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The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

First published Thu 14 Aug, 2003

1. The Intuitive Distinction

Compare the following two sets of sentences:

(1) Some doctors that specialize on eyes are unmarried.

(2) Some ophthalmologists are unmarried.

(3) Many bachelors are ophthalmologists.

(4) People who run damage their bodies.

(5) If Holmes killed Sikes, then Watson must be dead.

(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.

(7) All ophthalmologists are doctors.

(8) All bachelors are unmarried.

(9) People who run move their bodies.

(10) If Holmes killed Sikes, then Sikes is dead.

Most competent English speakers who know the meanings of all the words would find an obvious difference between the two sets: whereas they might wonder about the truth or falsity of those of set I, they would find themselves pretty quickly incapable of doubting the truth of those of II. Unlike the former, these latter seem true automatically, just by virtue of what the words mean, as many might spontaneously put it. Indeed, a denial of any of II would seem to be unintelligible, or a contradiction in terms. Although there is, as we shall see (§3.6 below), a great deal of dispute about these italicized ways of drawing the distinction, and even about whether it is real, philosophers standardly refer to sentences of the first class as “synthetic,” those of the second as (at least apparently) “analytic.” Some philosophers have further hoped that the apparent necessity and a priori of the claims of logic, mathematics and much of philosophy would prove to be due to the claims being analytic (§2), a view that led them to regard philosophy as consisting in large part in the “analysis” of the meanings of the relevant claims, words and concepts (hence “analytic” philosophy, although the term has long ceased to have any such specific commitment, and refers now more generally to philosophy done in the associated closely reasoned style).

In one of the earliest discussions of sentences like those of set II, John Locke regarded them as “trifling,” characterizing them as ones “when a part of the complex idea is predicated of the name of a whole; a part of the definition, of the word defined,” providing as an example ‘Lead is a metal’ (p. 46). A similar definition is provided by Immanuel Kant a point of departure for most discussions since (although Locke's example about lead will come back to haunt the discussion, see §3.5 below).

1.1 Kant

The specific terms ‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ themselves were introduced by Kant (1781/1998) at the beginning of his Critique of Pure Reason. He wrote:

In all judgments in which the relation of a subject to the predicate is thought (if I only consider affirmative judgments, since the application to negative ones is easy) this relation is possible in two different ways. Either the predicate B belongs to the subject A as something that is (covertly) contained in this concept A; or B lies entirely outside the concept A, though to be sure it stands in connection with it. In the first case, I call the judgment analytic, in the second synthetic. (A:6-7)

He provides as an example of an analytic judgment, ‘All bodies are extended’: in thinking of a body we can't help but also think of something extended in space. This would seem to be just part of what is meant by ‘body’. He contrasts this example with “All bodies are heavy,” where the predicate (‘is heavy’) “is something entirely different from that which I think in the mere concept of body in general” (A7).

A particularly interesting claim that Kant went on to defend was that some of the a priori claims of mathematics and philosophy, claims that seem to be justifiable independently of experience, were also synthetic. He provides the example of ‘7 + 5 = 12’: the concept of 12 is not contained in the concepts of 7, 5, or +. Appreciating the truth of the proposition seems to require some kind of further construction, or, as he calls it, “synthesis,” among the constituent thoughts.

Kant tries to spell out his metaphor of “(covert) containment” in two ways. To see that any of set II is true, he writes:

I need only to analyze the concept, i.e., become conscious of the manifold that I always think in it, in order to encounter this predicate therein. (A7)
But then, picking up a suggestion of Leibniz, claim:
I merely draw out the predicate in accordance with the principle of contradiction, and can thereby at the same time become conscious of the necessity of the judgment. (A7)
As Katz (1988) recently emphasized, this second definition is significantly different from the “containment” idea, for now, in its appeal to the powerful method of proof by contradiction, the analytic would include all of the infinite deductive consequences of a particular claim, most of which could not be plausibly regarded as “contained” in the concept expressed in the claim (for starters, “Bachelors are unmarried or the moon is blue” is a logical consequence of “Bachelors are unmarried” — its denial readily contradicts the latter — but clearly nothing about the color of the moon is remotely “contained in” the concept bachelor). Katz (1972, 1988 and elsewhere) goes on to try to develop a serious theory based upon only the initial containment idea, as, along different lines, does Pietroski (forthcoming).

One reason Kant didn't pay much attention to the differences between his characterizations of the analytic was that, as in the above case of “7+5=12,” he thought that the mental activity of “synthesis” was the source of the serious cases of a priori knowledge, not only in arithmetic, but also in geometry, ethics, and philosophy generally, a view that set the stage for much of the philosophical discussions of the subsequent century (see Coffa (1991:pt I). Although geometry tended to be the main case of concern, worries were increasingly raised about mathematics, which by the late Nineteenth Century had reached a point of towering sophistication, resting, however, on uncertain foundations. It was specifically in response to this latter problem that Gottlob Frege (1884/1980) tried to improve upon Kant's formulations, and presented what is widely regarded as the next significant discussion of the topic.

1.2 Frege

Frege (1884/1950:§§5,88) and others noted a number of problems with Kant's “containment” metaphor. In the first place, as Kant himself would have agreed, the criterion would need to be freed of “psychologistic” suggestions, or claims about merely the accidental thought processes of thinkers, as opposed to claims about truth and justification that are presumably at issue with the analytic. In particular, mere associations are not always matters of meaning: someone might regularly associate bachelors with unhappiness, but this wouldn't therefore be seriously a part of the meaning of ‘bachelor’ (a happy bachelor is not a contradiction). But, secondly, although the denial of a genuinely analytic claim may well be a “contradiction,” it is not clear what makes it so: there is no explicit contradiction in the thought of a married bachelor, in the way that there is in the thought of a bachelor who is not a bachelor. Rejecting “a married bachelor” as contradictory would seem to have no justification other than the claim that “All bachelors are married” is analytic, and so cannot be appealed to in explanation of that claim (cf. §3.6 below).

Even were Kant to have solved these problems, there would still be the problem of extending his notion of “containment” to cover the following cases, which might seem to many to be as “analytic” as any of set II:

II. (con't.)
(11) If John hit Bill, then Bill was hit by John.

(12) If Sue persuaded Jane to go, then Jane decided to go.

(13) If Sue is married to Bob, then Bob is married to Sue.

(14) If x is bigger than y, and y is bigger than z, then x is bigger than z.

Just how is Bill's being hit by John “contained in” John's hitting Bill, or Jane's decision in Sue's persuasion? What in the concept of marriage insures that it's a symmetric relation, or in the concept bigger than, that it's transitive? Or consider merely the case of an ordinary color word: “If something is red, then it's colored” would also appear to be analytic; but what else besides ‘colored’ could be included in the analysis? Red is colored and what else? It is hard to see what else to “add” — except red itself!

Frege attempts to remedy the situation by completely re-thinking the foundations of logic, developing what we now think of as modern symbolic logic “formal” language (i.e. a language characterized by its formal, or spelling properties), and sets out an account of what are called the “logical constants,” such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘not’, ‘all’ and ‘some’. Just how these are selected is a matter of some dispute, but intuitively, the constants can be thought of as those parts of language that don't “point” or “purport to refer” to something in the world, in the way that ordinary nouns, verbs and adjectives seem to do: ‘dogs’ refers to dogs, ‘red’ to redness and/or red things; but words like ‘or’ and ‘all’ don't seem to even purport to refer to anything at all.

This distinction allows us to define a logical truth as a sentence that is true no matter what referring expressions occur in it. Consequently,

(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.
counts as a (strict) logical truth: no matter what referring expressions we put in for ‘doctor’, ‘eyes’ and ‘specialize on’ in (6), the sentence will remain true. For example, substituting ‘cats’ for ‘doctors’, ‘mice’ for ‘eyes’ and ‘chase’ for ‘specialize on’, we get:
(15) All cats that chase mice are cats.

But what about the others of set II? Substituting ‘cats’ for ‘doctors’ and ‘mice’ for ‘ophthalmologists’ in

(7) All ophthalmologists are doctors.
we get:
(16) All mice are cats.
which is patently false, as would other such substitutions render the rest of the examples of II. So how are we to capture these apparent analyticities?

Here Frege appeals to the notion of definition, or (on the assumption that definitions preserve “meaning” — see §4.2 below) synonymy: the non-logical analytic truths are those that can be converted to (strict) logical truths by substitution of definitions for defined terms, or synonyms for synonyms. Since ‘mice’ is not synonymous with ‘ophthalmologist’, (16) is not a substitution of the required sort. We need, instead, a substitution of the definition of ‘ophthalmologist’, i.e. ‘doctor that specializes on eyes’; this would convert (7) into our earlier purely logical truth:

(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.
Frege was mostly interested in formalizing arithmetic, and so considered the logical forms of a relative minority of natural language sentences in a deliberately spare formalism. Work on the logical (or syntactic) structure of the full range of sentences of natural language has blossomed since then, initially in the work of Bertrand Russell definite descriptions and other “generative” linguists (see §4.3 below). Whether Frege's criterion of analyticity will work for the rest of II and other analyticities depends upon the details of those proposals (see, e.g., Katz (1972), Montague (1974), Hornstein (1984) and Pietroski (forthcoming)).

2. High Hopes

Why should philosophy be particularly interested in what would seem to be a purely linguistic notion? Because, especially in the first half of the Twentieth Century, they thought it could perform crucial epistemological work, providing an account, first, of our apparently a priori knowledge of mathematics, and then — with a little help from British empiricism — of our understanding of claims about the spatio-temporal world as well. Indeed, “conceptual analysis” soon came to constitute the very way particularly Anglophone philosophers characterized their work. Some additionally thought it would perform the metaphysical work of explaining the truth and necessity of mathematics (this latter work was sometimes not distinguished from the former one; see Boghossian (1997) for discussion). In this entry we will focus primarily on the more central, epistemological project

2.1 Mathematics

The problem of accounting for mathematical knowledge is arguably one of the oldest and hardest problems in Western philosophy. It is easy enough to understand: ordinarily we acquire knowledge about the world by our senses. If we are interested in, for example, whether it's raining outside, how many birds are on the beach, how fast a rock falls, or whether broccoli prevents cancer, we look and see (or turn to others who do). It is a widespread view that Western sciences owe their tremendous successes precisely to relying on just such “empirical” (experiential, experimental) methods. However, it is also a patent fact about all these sciences, and even our ordinary ways of counting birds, that they depend on mathematics; and mathematics does not seem to be known on the basis of experience. Mathematicians don't do experiments the way chemists or biologists or other “natural scientists” do. They seem simply to think, at most relying on something like pencil and paper as merely an aid to memory. In any case, they don't try to justify their claims by reference to experiments: ‘Twice two is four’ is not justified by observing that pairs of pairs tend in all cases observed so far to be quadruples.

But how could mere processes of thought issue in any knowledge about the independently existing external world? The belief that it could would seem to involve some kind of mysticism; and, indeed, many “naturalistic” philosophers have felt that the appeals of “Rationalist” philosophers like Plato, Descartes, Leibniz and, more recently, Katz (1981, 1998), Bealer (1987) and Bonjour (1998), to some special faculty of “rational intuition,” seem no better off than appeals to “revelation” to establish theology.

Here's where the analytic seemed to many to offer a more promising alternative. Perhaps all the truths of arithmetic could be shown to be analytic by Frege's criterion, i.e. by showing that they could all be converted into logical truths by substitution of synonyms for synonyms. Of course, the relevant synonyms were not quite as obvious as ‘ophthalmologist’ and ‘eye doctor’; one needed to engage in a rigorous process of logical analysis of the meanings of such words as ‘number’, ‘plus’, ‘exponent’, ‘limit’, ‘integral’, etc.. But this is what Frege set out to do, and in his train, Russell and the young Ludwig Wittgenstein logicism, often with great insight and success.

2.2 Science

But why stop at arithmetic? If logical analysis could illuminate the foundations of mathematics by showing how it could all be derived from logic by substitution of synonyms, perhaps it could also illuminate the foundations of the rest of our knowledge by showing how its claims could similarly be derived from logic and experience. Such was the hope and program of the Logical Positivists Moritz Schlick, A.J. Ayer and, especially, Rudolf Carnap. Of course, such a proposal did presume that all of our concepts were “derived” either from logic or experience, but this seemed in keeping with the then prevailing presumptions of empiricism immense success of the empirical sciences.

How were our concepts of, e.g., space, time, causation, or material objects analytically related to experience? For the Positivists, the answer seemed obvious: by tests. Taking a page from the American philosopher, C.S. Pierce, they proposed various versions of their Verifiability Theory of Meaning to which the meaning (or “cognitive significance”) of any sentence was the conditions of its empirical (dis)confirmation. Thus, to say that there was an electric current of a certain magnitude in a wire was to say that, if one were to attach a voltmeter to one end of the wire, it would indicate that very magnitude. Closer to “experience”: to say that there was a cat on a mat was just to say that certain patterns of sensation (certain familiar visual, tactile and aural appearances) were to be expected under certain circumstances. After all, it seemed to them, as it seemed to Bishop Berkeley centuries earlier, that, since all we really know about “directly” are our own sensory experiences, our concepts of other things must involve some or other kind of construction from those experiences. Berkeley and earlier empiricists had erred only in thinking that the mechanism of construction was mere association. But this mechanism had notorious problems dealing with abstract and theoretical concepts (like democracy or gene), and has no clear way of capturing the structure of a judgment, much less distinguishing the judgment that Someone loves everyone from Everyone loves someone. Now, however, we had Frege's logic to help us out. Our claims about the empirical world were to be analyzed into the (dis)confirming experiences out of which they must somehow have been logically constructed.

The project of providing “analyses” of especially problematic concepts, such as those concerning, e.g., material objects, knowledge, perception, causation, freedom, the self, goodness, was pursued by Positivists and other “analytic” philosophers for a considerable period (see Carnap (1928/67) for some rigorous examples, and Ayer (1934/52) for more accessible ones). With regard to material object claims, the program came to be known as “phenomenalism” claims of science, as “operationalism” about people's mental lives, as “analytical behaviorism” the relevant experiential basis of mental claims in general being taken to be observations of others' behavior). But, although these programs became extremely influential, and some form of the verifiability criterion was often invoked in physics and psychology to constrain theoretical speculation, they seldom, if ever, met with any serious success. No sooner was an analysis proposed, then counterexamples were conceived and the analysis revised, only to be faced with still further counterexamples. Despite what seemed its initial plausibility, the criterion, and with it the very notion of analyticity, came to be suspected of resting on mistakes.

3. Problems with the Distinction

3.1 The Status of the Primitives

An issue that Frege's criterion didn't address is the status of the basic sentences of logic themselves. Are the logical truths themselves a priori because they, too, are “analytic”? But what makes them so? Is it that anyone who understands their wording just must see that they are true? If so, how are we to make sense of disputes about the laws of logic, of the sort that are raised, for example, by intuitionists (see Dummett 1978) or, more recently, by “para-consistent” logicians (Priest et al. 1989), who argue for the toleration even of contradictions in certain troublesome cases? Moreover, given that the infinitude of logical truths need to be “generated” by rules of inference, wouldn't that be a reason for regarding them as “synthetic” in Kant's sense (see Frege (1884/1980:§88), Katz (1988:58-9))? And, even if logical truths are analytic, how does claiming them to be so differ from merely claiming that they are obviously and universally correct, i.e. just firmly held beliefs, indistinguishable in kind from banalities like “The earth has existed for many years” or “There have been black dogs” (Quine 1956/76, §II)?

A different problem arises for the non-logical vocabulary. The sentences reporting our experiences, of course, weren't supposed to be either a priori or analytic (although someone failing to apply one in the face of the relevant experience might be regarded as failing to understand its terms). But there was a serious question about just what “experience” should be taken to be: was it the sort of encounter with ordinary middle-sized objects such as tables and chairs, the weather and bodily actions, in terms of which most people would readily describe their perceptual experience? Or was it some sort of “unconceptualized” play of sense impressions that it would take something like the training of an articulate impressionist artist to describe? This latter suggestion seemed to involve a ‘myth of the given’ (Sellars 1956), or the dubious assumption that there was something given in our experience that was entirely uninterpreted by our understanding. This was a claim on which mounting aspersions were cast by psychologists (Bruner 1957) and philosophers of science (Kuhn 1962). Considered closely, “observations” can be seen to be shot through with conceptual presuppositions: even so guarded a report as “It smells to me like tarragon” arguably involves the at least partly conceptualized memory of what ‘tarragon’ refers to, and what one's earlier experiences were like. If so, and there was consequently no privileged set of sentences reporting experience in an unbiased way, then the rug would seem to have been pulled from under the whole Positivist analytic program: there would seem be no epistemically special vocabulary in which analyses ought ultimately to be couched; analyses at best would amount to no more than translation from one unpriviledged vocabulary to another.

Recent developments in psychology, however, suggest that human minds may well contain sensory and motor “modules” whose primitives would be epistemically distinctive, even if they did involve some limited degree of conceptual interpretation (see modularity and Fodor(1983)). And so the analytical Positivist program might be recast in terms of the reduction of all concepts to these sensorimotor primitives (often such a program is implicit in cognitive psychology and artificial intelligence.

3.2 The Paradox of Analysis

Another problem about the entire program was raised by C.H. Langford (1942/71): why should analyses be of any conceivable interest. After all, if analysis consists merely in providing the definition of an expression, then it should be wholly uninformative, as uninformative as the claim that unmarried males are unmarried. But the hard-won reductions of, say, material object statements to sensory ones, if ultimately successful, would hardly be uninformative. So how could they count as seriously analytic? This is “the paradox of analysis,” which can be seen as dormant in Frege's own move from his (1884) focus on definitions to his more controversial (1892) doctrine of sense, where two senses are distinct if and only if someone can think a thought containing the one but not other (as in the case of the senses of ‘the morning star’ and ‘the evening star’). If definitions preserve sense, then whenever one thought the defined concept one would be thinking also the definition. But few of Frege's definitions, much less those of the Positivists, seemed remotely to have this character (see Bealer (1982:ch 3), Dummett (1991) and Horty (1993) for recent discussion).

These problems, so far, can be regarded as relatively technical, for which further technical moves within the program might be made (for example, making further distinctions within the theory of sense between an expression's content itself and the specific “linguistic vehicle” for its expression; see e.g. Fodor (1990a)). But the problems with the program seemed to many philosophers to be deeper than merely technical. By far, the most telling and influential of the criticisms both of the program, and then of analyticity in general, were those of the American philosopher, W.V. Quine the program (see esp. his (1934)), and whose objections therefore carry special weight. The reader is well-advised to consult especially his (1956/76) for as rich a discussion of the issues as one might find. The next two sections abbreviate some of that discussion.

3.3 Problems With Logicism

Although the pursuit of the logicist program gave rise to a great many insights into the nature of mathematical concepts, not long after its inception it began encountering substantial difficulties. For Frege, the most calamitous came early on in a letter from Russell, in which Russell pointed out that one of Frege's crucial axioms for arithmetic was inconsistent. In his “Axiom of Comprehension,” Frege had assumed what might seem a matter of the meaning of the word ‘set’, essentially that there existed a set for every predication. But what, asked Russell, of the predication ‘the set x is not a member of itself’,? He readily showed that, if there were a set for that predication, it would be a member of itself if and only if it wasn't; consequently, there could be no such set. Thus the axiom, stated in full generality, couldn't be true (see set theory).

What was especially troubling about “Russell's paradox” was that there seemed to be no intuitively satisfactory way to repair the “naive” comprehension axiom in a way that could lay claim to be as obvious and merely a matter of meaning in the way that the original axiom arguably seemed to be. Various proposals were made, but all of them were tailored precisely to avoid the paradox, and had little independent appeal. Certainly none of them appeared to be analytic. As Quine (1956/76, §V) observed, in the actual practice of choosing axioms for set theory, we are left “making deliberate choices and setting them forth unaccompanied by any attempt at justification other than in terms of their elegance and convenience,” appeals to the meanings of terms be hanged (although see Boolos (1971)).

3.4 Convention?

But perhaps these “deliberate choices” could themselves be seen as affording a basis for analytic claims. For aren't matters of meaning in the end really matters about the deliberate or implicit conventions with which words are used? Someone, for example, could invest a particular word, say, ‘schmuncle,’ with a specific meaning merely by stipulating that it mean, say, unmarried uncle. Wouldn't that be a basis for claiming then that ‘An schmuncle is a uncle’ is analytic, or “true by virtue of the (stipulated) meanings of the words alone”? Carnap (1947) proposed setting out the “meaning postulates” of a scientific language in just this way. So perhaps what philosophical analysis is doing is revealing the tacit conventions of ordinary language, an approach particularly favored by Ayer (1934/52).

Quine (1956, §§IV-V) went on to address the complex role(s) of convention in mathematics and science. Drawing on his earlier discussion (1936) of the conventionality of logic, he argues that logic could not be established by such conventions, since

the logical truths, being infinite in number, must be given by general conventions rather than singly; and logic is needed then in the metatheory, in order to apply the general conventions to individual cases (p. 115),

an argument that certainly ought to give the proponents of the conventionality of logic pause (a delicate issue remains about whether “implicit” conventions of the sort discussed by Lewis (1969) would make a difference). Turning to set theory and then the rest of science, Quine proceeded to argue that, although stipulative definition (what he calls ‘legislative postulation’)

contributes truths which become integral to the corpus of truths, the artificiality of their origin does not linger as a localized quality, but suffuses the corpus. (pp. 119-20)

This certainly seems to accord with scientific practice: even if Newton, say, had himself explicitly set out ‘F = ma’ as a stipulated definition of ‘F’, this wouldn't really settle the interesting philosophical question of whether ‘F = ma’, is justified by its being analytic, or “true by meaning alone,” since our taking his stipulation seriously would depend our acceptance of his theory as a whole, in particular upon “the elegance and convenience” it brought to the rest of our physical theory of the world. As Quine observed:

[S]urely the justification of any theoretical hypothesis can, at the time of hypothesis, consist in no more than the elegance and convenience which the hypothesis brings to the containing bodies of laws and data. How then are we to delimit the category of legislative postulation, short of including under it every new act of scientific hypothesis? (p. 121)

Carnap's legislated “meaning postulates” should therefore be regarded as just an arbitrary selection of sentences a theory presents as true, a selection perhaps useful for purposes of exposition, but no more significant than the selection of certain towns in Ohio as “starting points” for a journey (1953/80:35). Invoking his famous holistic metaphor of the “web of belief,” Quine concluded:

the lore of our fathers is a fabric of sentences [which] develops and changes, through more or less arbitrary and deliberate revisions and additions of our own, more or less directly occasioned by the continuing stimulation of our sense organs. It is a pale grey lore, black with fact and white with convention. But I have found no substantial reasons for concluding that there are any quite black threads in it, or any white ones (p. 132).

3.5 Problems With Verificationism

These last quoted passages express a tremendously influential view of Quine's that soon came to lead several generations of philosophers to despair not only of the analytic-synthetic distinction, but of the category of a priori knowledge entirely. The view has come to be called “confirmation holism,” and Quine had expressed it more shortly a few years earlier, in his widely read article “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1953, ch. 2):

our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually, but only as a corporate body (1953/80, p. 41).
Indeed, the “two dogmas” that the article discusses are the belief in the intelligibility of the analytic-synthetic distinction and (what Quine regarded as the flip side of the same coin) the belief that “each statement, taken in isolation from its fellows, can admit of confirmation or infirmation at all” (p. 41), i.e. the very (version of the) Verifiability Theory of Meaning we have seen the Positivists enlisted in their effort to analyze the claims of science and commonsense in terms of logic and experience.

Quine derived his “confirmation holism” from observations of Pierre Duhem (1914/54), which drew attention to the myriad ways in which theories are supported by evidence, and the fact that an hypothesis is not (dis)confirmed merely by some specific experiment considered in isolation from an immense amount of surrounding theory. Thus, to take our earlier example, applying a voltmeter to a wire will be a good test that there's a current in the wire, only if the voltmeter is in working order, the wire is composed of normal copper, there aren't any other forces at work that might disturb the measurement — and, moreover, the background laws of physics that have informed the design of the measurement are in fact sufficiently correct. A failure in the meter to register a current could, after all, be due to a failure of any of these other conditions (which is why experimenters spend so much time and money constructing “controlled” experiments). Moreover, with a small change in our theories, or just in our understanding of the conditions for measurement, we might change the tests on which we rely, but without necessarily changing the meaning of the sentences whose truth we might be trying to test (which, as Putnam (1965/75) pointed out, is what practicing scientists regularly do).

What is entirely novel — and highly controversial — about Quine's understanding of these commonplace observations is his extension of them to claims presumed (e.g., by Duhem) to be outside its scope, viz., the whole of mathematics and even logic. It is this extension that begins to undermine the traditional a priori status of these latter domains, since it appears to open the possibility of a revision of logic or mathematics in the interest of the plausibility of the overall resulting theory — containing the empirical claims and logic and mathematics. Perhaps this wouldn't be so bad should the revisability of logic and mathematics permit their ultimately admitting of a justification that didn't involve experience. But this is ruled out by Quine's insistence that scientific theories (with their logic and mathematics) are confirmed “only” as “corporate bodies.” It's not clear what Quine's argument for this “only” is, but his doctrine has been read as standardly including it (see Rey (1998) for discussion). Certainly, though, as an observation about the essentially empirical status of scientific definitions, such as Locke's (unfortunate?) example that we noted at the start of ‘Lead is metal,’ Quine's claim seems right. As Hilary Putnam (1962, 1965, 1970, 1975) made vivid, enlarging on Quine's theme, it is not hard to imagine empirical results that might lead scientists to reasonably re-classify lead in some other category, much as chemists now regard glass as a liquid.

3.6 Quine on Meaning in Linguistics

Quine's discussion of the role of convention in science seems right; but how about the role of meaning in ordinary natural language? Is it really true that in the “pale grey lore” of all the sentences we accept, there aren't some that are “white” somehow “by virtue of the very meanings of their words”? What about our examples in our earlier set II? What about sentences that merely link synonyms, as in “Lawyers are attorneys,” or “A fortnight is a period of fourteen days”? As Grice and Strawson (1956) pointed out, it is unlikely that so intuitively plausible a distinction should turn out to have no basis in fact. Quine addressed this issue, first, in his (1953/80, chs. 1 and 3), and then in a much larger way in chapter 2 of his Word and Object (1960) and many subsequent writings.

Quine drove his objection to analyticity over to the very idea of synonymy and the linguistic meaning of an expression, on which, we saw (§§1.2,3.2), Frege's criterion of analyticity crucially depended. Quine's objection was that he saw no way to make any serious explanatory sense of these notions. In his (1953) he explored plausible explanations in terms of ‘definition’, ‘intension,’ ‘possibility,’ and ‘contradiction,’(recall our observation in §1.2 above regarding the lack of overt contradiction in `married bachelor'), plausibly pointing out that each of these notions stand in precisely as much need of explanation as synonymy itself. The lot of them form what seems to be a viciously small ‘closed curve in space’ (p. 30). Although many have wondered whether this is a particularly fatal flaw in any of these notions (circularities notoriously abound among many fundumental notions), it led Quine to be sceptical of the lot of them.

What explains then the appearance of analyticity and synonymy exhibited by our examples in set II? Here Quine once again invoked his metaphor of the web of belief, claiming that sentences are more or less revisable, depending upon how “peripheral” or “central” their position is in the web. So-called “analytic” and other sentences purporting to be “known a priori” are, like the laws of logic and mathematics, comparatively central, and so are given up, if ever, only under extreme pressure from the peripheral forces of experience on the web. But no sentence is absolutely immune from revision, and so no sentence is purely analytic or a priori.

It is worth noting an important change that Quine (following a trend set by earlier Positivists) implicitly introduced into the definition of the a priori, and consequently into his understanding of the analytic. Where the traditional understanding of Kant and others had been that the a priori concerned beliefs “justifiable independently of experience,” Quine and many other philosophers of the time came to regard it as beliefs “unrevisable in the light of experience.” And, we have just seen, a similar status is accorded the apparently analytic. But unrevisability implies that someone would have to regard himself as infallible about any a priori or analytic claim. This is a further claim that many defenders of the traditional notions need not embrace. A claim might be in fact justifiable independently of experience, but nevertheless perfectly revisable in the light of it. Experience, after all, might mislead us. Moreover, just which claims are genuinely a priori or analytic might not be available at the introspective or behavioral surface of our lives (see Bonjour (1998), Rey (1998) and Field (2000) for further discussion).

In the spirit of Quine, Putnam (1965) added a further condition to centrality that has recently also been endorsed by Jerry Fodor (1998), that the sentences that are apparently “analytic” are simply those that involve “one-criterion words,” or words, like ‘bachelor’ or ‘ophthalmologist’, for which there simply happens to be a single, widely agreed upon conclusive test for their application. We'll return to this and the centrality condition shortly (§4.3).

Quine was not insensitive to the consequences his views had far beyond mere philosophy, especially in linguistics and psychology. He pursued them in his (1960) by sketching a full-fledged behavioristic theory of language that does without any determinate theory of meaning. Indeed, a consequence of his theory is that translation (i.e. the identification of two expressions from different languages as having the same meaning) is “indeterminate”; there is “no fact of the matter” about whether two expressions do or do not have the same meaning (see indeterminacy of translation). And it's a consequence of this view that there are pretty much no facts of the matter about people's mental lives at all! For, if there is no fact of the matter about whether two people mean the same thing by their words, then there is no fact of the matter about they ever have mental states with the same content, and so no fact of the matter about what anyone ever thinks. Quine, a radical behaviorist throughout his life, took this consequence in stride. Somewhat ironically, he regards it as “of a piece” with Brentano's thesis of the irreducibility of the intentional (see the entry on Brentano) — it's just that for him, unlike for the dualist, Brentano, this shows the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (1960, p. 221). Needless to say, many subsequent philosophers have not been happy with these consequences, and have wondered where Quine's argument went wrong.

4. Post-Quinean Strategies

There has been a wide variety of responses to Quine's attack. Some, for example, Davidson (1980), Stich (1983) and Dennett (1987), seem simply to accept it and try to account for our practice of meaning ascription within its “non-factual” bounds. Since they follow Quine in at least claiming to forswear the analytic, we will not consider their views further here. Others, who might be (loosely) called “neo-Cartesians,” reject Quine's attack as simply so much prejudice of the empiricism and naturalism which they take to be his own uncritical dogmas (§4.1 in what follows). Still others hope simply to find a way to break out of the ‘intentional circle,’ and provide analyses of at least what it means for one thing (a state of the brain, for example) to mean (or ‘carry the information about’) another, usually external phenomenon in the world (§4.2). Perhaps the most trenchant reaction has been that of empirically oriented linguists and philosophers, particularly those in the now various traditions inspired by the revolutionary linguistic work of Noam Chomsky (§4.3).

4.1 Neo-Cartesianism

The most unsympathetic response to Quine's challenges has been essentially to stare him down and insist upon an inner faculty of “intuition” whereby the analyticity of certain claims is simply “grasped” directly through, as Laurence Bonjour (1998) puts it:

an act of rational insight or rational intuition … [that] is seemingly (a) direct or immediate, nondiscursive, and yet also (b) intellectual or reason-governed … [It] depends upon nothing beyond an understanding of the propositional content itself… . (p. 102)

Similar views are expressed in Bealer (1987) and Katz (1998, pp. 44-5) (although Katz could be interpreted as sometimes adopting the more sophisticated strategy of §4.3 below). In a psychologically less ambitious vein, Peacocke (1992) appeals to inferences that a person finds “primitively compelling,” or compelling not by reason of some inference, or in a way that takes “their correctness…as answerable to anything else” (p. 6).

The Quinian reply to this sort of appeal is pretty straightforward, and, in a way, expresses what many regard as the real heart of his challenge to all proponents of the analytic: how in the end are we to distinguish such claims of “rational insight” from merely some deeply help empirical conviction or, indeed, from mere dogmatism? Isn't the history of thought littered with what have turned out to be deeply mistaken claims that people at the time have found “rationally” and/or “primitively” compelling, say, with regard to God, sin, biology, sexuality, or even patterns of reasoning themselves (consider the resistance people display to correction of the fallacies that Kahneman, Slovic and Tversky (1982) show they commit in a surprising range of ordinary thought, or, in a more disturbing vein, how the mathmatician, John Nash, claimed that his delusional ideas “about supernatural beings came to [him] the same way that [his] mathematical ideas did” (Nasar:11). Primitive compulsions or other introspective phenomena alone are not going to suffice to distinguish the analytic (which is not to say they mightn't provide useful evidence of it).

A particularly vivid way to feel the force of Quine's challenge is afforded by a recent case that came before the Ontario Supreme Court concerning whether laws that confined marriage to heterosexual couples violated the equal protection clause of the constitution (see Halpern et al 2001). The question was regarded as turning in part on the meaning of the word ‘marriage’, and each party to the dispute solicited affidavits from philosophers, one of whom claimed that there was a sense of the the word that was analytically tied to heterosexuality, the other that there wasn't. Putting aside the complex socio-political issues, Quine's challenge can be regarded as a reasonably sceptical request to know precisely what the argument is about, and how on earth any serious theory of the world might settle it. It certainly wouldn't seem to be any help to hear philosophers simply claim that they know marriage is/isn't necessarily heterosexual on the basis of ‘an act of rational insight [into] the propositional content itself,’ or because they found the inference from marriage to heterosexuality ‘primitively compelling’!

4.2 Externalist Theories of Meaning

Externalist theories try to meet at least part of Quine's challenge by considering how matters of meaning need not rely on connections among thoughts or beliefs, in the way that the tradition had encouraged philosophers to suppose, but as involving much more importantly relations between words and the phenomena in the world that they pick out. This suggestion gradually emerged in the work of Putnam (1962/75, 1965/75 and 1975), Saul Kripke (1972/80) and Tyler Burge (1979, 1986)), but it takes the form of positive theories in, e.g., the work of Fred Dretske (1981, 1988) and Jerry Fodor (1987, 1990b, 1992), who base meaning in various forms of natural co-variation between states of the mind/brain and external phenomena (see indicator semantics); and in the work of Ruth Millikan (1984), David Papineau (1987) and Karen Neander (1995), who look to mechanisms of natural selection (see teleosemantics). Insofar as these theories were to succeed in providing a genuine explanation of intentionality (a success that is by no means undisputed), they would go some way towards saving at least intentional psychology from Quine's challenge.

However, although these strategies may well save intentionality and meaning, they do so only by forsaking the high hopes we noted §2 philosophers had for the analytic. For externalists are typically committed to counting expressions as “synonymous” if they happen to be linked in the right way to the same external phenomena, even if a thinker didn't realize that they are! Consequently, by at least the Fregean criterion, they would seem to be committed to counting as analytic such many patently empirical sentences as “Water is H2O,” “Salt is NaCl” or “Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens,” since in each of these cases, something co-varies with one side of the identity if and only if it co-varies with the other (similar problems arise for teleosemantics). But this might not faze an externalist, who is concerned only to save intentional psychology, and might otherwise share Quine's scepticism about philosophers' appeals to the analytic and a priori.

On the other hand, an externalist could allow that some analytic truths, e.g., “water is H20,” are in fact “external” and subject to empirical confirmation and disconfirmtion. Although such a view would fly in the face of the modern tradition that presumed the analytic was a priori, it could comport well with an older philosophical tradition less interested in the meanings of our words and concepts, and more interested in the “essences” of various phenomena, or the conditions by virtue of which a phenomenon (a thing, substance, process) is the phenomenon it is. Locke (II, 31, vi), indeed, posited “real essences” of things rather along the lines suggested by Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1972/80), the real essences being the conditions in the world independent of our thought that make something the thing it is. It is, arguably, just such real essences that are what actually interest philosophers when they are engaged in what they may misleadingly call “conceptual analysis”: being H20 would seem to be precisely what makes something water; or, to take the striking examples of diseases noted by Putnam (1962), an empirical answer would be precisely what is wanted in answer to the question “what is it by virtue of which something is a case of multiple sclerosis?” (see Rey (1983/99) for further discussion, and Bealer (1987) for an assimilation of apparently empirical cases to nevertheless a priori definition).

4.3 Chomskyan Strategies in Linguistics

Chomskyan responses to Quine are particularly trenchant because they can be regarded as defending the original intuitive idea of the analytic, but within Quine's naturalistic and at least methodologically empiricist framework. Their significant point of departure is Chomsky's own devastating (1959) critique of Skinner's (1957) attempt to provide the kind of behaviorist theory of language on which Quine's (1960) account explicitly relied. The critique largely consists in showing ways in which such a behaviorist account is egregiously inadequate as an explanation of actual linguistic data.

The data that concern Chomsky, himself, has largely been syntactic properties of natural language, although often broadly construed to include at least some “analytic” examples. Katz (1972) (in arguments that can be regarded as independent of the appeals to intuition we considered in §4.1) draws attention to related semantic data, such as subjects' agreements about, e.g., synonymy, redundancy, antonomy, and implication, as well as to what he believes are the serious prospects of systematically relating syntactic and semantic structure. In the light of such data, Quine's explanation of the apparent analytic in terms merely of the centrality of the sentences in people's thought is simply empirically inadequate: there is nothing articularly “central” to our thought about claims of synonymy, redundancy, and the like, or, really, about any of set II, many of which seem precisely as “trifling” as Locke claimed. Furthermore, Putnam's (1965/75) and Fodor's (1998) added clause about “one-criterion” words would seem to presuppose and so can't explain the (apparent) analytic. There are many tests for being a bachelor — observation of someone's habits might suffice. What picks out the “unmarried male” test is simply the fact that that's precisely what the word means!

It might be thought that appeals to such data beg the question against Quine, since (as Quine (1967) points out) so much as asking subjects to say whether two expressions are synonymous, antonomous, or implicative is simply transferring the burden of determining what is being discussed from the theorist to the informant. Imagine, again, a person being asked whether marriage entails heterosexuality as a matter of the meaning of the word. One can sympathize with someone being at a loss as to what to say. In any case, what is the possible significance of people's answers? The same Quinean question can be raised here as before: How do we distinguish a genuine analytic report from merely an expression of firmly held belief?

The Chomskyan actually has the seed of an interesting reply. For part of Chomsky's view has to do with the modularity of the natural language faculty: whether a sentence is grammatical or not depends not on its relation to our thought and communicative projects, but rather on its conformity with the internal principles of that specific faculty. It is easy for us to produce strings of words that may communicate information effectively, but which may violate those principles. An ungrammatical sentence like “Bill is the man I wanna take a walk” might suffice on occasion for thought and communication (of “Bill is the man who I want to take a walk,”) but it's simply an interesting and indeed striking fact that speakers of English — even four-year old ones! — nevertheless find it problematic (see Crain and Lillo-Martin 1999). The existence of the language faculty as a separate faculty may simply be an odd, but psychologically real fact about us, and, with it, there may come not only commitments about what is or isn't grammatical, but about what is or isn't a matter of natural language meaning. On this view, if one were to deny an analytic truth, one would simply be violating a principle of language; or, as Chomsky has sometimes put it, “one wouldn't be speaking a natural language”, which, on his view, it's perfectly possible to do: scientists do it all the time with their introduction of technical ways of talking, as in the case of “Water is H2O” (which Chomskyans claim is not a sentence in natural language!).

The burden of this reply lies, however, in actually producing a linguistic theory that sustains a principled class of sentences that could seriously be regarded as analytic in this way. This, as yet, it is by no means obvious that it can do. Some of its most prized examples, such as (10) in set II, linking killing to death, have been contested on linguistic grounds (see Fodor (1970, 1998), but also Pietroski (2002) for a recent, technical reply). And many linguists (e.g., Jackendoff (1992), Pustejovsky (1995)) proceed somewhat insouciantly to include under issues of “meaning” and “conceptual structure” issues that are patently matters merely of ordinary belief or even merely phenomenology. For example, Jackendoff and others have called attention to the heavy use of spatial metaphors in many grammatical constructions; but, of course, from such facts it doesn't begin to follow that the many domains to which these metaphors are extended, say, the structure of the mind, social relations, or mathematics are, themselves, somehow intrinsically spatial.

Note that, while Chomskyans may be as methdologically empiricist as any scientists ought to be, they emphatically reject empiricist conceptions of meaning and mind themselves. Chomsky himself explicitly resuscitated Rationalist doctrines of “innate ideas,” according to which many ideas have their origins not in experience, but in our innate endowment. And there's certainly no commitment in semantic programs like those of Katz or Jackendoff to anything like the "reduction" of all concepts to the sensorimotor primitives eyed by the Positivists. (Of course, just how we come by the meaning of whatever primitive concepts their theories do endorse is a question they would seriously have to confront, cf. Fodor (1990, 1998).)

5. Conclusion

Suppose linguistics were to succeed in delineating a class of analytic sentences that included many of the examples philosophers have discussed, perhaps even the claims of logic and mathematics. Would that provide the basis for a priori knowledge of claims in these areas that philosophers have sought?

Yes and no. It would certainly appear to provide us with an insight into the concepts we ordinarily deploy when we are speaking natural language. This may not be uninteresting, since many of the crucial questions that philosophers ask concern the proper understanding of ordinary notions such as material object, event, person, action, freedom, coercion, whose meaning may well be illuminated by a semantic theory of natural language. But many philosophers want more. They'd like to know not merely about the concepts we deploy, which may or may not correspond to real phenomena in the world, but about the real phenomena in the world themselves.

For example, philosophers have wanted to claim not merely that our concepts of red and green exclude the possibility of our thinking something is both colors all over, but that this possibility is ruled out for the actual colors, red and green, themselves. It is therefore no accident that Bonjour's (1998:184-5) defense of a priori knowledge turns on including the very properties of red and green themselves as constitutents of the analytic propositions we grasp. But it is just such a wonderful coincidence between merely our concepts and actual worldly properties that a linguistic semantics alone is not likely to insure.

Or consider a different kind of example: it has been argued (e.g. by Ziff (1959), that it's analytic that a thinking thing must be alive. Suppose this claim were sustained by a Chomskyan theory, showing that the ordinary notion expressed by ‘thinking’ is, indeed, correctly applied only to living things, and not to artifactual computers. Should this really satisfy the person worried about the possibility of artificial thought? It's hard to see why. For the serious question that concerns people worried about whether artifacts could think concerns whether those artifacts could in fact share the real, theoretically interesting, explanatory properties of being a thinking thing. We may well have no reason to suppose that being alive actually figures among these. Again, the theoretically interesting properties of the world need not coincide with the properties that might be picked out by links in ordinary thought or items in our language faculty. Many of our ordinary concepts might turn out to be like that of witch: although people can be taken to be referring to genuine things (e.g. unusual women) in their use of this concept, the concept itself may misconstrue those things (e.g. as friends of the Devil).

It would seem, then, that the hope to account for our a priori knowledge of any part of the external world, including logic and mathematics, is not likely to be secured by a Chomskyan account of the analytic (Chomsky, himself, makes no claim that it does). Perhaps there is some other account, that both meets Quine's challenge and provides a reason for thinking that analytic claims provide some insight into external reality. But, after a century of efforts to find one, many philosophers remain skeptical.


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a priori justification and knowledge | behaviorism | Carnap, Rudolf | definition | epistemology | Frege, Gottlob | Kant, Immanuel | logical constants | logical positivism | logical truth | logicism | meaning | metaphysics | naturalism | operationalism | paradox: of analysis | phenomenology | Quine, Willard van Orman | rationalism vs. empiricism | Russell, Bertrand | verificationism