is obvious that few believers who are not also professional philosophers will have any grip at all on the central theoretical concepts of possible worlds semantics. All content comes out as nonconceptual content in this sense,[1] thus rendering the notion of nonconceptual content theoretically uninteresting. In terms of the two motivations identified earlier for the conceptual constraint, this approach to specifying content repudiates the first. It holds that specifications of content need not be sensitive to the way in which the speaker or thinker apprehends the world.

It is more interesting to think about what might happen if we retain the first motivation, but question the second, looking for ways in which speaker/thinkers represent the world that are not a function of the concepts they possess. There are three different representational domains for which such a local lifting of the conceptual constraint has been proposed:

  1. Perceptual states (see further 3.1 below)
  2. Representational states at the subpersonal or subdoxastic level (see further 3.2 below)
  3. The representational states of non-human animals and human infants who do not seem to be concept possessors (see further 3.3 below)

Of course, the plausibility of a local lifting of the conceptual constraint will be a function of how concepts are understood. In the following I make three assumptions about concepts. These assumptions do not fix a single notion of concept, but they do however determine the logical space within which accounts can be developed of the correlative notions of conceptual and nonconceptual content.

The first assumption is that concepts are semantic entities rather than psychological entities. Concepts are constituents of contents. Attitudes towards contents are psychological occurrences, but the contents themselves are not psychological entities. They, and the concepts they contain, are abstract entities. The second assumption is that, although concepts are abstract entities, mastering a concept is a psychological achievement. We need a cognitive account of what it is to master a concept, even though concepts are not psychological entities. The third assumption is that a given content will be either conceptual or nonconceptual, but not both. There is no way in which one and the same content can serve as the content both of a (nonconceptual) perceptual state and a (conceptual) belief state.

There is an alternative conception of nonconceptual content, discussed by Heck (2000), that may deny some of these assumptions. Heck distinguishes between two different ways in which, for example, a given perceptual state can be nonconceptual. Perception can be nonconceptual at the level of individual states or at the level of the contents of those states. On this alternative way of thinking about nonconceptual content it is possible consistently to deny the third assumption. The "state" view allows that the same content can be the content of a nonconceptual state (such as a perception) and the content of a conceptual state (such as a belief). This view can also be naturally be conjoined with a denial of the first assumption: it may take concepts to be psychological rather than semantic entities, and may then characterize a conceptual state as one that involves concepts (in this psychological sense), while a nonconceptual state is one that does not.

Although it has been suggested (Byrne forthcoming) that the "state" view of nonconceptual content should be taken as primary, I will principally be discussing the "content" view in this article.

2. Nonconceptual content: Recent history

Although some of the themes in current discussions of nonconceptual content have surfaced at various times in philosophical thinking (particularly in the philosophy of perception), the notion of nonconceptual content was explicitly introduced into analytical philosophy with the work of Gareth Evans (Evans 1982). As part of his general discussion of the role of information-links in making possible demonstrative and other types of identification, Evans develops the idea that the information yielded by the perceptual systems (including somatic proprioception) is nonconceptual. This nonconceptual information, he argues, is initially unconscious but becomes conscious when it serves as input to a thinking, concept-applying, and reasoning system.[2].

Evans is not always clear whether he understands nonconceptual content to be a personal level or a subpersonal level phenomenon. And, in fact, it seems that Evans's conception of nonconceptual content is in at least one important way deeply antithetical to that currently discussed. Whereas much contemporary discussion of nonconceptual content is focused on the content of conscious perceptual states, it looks very much as if Evans understands perceptual states with nonconceptual content as being non-conscious until the subject's conceptual abilities are brought to bear on them. Nonetheless, the general idea that there might be ways of representing the world independent of the thinker's conceptual capacities has inspired other philosophers. An early, personal level application of the notion comes in Tim Crane's paper on the waterfall illusion (Crane 1988a). Crane argues that the waterfall illusion presents an experience with a contradictory content that hence cannot have a conceptual content -- since conceptual contents must be consistent. This claim has provoked some debate (Mellor 1988, Crane 1988b).

The main development of the notion of nonconceptual content comes from philosophers connected with the University of Oxford and working within a broadly Fregean tradition. Christopher Peacocke, in a series of papers and then in his book on concepts (Peacocke 1992), argues that the fineness of grain of perceptual experience outstrips the conceptual capacities of the perceiver. He offers a detailed theoretical framework for understanding the nonconceptual content of perceptual experience, which he termed scenario content. A rather different account of the nature of perceptual experience in nonconceptual terms has been provided by Adrian Cussins (Cussins 1990), who suggests that we should understand the nonconceptual content of experience in essentially ability-based terms. Cussins argues that this personal level notion of nonconceptual content is naturally complemented at the subpersonal level by a connectionist cognitive architecture. Michael Martin applies the notion of nonconceptual content to the study of memory (Martin 1992).

One thesis that might be held about nonconceptual content is that a thinker can represent the world nonconceptually without possessing any concepts at all. This is termed the Autonomy Thesis by Peacocke, who offers an argument against it in his (1992). This argument has been challenged by José Luis Bermúdez (Bermúdez 1994) in favour of a notion of autonomous nonconceptual content that can be used to explain the behavior of nonlinguistic creatures. Peacocke was initially unconvinced by this line of argument (Peacocke 1994), but subsequently changed his mind (Peacocke 2002). Bermúdez further deployed the notion of autonomous nonconceptual content in exploring primitive nonlinguistic forms of self-consciousness (Bermúdez 1998).

Recent applications of the notion of nonconceptual content have focused on the relation between perception and action (Hurley 1998) and the analysis of conscious experience (Tye 1995, Tye 2000)

3. Applying the notion of nonconceptual content

Theorists of nonconceptual content have primarily deployed the notion in three different explanatory projects: (a) the project of characterising the content of perceptual experience, (b) the project of characterising the content of subpersonal representational states, and (c) the project of explaining the behaviour of certain non-human animals and of pre-conceptual human infants.

3.1 Perceptual experience and nonconceptual content

We can think about the content of perception in conceptual terms. When someone has a visual experience, for example, it will seem to that person as if something is seen. The proposition that specifies what seems to be seen gives the propositional content of the experience. Theorists of nonconceptual content have canvassed three types of reason for thinking that this propositional content does not exhaust the content of perception.

First, the content of perception seems to be analogue in nature, unlike the conceptual content of propositional attitudes which is more plausibly seen as digital. The distinction between analogue and digital representations has (for our purposes) been most perspicuously put by Fred Dretske (Dretske 1981, Ch.6). Let us take a particular fact or state of affairs, say the fact or state of affairs that some object s has property F. A representation carries the information that s is F in digital form if and only if it carries no further information about s other than that it is F (and whatever further facts about it are entailed by the fact that it is F). But whenever a representation carries the information that s is F in analogue form it always carries additional information about s. It is clear that perceptual states represent the world in analogue form and propositional attitudes in digital form.

Second, the content of perception seems to be unit-free (Peacocke 1986). If I perceptually represent an object as being a certain distance from me I do not usually represent that distance in terms of a particular unit (in inches, say, as opposed to centimetres), even though what I represent is a perfectly determinate distance. I simply represent it as being that distance, where the content of my perception specifies the distance. It is difficult to see, however, how such unit-free representations can be accommodated in propositional terms.

Thirdly, the content of perception is more fine-grained than the content of propositional attitudes. I can see far more colours than I name and discriminate far more shapes than I have concepts for. My belief that the grass is green has a single content -- but would be the appropriate response to an enormous variety of perceptual states. There seems no sense in which my experience of shapes, colours, sounds (and other secondary qualities) is constrained by my conceptual repertoire.

Opponents of the idea that perceptual content might be nonconceptual have argued that the fineness of grain of perceptual experience can in fact be accommodated at the conceptual level. John McDowell, for example, has suggested that the conceptual content of perceptual experiences is given by demonstrative concepts, such as that shade (McDowell 1994). The information loss in the transition from perception to perceptual belief is not a sign that there are two different types of content in play, but should rather be understood as a transition from a more determinate type of conceptual content to a less determinate type of conceptual content. McDowell's arguments have been countered by Peacocke (Peacocke 1998, Peacocke 2001) and taken up by Brewer (Brewer 1999).

A crucial aspect of this debate is whether theorists of nonconceptual content can account for the rational role of perceptual states in belief formation. Although much of the discussion of whether perceptual content can be nonconceptual has focused on precisely how the manifest differences between perceptions and beliefs should be described (see, e.g. Kelly 2001 and Sedivy 1996), the important issue is whether those differences can be captured at the level of content in a way that explains how perceptions can justify beliefs. McDowell's central claim is that there can be rational relations between perceptions and beliefs only if perceptions have conceptual contents, on the grounds that rational relations can hold only between conceptual states. This is a powerful challenge to defenders of nonconceptual content. It is far from clear, however, that they do not have the resources to meet it. This is an issue that has been much discussed in the philosophy of perception. Millar (1991), for example, offers a sophisticated account of how the representational content of perceptions can justify beliefs formed on the basis of those perceptions, even though the relevant contents are not conceptually individuated. One obvious strategy for a defender of nonconceptual content to adopt would be to argue that a nonconceptual content can stand in logical or evidential relations (such as the relation of being consistent with, or making more probable) to another state even though it is not conceptually articulated (see Heck 2000).

3.2 Subpersonal computational states and nonconceptual content

The dominant paradigm within cognitive science involves postulating representational states at the subpersonal or subdoxastic levels (for philosophical discussion see Stich 1978, Davies 1989). Examples are the representational states implicated in tacit knowledge of the rules of syntax. It is a fundamental tenet of a broadly Chomskyan approach to syntax that speakers are credited with tacit knowledge of a grammar for their language and that this tacit knowledge is deployed in understanding spoken language. Yet when linguists give theoretical specifications of the syntactic rules contained within the grammar they frequently employ concepts that are not in the conceptual repertoire of the language-user. That is, the language-user is ascribed knowledge of rules formulated in terms of concepts that he does not possess. A similar point holds for the representational states postulated in computational theories of vision like that put forward by Marr (Marr 1980). The contents of such states are formulated in terms of concepts (such as the concept of a zero-crossing) that are clearly not possessed by the average perceiver.

Why should it be thought that the language-user does not possess the relevant concepts? How could he grasp the rule if he did not possess the concepts required to spell it out? The point is not just that language-users are not aware of the beliefs in question. Not all unconscious beliefs are nonconceptual. The point, rather, is that their representations of the linguistic rules are completely inferentially insulated from the rest of their beliefs and propositional attitudes, in a way that is fundamentally incompatible with the holistic nature of conceptual contents.

It is open to a critic of nonconceptual content to deny that ascriptions of content at the subpersonal level should be taken literally. John McDowell has taken this view (McDowell 1995), suggesting that subpersonal content is merely "as if" content[3]. However, this line of argument flies in the face not just of the practice of cognitive scientists, but also of some important philosophical analyses of the notion of subpersonal representation (Burge 1986, Egan 1992).

3.3 Psychological explanation

In explaining the behavior of nonlinguistic and prelinguistic creatures cognitive ethologists and developmental psychologists often appeal to representational states. This provides a motivation for the notion of nonconceptual content if one has an account of what it is to possess a concept on which it seems inappropriate to attribute mastery of the corresponding concepts to the creatures whose behaviour is being explained.

One such understanding stresses the relation between possessing concepts and being able to justify certain canonical judgements involving that concept (Peacocke 1992), going on to argue that providing justifications is a paradigmatically linguistic activity -- a matter of identifying and articulating the reasons for a given classification, inference or judgement (McDowell 1994). There is a variety of possible responses to this argument. It might be objected, for example, that possessing a given concept simply requires being able to make justified judgements involving that concept rather than being able to justify judgements involving that concept. Or it might be objected that the ability to justify concepts is not necessarily linguistic, since it is possible to identify the justification for a judgement without engaging in communication.

However, the argument from the need to provide psychological explanations of the behaviour of nonhuman animals and human infants to the existence of nonconceptual content does not stand or fall with the thesis that concepts are necessarily linguistic. It seems plausible that there is a distinction between two different types of thinking (Bermúdez 2003). Most students of the type of cognition engaged in by animals and infants view it as being domain-specific and modular in important respects, best understood in terms of bodies of "knowledge" closely focused on particular aspects of the natural and social worlds. These domain-specific modules have evolved separately and for specific purposes and are not integrated with each other (Hirschfeld and Gelman 1994). In contrast, many philosophers have suggested the type of conceptual thought engaged in by language-users is essentially domain-general, systematic and productive. Concept-possessors can generate an indefinite number of new thoughts from the concepts they possess and their thoughts obey what has been termed the generality constraint (that is, any thought-constituent can at least in principle be combined with any other).

If these characteristics are taken to be essential properties of conceptual thought (as it is plausible to do) then it seems to follow that many (if not all) non-linguistic creatures are not capable of engaging in conceptual thought. So, if they are correctly described as representing the world at all, their representations must be nonconceptual.

Of course, the plausibility of this way of motivating the notion of nonconceptual content is a hostage to fortune in two important senses, one empirical and one philosophical. The argument rests upon an empirical claim about the appropriate way to explain the behavior of non-linguistic and pre-linguistic creatures -- and in particular upon the assumption that it will not turn out to be possible to explain such behavior in non-psychological terms. But the argument also depends upon the thesis that the domain of behavior explicable in psychological terms extends further than the domain of concept possession -- and this in turn depends upon a substantive philosophical account of what it is to possess a concept. If, for example, possessing the concept of an F simply requires being able to discriminate Fs from the rest of the perceptual environment and/or to act on them in a suitable manner, then it is hard to see how any evidence that animals and young infants represent the world will not also be evidence that they represent the world conceptually.

4. Specifying nonconceptual content

We have so far been talking about nonconceptual content in very general terms. If the notion of nonconceptual content is to be useful, however, we need to have a substantive account of what nonconceptual content consists in and how it is to be ascribed -- an account that will be the equivalent at the nonconceptual level of, for example, the Fregean account of concepts and concept possession. Of course, a substantive account of nonconceptual content will be tailored to a specific explanatory task -- and each of the three motivations discussed in the previous section for introducing the notion lends itself to a different such account.

The most developed proposal has come from Christopher Peacocke who has proposed a radically externalist conception of nonconceptual content aimed explicitly at explaining the nonconceptual content of perceptual states (Peacocke 1992). Peacocke suggests that a given perceptual content should be specified in terms of the ways of filling out the space around the perceiver that are consistent with the content's being correct. For each minimally discriminable point within the perceiver's perceptual field (where these are identified relative to an origin and axes centred in the perceiver's body) we need to start by specifying whether it is occupied by a surface and, if so, what the orientation, solidity, hue, brightness and saturation of that surface are. This specification gives us the way in which the perceiver represents the environment. The content of that representation is given by all the ways of filling out the space around the perceiver in which the minimally discriminable points have the appropriate values. The representation is correct just if the space around the perceiver is occupied in one of those ways.

This proposal provides an attractive way of capturing the distinctive features of the phenomenology of perception highlighted in the previous section (see 3.1 above). Scenario content will be analogue, unit-free and possess the appropriate fineness of grain. What is not so clear, however, is how it can be applied beyond the domain of perception. It may well be that certain subpersonal states have scenario contents -- those associated with the subpersonal underpinnings of vision are obvious candidates. But the representational states implicated in tacit knowledge of syntactic theory do not fit the scenario model.

Some theorists concerned with nonconceptual content at the subpersonal level have favored a broadly teleological account of what this content consists in, drawing upon the teleological theory of content developed in Millikan 1984). This approach can be extended to cover content-bearing states such as those implicated in linguistic understanding.

The key notion here is the proper function of, for example, the mechanisms underlying a particular stage in visual information processing (construed normatively in terms of what those mechanisms should do, and usually underwritten by evolutionary considerations). Proper functions are relational, where this means that they are defined in relation to features of the environment. According to teleogical theories, content can be specified in terms of relational proper function. So, for example, the content of a state in early visual processing might be specified in terms of the edges in the perceived environment that that stage has evolved to identify.

This permits correctness conditions to be defined in terms of relational proper function. Given the particular features that a processing mechanism has been ‘designed’ or ‘selected’ to detect, it is functioning correctly when it responds appropriately to the presence of those features, and incorrectly when it responds in their absence (for example, to a sudden contrast in light intensity not due to the presence of an edge). Correctness conditions are fixed with reference to evolutionary design and past performance.

Turning to the third motivation for the notion of nonconceptual content, one might expect the notion of nonconceptual content involved in psychological explanation to be essentially perceptual. Some authors have argued, for example, that the representational states of non-linguistic creatures are essentially perceptual and tied to the creature's possibilities for action and reaction in the immediate environment (see, for example, Dummett 1993 and Campbell 1994, although neither of these two authors puts the point in terms of nonconceptual content). This thought might be developed in conjunction with an ability-based understanding of nonconceptual content along the lines proposed by Adrian Cussins (Cussins 1990). The central feature of Cussins's account of experiential content is that it should be understood not in terms of notions such as truth and truth-condition, but rather in terms of the organism's abilities to act upon the perceived environment. What the organism perceives (the content of its perception) is a distal environment structured in terms of the possibilities it affords for action. This conception of an ability-based conception of content yields a sharp distinction between the success-governed level of proto-thoughts and the truth-governed level of full-fledged thought. Proto-thought does not involve experience of an objective world.

Other authors concerned with explaining the behavior of non-linguistic and pre-linguistic creatures have proposed applying a richer notion of nonconceptual content that is not essentially pragmatic and that can be deployed in a style of explanation analogous to propositional attitude explanation. Nonconceptual contents in this richer sense are properly assessable for truth or falsity (rather than simply pragmatic success or failure) and can serve as the objects of beliefs and desires (or proto-beliefs and proto-desires). Bermúdez 1998 offered an account along these lines developing certain aspects of Peacocke's scenario content. In more recent work he has developed a more operational approach to the ascription of thoughts to non-linguistic and prelinguistic creatures (Bermúdez 2003).

5. The autonomy of nonconceptual content

One question that arises when thinking about nonconceptual content is whether a thinker can be in states with nonconceptual content despite not possessing any concepts at all. That is, can nonconceptual content be completely autonomous from conceptual content? Many theorists who wish to employ the notion of nonconceptual content to explain the behaviour of nonlinguistic and prelinguistic creatures are committed to giving an affirmative answer to this question (depending, of course, on how demanding their notion of a concept is). So too are those theorists who hold both that subpersonal computational states possess nonconceptual concepts and that the relevant modules can exist in creatures who are not capable of conceptual thought.

Christopher Peacocke (1992) has offered an argument against the autonomy thesis. His argument is based on a neo-Kantian understanding of the relation between experience of an objective world and self-consciousness. In essence he suggests that no creature can be in content-bearing states unless it grasps that the distal environment has a minimal degree of objectivity and is able successfully to reidentify particular locations within it. The requirement of concept possession comes in because this minimal grasp of objectivity requires being able to represent both the spatial configuration of the environment and one's own position within that environment -- and, he suggests, this would be impossible for a creature that lacked a concept of the first-person.

This argument is powerful, but can be challenged. Supporters of the autonomy thesis have suggested that the interrelated capacities to represent the spatial configuration of the environment and to represent one's own location within the environment can be understood at the nonconceptual level, perhaps appealing to the notion of a nonconceptual point of view to explain the interdependence of spatial awareness of the distal environment and awareness of one's own location within that environment at the nonconceptual level (Bermúdez 1998). Peacocke himself has recently accepted that arguments from animal cognition do indeed force the acceptance of the Autonomy Thesis (Peacocke 2002).

6. Nonconceptual content: Problems and prospects

It should be clear from the preceding sections that the basic idea of nonconceptual content provides an exciting tool for tackling a range of problems in the philosophy of mind and cognition. Allowing that a creature's representational capacities can outstrip its conceptual capacities makes it possible for philosophers and cognitive scientists to study aspects of cognition and behavior that remain outside the scope of more traditional approaches -- from subpersonal computational mechanisms to the psychological states of non-human animals and human infants to the nature of perceptual experience.

It should be recognized, however, that there may well not be a unitary notion of nonconceptual content applicable to these various domains. We need to distinguish between the formal notion of nonconceptual content (the idea of a way of representing the world that is not constrained by conceptual capacities) and the different concrete proposals for developing this basic idea (such as Peacocke's notion of scenario content). There is potential for serious confusion if it is assumed that a specific theory of nonconceptual content proposed for one area can be unproblematically applied to another area. It may well turn out, for example, that a fundamentally different notion of nonconceptual content is required for subpersonal computational states and perceptual experiences.

Finally, it should be reiterated that the notion of nonconceptual content is essentially contrastive -- and the significance of the notion depends upon the particular way of understanding concepts with which it is contrasted. Some psychological states that would count as nonconceptual for a theorist with a rich and demanding notion of what it is to possess a concept would be conceptual for a theorist with a more relaxed view of concepts. Before we can plausibly claim to have a full understanding of the possibilities of the notion of nonconceptual content, we need to have a much clearer view than we currently have of what it is to possess a concept. As we saw earlier, on the most mimimal view of concepts, a thinker can be credited with a concept of Fs provided that he can discriminate things that are F from things that are not F. A richer view of concepts might demand that the thinker have a full appreciation of the grounds on which one might judge something to be an F. The most demanding view of concepts might require the thinker to be able to justify and defend the judgement that something is an F. Clearly, different locations on this broad spectrum will generate different ways of thinking about what is to count as nonconceptual content -- as well as different assessments of the overall significance of the notion.


Many of the papers listed below are reprinted in the anthology Essays on Nonconceptual Content, edited by York Gunther (MIT Press, 2003). [Table of Contents available online].

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