Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer

Strong Counterexamples

Here is the argument for Brouwer's strong counterexample to one form of PEM that he mentions in his paper from 1928, ‘Betrachtungen über den Formalismus’ (‘Reflections on Formalism’). We will show that

¬∀xthe ReEals(P(x) or ¬P(x))
where P(x) = ‘x is rational’ and the Reals is the intuitionistic continuum. Accordingly, in this context real numbers are to be understood intuitionistically (namely, as convergent choice sequences).

We first show that the continuum cannot be split, that is, there are no non-empty spreads A and B such that AB = the Reals and AB = Ø. For assume there are; then the function f : the Realsthe Reals defined by

f(x) = {
0 if xA
1 if xB

is total and therefore, by Brouwer's continuity theorem (generalized from [0,1] to the Reals), continuous. But then f must be constant, so either A or B is equal to the Reals, and the other spread must be empty. This however contradicts the assumption that both A and B are non-empty.

From the fact that the continuum can't be split it follows that ∀xthe Reals(P(x) or ¬P(x)) is false. For if it were true, we could obtain a splitting of the continuum by letting f assign 0 to the rational real numbers (A), and 1 to the irrational ones (B); but this is impossible, as just shown. Hence, ¬∀xthe Reals(P(x) or ¬P(x)).

Brouwer established that the Reals can't be split in 1927, in footnote 10 of ‘Definitionsbereiche von Funktionen’ (‘On the Domains of Definition of Functions’).

Other strong counterexamples that Brouwer devised are

  1. ¬∀xthe Reals(¬¬x < 0 → x < 0) (Brouwer, 1949a)
  2. ¬∀xthe Reals(x ≠ 0 → x < 0 or x > 0) (Brouwer, 1949b)

These are based on the fan theorem and on the mathematical theory of the ‘creating subject’ (Heyting, 1956, chs. III and VIII; van Atten, 2003, chs.4 and 5).