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Mary Astell

First published Fri 1 Jul, 2005

Mary Astell (1666–1731) was an English philosopher. She was born in Newcastle, and lived her adult life in London. Her patrons were Lady Ann Coventry, Lady Elizabeth Hastings, and Catherine Jones, and among those in her intellectual circle were Lady Mary Chudleigh, Judith Drake, Elizabeth Elstob, Lady Mary Wortley Montagu, and John Norris. In addition to a number of pamphlets, she wrote the following books:

Today she is best known for her theories on the education of women, and her critiques of Norris and John Locke.

1. Metaphysics

Mary Astell designed her metaphysics around an account of God and his creation. She was a dualist, maintaining that the two kinds of beings—minds and bodies—come in various degrees of finitude and corruptibility: God is the infinite and incorruptible mind; human minds and corporeal particles are finite, naturally incorruptible beings; and human bodies and physical objects are finite, naturally corruptible beings.

1.1 God

According to Astell, God is the “First Intelligence,” the being whose nature is to be infinite in all perfections. Among his perfections, Astell often lists wisdom, goodness, justice, holiness, intelligence, presence, power, and self-existence. In keeping with rationalist views of the period, Astell maintains that the correct understanding of metaphysics turns on the correct understanding of God. For this reason, much of her work is dedicated to demonstrating not only what God is, but also how a correct understanding of him can be attained.

Her earliest such account is in A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, where she demonstrates the existence, perfection, and necessary creative power of God. She begins by giving an example of the correct method for attaining knowledge, one similar to those developed by Descartes in Discourse on the Method and Arnauld and Nicole in Logic or the Art of Thinking. Her proof of God's existence includes an account of simple and composed ideas; clear and distinct perceptions, and obscure and confused perceptions; adequate and inadequate ideas; proofs by intuition and proofs by comparison of ideas; God's perfections and our ideas of God's perfections; and the relation between ideas and terms (Astell 2002, 176–182). In Christian Religion, she frames other arguments for God's existence in terms of what we can and cannot doubt; God's perfections and our ideas of God's perfections; causality; and the beauty of the created universe (Astell 1705, 7–10 [section 7–10]).

At times, Astell privileges some of God's perfections over others. In Christian Religion, when stating her ontological argument for God's existence, she notes that “I find that the notion I have of GOD, contains those and all other perfections. Among which Self-existence is most remarkable, as being the original and basis of all the rest” (Astell 1705, 8 [section 7]). This claim is about the order of ideas: her idea of God's self-existence allows her to understand his other perfections. A few lines later, she makes the analogous claim about the order of reality: “And Self-existence is such a Perfection as necessarily includes all other perfections” (Astell 1705, 8 [section 8]).

Broad (2002b, 103) reveals evidence that Astell privileges God's wisdom and goodness over his omnipotence. There are two ways that philosophers of the period thought about God's attributes of wisdom, power, and goodness. Some held “intellectualist” theories, according to which God exercises his will in accordance with the true nature of things; others held  “voluntarist” theories, according to which God exercises his will to create both things and the truth of things. In showing that Astell maintains an intellectualist theology, Broad refers to a number of passages, one of which is the following:

This is then the sum of the matter; GOD who is Infinite in all Perfections, in Justice and Holiness, as well as in Goodness and Mercy, always does what is best and most becoming His Perfections, and cannot act but according to the Essential Nature and Reason of things; nor is it possible that our Wishes or Actions shou'd make any alteration in the immutable Rectitude of His Conduct. (Astell 1705, 95 [section 105]; see also Astell 2002, 205; Astell 1705, 416 [section 407])

1.2 Individuation among Beings

Throughout her texts, Astell is concerned with giving an account of how created beings are individuated from each other. Ultimately, she maintains that there are four kinds of created beings: minds, bodies, mind–body unions, and the particles that compose bodies.

About finite minds considered on their own, Astell differs quite radically from Descartes. In Discourse on the Method, Descartes remarks that all minds have the same ability to reason (AT 2; CSM 111). According to Astell, on the other hand, God creates minds with intrinsic differences. She gives a number of reasons for this view. One has to do with the relationships that God wants minds to have with each other: humans form community only if their minds have different intellectual capacities. Another concerns the relationship between created minds and God: minds were made to contemplate and enjoy God, and God needs their adoration and love. But each mind is limited and, thus, can only love God by adoring a limited amount of his works. So God creates many minds, each with an ability to understand a certain collection of truths, and in this way all of his creation is attended to (Astell 2002, 144–146, 154–155).

Though Astell discusses minds as if they are sometimes isolated from bodies, she maintains that human beings are mind–body unions. She notes that we cannot comprehend the connection between the mind and body: “We know and feel the Union between our Soul and Body, but who amongst us sees so clearly, as to find out with Certitude and Exactness, the secret ties which unite two such different Substances, or how they are able to act upon each other?” (Astell 2002, 148) The union between the mind and body is mysterious; though we “know and feel” it, we don't have perfect knowledge of it or of how the mind and body interact causally. In Christian Religion, Astell presents this same position by way of a parallel between, on the one hand, our lack of knowledge of the mind–body union, and, on the other hand, our lack of knowledge about the relation between God and humans: “Again, tho' I do not understand the Philosophy of the Union between the Divine and Human Nature; (neither do I comprehend the Vital Union between my Soul and Body, nor how and in what manner they are joyn'd, tho' I am sure that so it is) …” (Astell 1705, 51 [section 62]).

About how mind–body unions differ from each other with respect to their abilities to reason, Astell sometimes implies that experience, construed in a Lockean framework, may be the cause:

For as the Diligent-hand maketh Rich, whil'st the Slothful and Prodigal come to nothing, so the Use of our Powers improves and Encreases them, and the most Observing and Considerate is the Wisest Person: For she lays up in her Mind as in a Store-house, ready to produce on all Occasions, a Clear and Simple Idea of every Object that has at any time presented itself. And perhaps the difference between one Womans Reason and anothers may consist only in this, that the one has amass'd a greater number of such Ideas than the other, and dispos'd them more Orderly in her Understanding so that they are at hand, ready to be apply'd to those Complex Ideas whose Agreement or Disagreement cannot be found out by the means of some of ‘em. (Astell 2002, 175–176)

Her more common view, however, is a rationalist one, according to which bodies impede minds from having perfect ideas: “For did we consider what we Are, that Humane Nature consists in the Union of a Rational Soul with a Mortal Body, that the Body very often Clogs the Mind in its noblest Operations, especially when indulg'd” (Astell 2002, 210). She also presents this view in the following passage:

The Primary Cause of this is that Limitation which all Created Minds are Subject to, which Limitation appears more visible in some than in others, either because some Minds are endow'd by their Creator with a larger Capacity than the rest, or if you are not inclin'd to think so, then by reason of the Indisposition of the Bodily Organs, which cramps and contracts the Operations of the Mind. (Astell 2002, 159)

Here Astell, like other rationalists, valorizes the mind over the body. The following passage illustrates another way Astell emphasizes this point:

For I question not but that we shoul'd be convinc'd that the Body is the Instrument of the Mind and no more, that it is of such a much Inferiour Nature, and therefore ought to be kept in such a Case as to be ready on all occasions to serve the Mind. That the true and proper Pleasure of Human Nature consists in the exercise of that Dominion which the Soul has over the Body, in governing every Passion and Motion according to Right Reason, by which we most truly pursue the real good of both, it being a mistake as well of our Duty as our Happiness to consider either part of us singly, so as to neglect what is due to the other. For if we disregard the Body wholly, we pretend to live like Angels whilst we are but Mortals; and if we prefer or equal it to the Mind we degenerate into Brutes. (Astell 2002, 210–211)

Whereas the body has merely an “instrumental” role with respect to the mind, the mind has “dominion” over the body, and a governing role over the passions. Humans should correctly employ their minds and bodies so that they do not degenerate into brutes, or conduct their lives as if they were angels.

Astell's account of the mind–body union allows her to argue against the popular view of the period about women, according to which women do not demonstrate the same kinds of intellectual abilities as do men because women are inherently more closely united to their bodies than are men. Equip with the rationalist account of the mind–body union, Astell can show that the uniformity of women's inabilities is rooted not in their natures, but arises because of social practices. She is particularly concerned with customs that lead women to attend to physical objects:

But alas! To complete our misfortunes, by a continual application to Vanity and Folly, we quite spoil the contexture and frame of our Minds, so loosen and dissipate, that nothing solid and substantial will stay in it. By an habitual inadvertency we render our selves incapable of any serious and improving thought, till our minds themselves become as light and frothy as those things they are conversant about. (Astell 2002, 68)

In other passages she frames the problem in terms of a rationalist account of the passions: women, like all men, are born with natural generosity—a striving for perfection. Given that women are not educated, they do not develop intellectual perfection, but focus on creating physical perfection, and also on the praises that accompany it. Thus they develop vanity and pride, the “feminine vices” (Astell 2002, 62–64).

Astell argues that women are in dire need of educations that teach them to perfect their mental capacities so that they avoid wrong choices:

Doubtless a truly Christian Life requires a clear Understanding as well as regular Affections, that both together may move the Will to a direct choice of Good and a stedfast adherence to it. For tho' the heart may be honest, it is but by chance that the Will is right if the Understanding be ignorant and Cloudy. (Astell 2002, 70–71)

Ultimately, women's salvation is at stake:

And since our Happiness in the next World, depends so far on those dispositions which we carry along with us out of this, that without a right habitude and temper of mind we are not capable of Felicity; and seeing our Beatitude consists in the contemplation of the divine Truth and Beauty, as well as in the fruition of his Goodness, can Ignorance be a fit preparative for Heaven? Is't likely that she whose Understanding has been busied about nothing but froth and trifles, shou'd be capable of delighting her self in noble and sublime Truths? (Astell 2002, 80–81)

Astell's overall project with respect to education is designed to address this problem. If a woman does not learn to separate her mind from her body while on earth—that is, if she does not learn to perfect her rational capacities by forming clear and distinct perceptions of her innate ideas, thereby attaining the correct ordering among her ideas—she will not be able to separate her mind from her body when she dies, and so her soul will not reach heaven. In this way Astell's rationalist education remedies a very practical problem of the individuation of the body and soul at death. This elucidates the kind of education Astell promotes: it is not preparation for a career as a doctor, lawyer, curate, or scientist, nor is it the precursor to what we today call a “liberal education”; instead it is an education that teaches women how cultivate intellectual enjoyment and, ultimately, intellectual perfection.

In addition to developing an account of the mind–body union, Astell also maintains that the mind and body are “really distinct.” As she had a social reason for developing her account of the mind–body union—namely, to argue against the popular account of women's nature—she also had a social reason for constructing arguments about the real distinction between the mind and body: by showing that the mind, unlike the body, is immortal, she can illustrate to people, especially those who believe in the existence of God, how God's existence is important to them (Astell 1705, CR 246–247 [section 256]).

In presenting this account of the real distinction between the mind and body in Christian Religion, Astell demonstrates first that the mind is immaterial, and then that it is immortal. She maintains that the mind is immaterial in that it has no parts, and so is indivisible. Given that it is indivisible, it is incorruptible, and so immortal (Astell 1705, 247 [section 257]). Having ruled out the natural annihilation of minds, Astell turns to the question of whether God would supernaturally annihilate them. She argues that he would not, for God does nothing in vain, thus he would not create something only to annihilate it (Astell 1705, 248–249 [section 257–258]).

Within her discussion about the immortality of minds, Astell contrasts minds with bodies, and different kinds of bodies with each other. Unlike minds, human bodies and other physical objects have parts, and so are corruptible. Such bodies differ from the particles that make them up, which do not corrupt:

Because, tho' this System of Bones, Flesh, and Skin, &. which I call my body, shall within Threescore Years; and this Wood which is now upon the Fire, shall in an Hour or two; and all other Material Beings shall in their proper Seasons be no more; yet not the least Particle doth totally perish. (Astell 1705, 247–248 [section 257])

Here Astell embraces a view according to which physical objects and human bodies are not “beings” in the same sense that particles of bodies are. In the next passages, she also reveals a phenomenalist view about the individuality of physical objects: their “being” is based on appearances, and not anything intrinsic:

So that a Being is Mortal and Corruptible, or ceases to Be, when those parts of which it consists, and whose particular Composition and Figure is that which denominates it this or that Being, and which distinguishes it from all other Beings, are no longer thus or United, but ceasing to appear under their first Texture and Figure, are therefore very properly said to Be no more. (Astell 1705, 248 [section 257])

In the next passages, Astell presents a proof of the real distinction between the mind and body. Her argument is similar to Descartes's insofar as she maintains that the nature of the mind is thought and the nature of the body is extension (Astell 1705, 249–252 [sections 259–261]). (See Atherton, 1993, for a discussion of Astell's account of thought as the nature of the mind.) In the sections that follow these, she uses her account of the real distinction between the mind and body to formulate a critique of Locke's view about the possibility of thinking matter. Bryson (1988), Squadrito (1987; 1991), Taylor (2001), O'Neill (1988, 528–529), and Broad (2002b, 151–153) discuss these arguments in detail.

1.3 The Relation between God and His Creatures

In Letters Concerning the Love of God, Astell and John Norris debate occasionalist and Cambridge Platonist accounts of the relation between God and his creation. (See Wilson, 2004, for a detailed discussion of this text.) The central issue at stake is the claim made by Norris in Practical Discourses upon Several Divine Subjects (1693) that we should love God because he alone is the source of our sensation, and so the source of our pleasure, and so the source of our good. Astell objects: our reason for loving God should not depend on the occasionalist tenet about God's direct causal role in the universe. The issues in their discussion are the extent of God's causal role in creation, the causal powers of physical objects, the workings of human sense perception, the mind–body union, and the ways humans can and should love God and his creation.

Astell and Norris agree on an account of human love, holding that, as bodies have motion, so minds have love. A remnant of this parallel is still with us in the twenty-first century, for we say metaphorically that we are “moved” when we experience a shift in our emotions toward a kind of tenderness. Broad notes that Astell and Norris also agree that there are two basic kinds of love, differentiated in part with respect to the objects on which the love is focused. On the one hand, creatures deserve “benevolence,” which is marked by its disinterestedness, and motivated by altruism and charity; created things, after all, lack the casual power to ultimately satisfy the desires of other created beings. On the other hand, God merits “desire,” which is a love of something as our good. Ultimately, he is the only one who has the causal power to ultimately satisfy our desires. God does not need our benevolence, for he cannot lack anything that we could give him (Broad 2002, 119–120).

Astell and Norris's shared views on love relate to their views on causality. Occasionalists and Cambridge Platonists developed accounts of causality in order to remedy a purported problem with Descartes's ontology. According to Descartes, God created two different kinds of substances—mental and corporeal—that, on the one hand, are “really distinct” from each other in virtue of their essences, and, on the other hand, are sometimes united to form mind–body unions. When so united, minds and bodies interact with each other, for instance during sensation. The purported problem is this: how can two substances that have completely different essences—essences that render them “really distinct” substances—interact with each other?

With an eye toward resolving this problem, Cambridge Platonists retained an account of the interaction between the mind and body, and presented a quite different interpretation of the number and nature of substances that exist. Henry More, for example, maintained that, in addition to the souls of God and living creatures, there is the “Spirit of Nature,” which is the causal agent that allows human minds and bodies to interact.

The occasionalist philosophers resolved the problem another way: they agreed with Descartes that the mind and body are really distinct because of their quite different natures, but they denied that there is any interaction between them. Instead, they maintained that God orchestrates a harmonious correlation between events of the mind and events of the body, and he is the efficient (and so direct) cause of human sensations.

Throughout Letters, Norris defends his occasionalism against Astell's critiques, which were based on Cambridge Platonist views about the nature of the mind–body union. In the appendix—written after Norris convinced Astell to allow him to publish the letters as a volume—Astell presents two final criticisms of Norris's account. First, occasionalism makes much of God's creation vain: if God is the efficient cause of all of our sense perceptions, then his creation of material objects is superfluous, for they play no direct role in our sense perceptions (Astell, Norris 1695, 278–80). Second, occasionalism offends God's majesty, for according to it he repeatedly interferes in creation in order to move bodies and create mental events. (Astell, Norris 1695, 278). O'Neill notes that these critiques were not original to Astell, for they were presented by scholastic figures (Aquinas and Molina), and that the occasionalists had responses to the first (O'Neill 1998, 528).

How we should understand Astell's critiques in Letters rests on an interpretive question: given that Astell initiated the correspondence with Norris in order to introduce herself into London's philosophical community, should we read her as presenting her own positive philosophy or, rather, as demonstrating to Norris and others that she is well versed in the popular views of the period? If the latter is the case, then O'Neill's discussion about these last two arguments may reveal that Astell successfully presented herself as understanding the relevant issues of the debate. In Christian Religion, her most developed philosophical treatise, Astell returns to the issue of love, this time to distinguish her view from those developed by Locke and Masham (Broad 2002, 124); an analysis of these passages may reveal Astell's own positive account of the issues at stake.

Insofar as Astell maintained that minds and bodies are really distinct; the nature of the mind is to think and the nature of the body is to be extended; human beings are mind–body unions; and physical objects play a causal role in the production of our sensations, her metaphysics is closer to that of Descartes than to those of the occasionalists or Cambridge Platonists. A full examination of her epistemology will reveal the degree to which her account of knowledge is also Cartesian.


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Cambridge Platonists | Descartes, René | Locke, John