Tommy Lee Lott
Curriculum Vitae


Department of Philosophy
San Jose State University
One Washington Square
San Jose, CA 95192-0096
Tel: (408) 924-4525 or 4468
Fax: (408) 924-4527


Ph.D., Philosophy, University of California at Los Angeles, 1980.

M.A., Philosophy, University of California at Los Angeles, 1972.

B.A., Philosophy, California State University Los Angeles, 1968.

Dissertation: Anscombe's Notion of Knowledge without Observation.

Areas of Specialization

African American Philosophy, Modern Philosophy, Social and Political Philosophy, Race and Cultural Studies.

Administrative Experience

Director, Law and Justice Program, University of Massachusetts/Boston, 1988-89.

Founding Director: William Joiner Center for the Study of War and Its Social Consequences, University of Massachusetts/Boston, 1982-84.

Chair: American Philosophical Association Committee on the Status of Blacks in the Profession, 1993-96.

Teaching Experience

Professor: Philosophy, San Jose State University, 1991-present.

Visiting Professor: African-American Studies, University of California, Berkeley, Fall, 2000.

Visiting Professor: Philosophy, University of Missouri-St. Louis, 1996-98.

Visiting Scholar/Associate Professor: Philosophy, Stanford University,1989-91.

Visiting Assistant Professor: African American Studies, Northeastern University, Boston, MA, 1985-86.

Assistant/Associate Professor: Philosophy, University of Massachusetts/Boston,1980-90.

Lecturer (part-time): Philosophy, California State University Los Angeles, 1971-1980.

Courses Taught (a selection)

Philosophy of Law

Early Modern Philosophy

Social Justice: Gender, Race and Class

African-American Social and Political Philosophy

Philosophical Themes in Independent Black Cinema

Alain Locke and the Harlem Renaissance (graduate seminar)

The Philosophy of W.E.B. Du Bois (graduate seminar)

Race and Panethnic Identity (graduate seminar)

Berkeley's Theory of Vision (graduate seminar)

Hobbes's Science of Politics (graduate seminar)


The Invention of Race: Black Culture and the Politics of Representation (Blackwell, 1999).

Editor, Subjugation and Bondage: Critical Essays on Slavery and Social Philosophy (Rowman & Littlefield, 1998).

Editor, African-American Philosophy: Selected Readings (Prentice-Hall, 2002).

Co-editor with Robert Bernasconi, The Idea of Race (Hackett, 2000).

Co-editor with Julie K. Ward, Philosophers on Race: Critical Essays (Blackwell , 2002).

Co-editor with John Pittman, A Companion to African-American Philosophy (Blackwell, 2003).

Guest editor

Special Issue: Race and Social Theory, Nineteenth-Century Contexts 22.2 (Spring 2000).


"African Retentions" in Tommy L. Lott and John P. Pittman, eds., A Companion to African-American Philosophy (Blackwell, 2003), 168-89.

"Alain Leroy Locke: African American Cultural Historian" in Chris Murray, ed., Key Writers on Art: The Twentieth Century (Routledge, 2002), pp. 192-99.

"Patriarchy and Slavery in Hobbes's Political Philosophy" in Julie K. Ward and Tommy L. Lott, eds., Philosophers on Race: Critical Essays (Blackwell, 2002), 63-80.

"The 1960s Avant-Garde Movement in Jazz" Social Identities 7.2 (Spring 2001): 165-177.

"Du Bois's Anthropological Notion of Race" in Robert Bernasconi, ed. Race (Blackwell, 2001), 59-83.

"Du Bois and Locke on the Scientific Study of the Negro" Special Issue, Sociology Hesitant: Thinking with Du Bois, boundary 2 27.3 (Fall 2000): 135-152.

"Kara Walker Speaks: A Public Conversation on Racism, Art, and Politics" in Black Renaissance Noire 3.1 (Fall 2000): 69-91.

"Documenting Social Issues: Black Journal 1968-70" in Janet Cutler and Phyllis R. Klotman, eds., Struggles for Representation: African American Documentary, Film and Video (Indiana University Press, 1999), 71-98.

"Alain LeRoy Locke," in Michael P. Kelly, ed., Encyclopedia of Aesthetics (Oxford University Press, 1998), 160-5.

"Frederick Douglass on the Myth of the Black Rapist," in Frank Kirkland and Bill Lawson, eds., The Moral and Political Philosophy of Frederick Douglass (Blackwell, 1998), 313-38.

"Early Enlightenment Conceptions of the Rights of Slaves," in Tommy L. Lott, ed., Subjugation and Bondage (Rowman & Littlefield, 1998), 99-129.

"Hollywood  and Independent Black Cinema," in Steve Neale and Murray Smith, eds., Contemporary Hollywood Cinema (Routledge, 1998), 211-28.

"Black Consciousness in the Art of Sargent Johnson," in James Brook, Chris Carlsson and Nancy J. Peters, eds., Reclaiming San Francisco: History, Culture, Politics (City Lights, 1998), 183-98.

"Aesthetics and Politics in Contemporary Black Film Theory," in Richard Allen and Murray Smith, eds., Philosophy and Film Theory (Oxford University Press, 1997), 287-302.

"Lichtman on Compensatory Justice," Radical Philosophy Review, 13 (Spring1996): 41-8.

" Racist Discourse and the Negro-Ape Metaphor," Next of Kin: Looking at the Great Apes, MIT List Visual Arts Center Catalog (Fall 1995), 37-43.

"Black Marxist in Babylon: Bayard Rustin and the 1968 UFT Strike" Educational Foundations, 8 (Winter 1994): 29-41.

"Nationalism and Pluralism in Alain Locke's Social Philosophy," in Laurence Foster and Patricia Herzog, eds., Defending Diversity (University of Massachusetts Press, 1994), 103-19.

"Black Vernacular Representation and Cultural Malpractice," in David T. Goldberg, ed., Multiculturalism: A Critical Reader (Blackwell, 1994), 230-58.

"Slavery, Modernity and the Reclamation of Anterior Cultures," Found Object, 4 (Fall 1994): 36-45.

"Black Cultural Politics: An Interview with Paul Gilroy," Found Object, 4 (Fall 1994): 46-81.

"Du Bois on the Invention of Race," The Philosophical Forum, 24.1-2 (Fall-Spring 1992-93):166-87.

"Alice Coltrane" in Darlene Clark Hine, ed., Black Women in the United States: An Historical Encyclopedia (Carlson Publishing,1992), 365-66.

Reprinted in Darlene Clark Hine, ed., The Facts on File Resource Collection on American Black Women (Carlson Publishing, 1995).

"Hobbes's Right of Nature," History of Philosophy Quarterly, 9 (April 1992):159-80.

"Marooned in America:  Black Urban Youth Culture and Social Pathology" in Bill E. Lawson, ed., The Underclass Question (Temple University Press, 1992), 71-89.

"A No-theory Theory of Contemporary Black Cinema," Black American Literature Forum, 25 (Summer 1991): 221-36.

"Anscombe on Justifying Claims to Know One's Bodily Position," Philosophical Investigations, 12.4 (October 1989): 293-307.

"Hobbes on International Relations," in M. Bertman and T. Airaksinen, eds., Hobbes:War Among Nations (Gower Press, 1988), 91-98.

"Descartes on Phantom Limbs," Mind & Language,1.3 (Autumn 1986): 251-79.

"Hobbes's Mechanistic Psychology," in J.G. van der Bend, ed., Thomas Hobbes:  His View of Man (Rodopi, 1982): 63-75.

"The psychology of self-preservation in Hobbes," Revue europŽenne des sciences sociales, 20.61 (1982): 37-55.

Book Reviews

Paul Taylor, Race: A Philosophical Introduction (Polity Press, 2003) in Choice, (February, 2004).

Clarence Shole Johnson, Cornel West and Philosophy: The Quest for Social Justice (Routledge, 2003) in Choice 41.2 (October, 2003).

Ross Harrison, Hobbes, Locke, and Confusion's Masterpiece (Cambridge University Press, 2003) in Choice, 41.1 (September, 2003).

Robert E. Birt, ed., The Quest for Community and Identity: Critical Essays in Africana Social Philosophy (Rowman & Littlefield, 2002) in Choice 39 (Sept. 2002).

Andrew Levine, Engaging Political Philosophy: From Hobbes to Rawls (Blackwell, 2002) in Choice 39.10 (June 2002).

Jacob U. Gordon, Black Leadership For Social Change (Greenwood, 2000) in Choice 38.8 (April, 2001).

Phil Zuckerman, ed., Du Bois On Religion (AltaMira 2000) in Choice 38.10 (June, 2001).

Ivan Karp and D.A. Masolo, eds., African Philosophy As Cultural Inquiry (Indiana, 2000) in Choice 39.3 (November, 2001).

Paget Henry, Caliban's Reason (Routledge 2000) in Choice 38.4 (December, 2000).

20th World Congress of Philosophy: Paideia Project On-line. in Choice 37 Supplement (2000).

Charles W. Mills, Blackness Visible: Essays On Philosophy and Race (Cornell 1998) in Choice 36.10 (June, 1999).

P. H. Coetzee and A. P. J. Roux, eds., The African Philosophy Reader (Routledge, 1998) in Choice 37.1 (September, 1999).

Samuel O. Imbo, An Introduction To African Philosophy (Rowman & Littlefield, 1998) in Choice 36.6 (February, 1999).

Richard Dyer, White (Routledge, 1997) in Journal of Communication (Spring, 1998): 188-91.

Kwame Gyekye, Tradition and Modernity: Philosophical Reflections on the African Experience (Oxford, 1997) in Choice, 36.1 (September, 1998).

Charles W. Mills, The Racial Contract (Cornell, 1997) in Choice 35.7 (March, 1998).

Greg Moses, Revolution of Conscience: Martin Luther King, Jr., and the Philosophy of Nonviolence (Guilford, 1997) in Choice 34.11/12 (July-August, 1997).

Paulin J. Hountondji, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, trans Henri Evans with Jonathan Ree, 2d ed. (Indiana, 1996) in Choice 34 (September, 1997).

Herman Gray,Watching Race (Minnesota, 1996) in Social Identities, 2.3 (Fall, 1996): 469-79.

Kwame Gyekye, An Essay on African Philosophical Thought: The Akan Conceptual Scheme, Revised Edition, (Temple, 1995) in Choice  34.1 (September, 1996).

Mark A. Reid, Redefining Black Film (University of California Press, 1993) in African American Review 29 (Spring, 1995):139-43.

Paul Gilroy, The Black Atlantic: Modernity and Double Consciousness (Harvard University Press, 1993) in Social Identities 1.1 (Spring, 1995): 200-20.

Lewis R. Gordon, Bad Faith and Antiblack Racism (Humanities Press, 1995) in Choice 33.1 (September, 1995).

Johnny Washington, A Journey into the Philosophy of Alain Locke (Greenwood Press, 1994) in American Studies 36 (Fall, 1995).

C. Peter Ripley, ed.,Witness for Freedom: African American Voices on Race, Slavery and Emancipation (University of North Carolina Press, 1993) in Nineteenth-Century Contexts 18 (Spring, 1994): 105-6.

Ralph P. Forsberg, Thomas Hobbes' Theory of Obligation in History of European Ideas (Fall, 1992): 333-36.

Robert P. Kraynak, History and Modernity in the Thought of Thomas Hobbes in Ethics  102 (July, 1992): 882.

Deborah Baumgold, Hobbes's Political Theory and Gary B. Herbert, Thomas Hobbes: The Unity of Scientific and Moral Wisdom in Albion 22 (Fall, 1990): 492-95.

Forthcoming Works:

Like Rum in the Punch: Alain Locke and the Theory of African American Culture (Universitty of Massachusetts Press, 2004).

Co-Editor with David Goldberg, The Color Line: Du Bois, Race and Culture (Blackwell, 2004).

Co-Editor with David Goldberg and Laura Peters, Race/Racism: A Genealogical Reader (Blackwell, 2004).

Works in Progress:

"The Influence of Spencer's Social Darwinism on Du Bois's Concept of Race" in Penelope Deutscher's forthcoming anthology on evolutionary theory.

"Racial Pride and Panethnic Identity" in David Kim, ed., Passions and the Color Line.

By What Means Soever: Conquest and Voluntary Action in Hobbes's Political Theory.

Independent Black Cinema: Slow Fade to White.


"Cornel West and the Racial Mountain: Can Praxis and Scholarship be Balanced?" Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy, Boston, MA, November 8, 2003.

"Cosmopolitan and Diaspora Identity in the Films of Manthia Diawara and Joe Brewster" Black American Cinema Re-considered: The Contemporary Scene, New York University, NY, November 7, 2003.

"How to Socially Construct a Black ÔModel Minority'" Afro-Asian Politics: Converging Histories and Current Prospects, University of San Francisco, San Francisco, CA, March 8, 2003.

"The Influence of Social Darwinism on Du Bois's Concept of Race" Kaplan Center for the Humanities Lecture Series Gender, Evolution and the Transhuman, Northwestern University, Evanston, Il, March 3, 2003.

"Can racial identity be transcended?" Keynote Speaker, Symposium: The Ideology of Race, Department of Black Studies, San Francisco State University, San Francisco, CA, December 3, 2002.

"The Construction of Race: Fantasies about the Body" The American Dilemma Revisited: Psychoanalysis, Social Policy, and the Socio-Cultural Meaning of Race, New York University, NY, November 1, 2002.

"The Politics of Panethnic Identities" Department of Philosophy, Penn State University, University Park, PA, February 22, 2002.

"Latino Panethnic Identity"Passions of the Color Line Conference, University of San Francisco, March 3, 2001.

"Asian-American Panethnic Identity," American Philosophical Association, Pacific Meeting, San Francisco, CA, March 29, 2001.

"Alain Locke's Oxford Dissertation on Value," American Philosophical Association, Pacific Meeting, San Francisco, CA, March 31, 2001.

"The Legacy of W.E.B. Du Bois Today," The Niebyl-Proctor Marxist Library, Oakland, CA, July 22, 2001.

"Patriarchy and Slavery in Hobbes's Political Philosophy," Rutgers University Summer Institute for Minority Undergrates, New Brunswick, NJ, July 20, 2001.

"Patriarchy and Racism," African American Studies Department, University of California, Berkeley, October 9, 2000.

"The Philosophical Significance of the Writings of Hortense Spillers," A "National Treasury of Rhetorical Wealth": A Symposium on the Work of Hortense Spillers, Center for the Study of Black Literature and Culture, University of Pennsylvania, January 28, 2000.

"Du Bois's Anthropological Notion of Race," African-American Studies, University of California, Irvine, California, January 15, 2000.

Conversation with Kara Walker, Dialogue on Art Series, UCLA Hammer Museum, Los Angeles, California, December 9, 1999.

"Alain Locke's Theory of African-American Culture," Temple University, Philadelphia, PA, April 18, 1999.

"Moral Implications of the Distinction between Slavery and Servitude," Conference: Association for Practical and Professional Ethics, Washington, D. C., February 26, 1999.

"Hobbes's Theory of Voluntary Motion," 20th World Congress of Philosopy, Boston, MA, August 11, 1998.

"Patriarchy and Racism," Department of Philosophy, University of California, San Diego, San Diego , CA, June 5, 1998.

"Frederick Douglass on the Myth of the Black Rapist," Conference: Race, Gender, and Community: Remapping Rights in Civil Society, San Francisco State University, San Francisco, CA, March 30, 1998.

"Inventing a Black Visual Aesthetic: Alain Locke's Influence on Sargent Johnson's Art," Symposium: Sargent Johnson and Modernism, San Francisco Museum of Modern Art, San Francisco, CA, March 28, 1998.

"Hobbes and Locke on Race," Symposium: Traditional Philosophers on Race and Difference, APA Pacific Division Meeting, Los Angeles, CA, March 26, 1998.

"Representing George Jackson," Conference: Unfinished Liberation, Arizona State University, Tempe, AZ, March 7, 1998.

"Alain Locke's Negritude," Conference:Philosophy Born of Struggle IV, New School for Social Research, New York City, October 17, 1997.

"Hip-Hop,  Rap, and Cultural Values," Delaware Humanities Forum, Christina Cultural Arts Center, Wilmington, Delaware, June 4, 1997.

"Documenting Social Issues: Black Journal, 1968-70," Department of Cinema Studies, New York University, New York City,  May 5, 1997.

"Ebonics and Rap Music," Conference on Entertaining Stereotypes," Arizona State University, Tempe, AZ, April 11, 1997.

"Race, Class and Poverty: Social Policy and the University," Oregon State University, Corvallis, Oregon, October 31, 1996.

"The Concept of Modernity in Alain Locke's Social Philosophy," Conference:The Harlem Renaissance and the Black Enlightenment, Rockland Community College, Suffern, NY, October 18, 1996.

"Alain Locke's Theory of Race and Culture," Humanities Center, University of Memphis, Memphis, TN., October 20, 1995.

"Alain Locke's Theory of African-American Art," Humanities Center, University of Missouri, St. Louis, MO, October 17, 1995.

"Hobbes's Theory of Voluntary Motion," Philosophy Department, Stanford University, Palo Alto, CA, June 2, 1995 and Philosophy Department, University of Missouri, October 18, 1995.

"Lichtman on Compensatory Justice," APA Pacific Division Meeting, San Francisco, CA, March 31, 1995.

"An Unorthodox Look at the Dynamics of Race, Sex and Gender," APA Pacific Division Meeting, San Francisco, CA, March 31, 1995.

"Douglass on the Myth of the Black Rapist," Symposium: The Moral Philosophy of Frederick Douglass, APA Eastern Division Meeting, Boston, MA, December 27, 1994 and John F. Kennedy University, Orinda, CA, November 4, 1994.

"Alain Locke's Critique of Minstrelsy," New York Society for the Study of Africana Philosophy, March 27, 1994, New York City.

"Nihilism and Social Responsibility in Gangsta Rap," Black History Month, East Bay Conservation Corps, Feburary 18, 1994, Oakland, CA.

"Alain Locke on Aesthetics and Music,"7th International Conference on Popular Music, University of the Pacific, Stockton, CA, July 12, 1993.

"Spike Lee's Malcolm X and Black Urban Youth Culture," Fall Seminar Series, African and African-American Studies Program, Stanford University, December 2, 1992.

"Black Vernacular Representation and Cultural Malpractice," St. Clair Drake Graduate Cultural Studies Forum, Department of African-American Studies, University of California, Berkeley, October 1, 1992.

"Media Images of Black Urban Riots and the Legacy of Slave Revolts," 2nd World Congress on Violence and Human Coexistence, UniversitŽ de Montreal, Montreal, Quebec, Canada, July 17, 1992.

"Aesthetics and African-American Cultural Resistance," American Society for Aesthetics, Pacific Division Meeting, Pacific Grove, CA, April 8,1992.

"Mass Media and African American Cultural Resistance," School of Social Justice, Arizona State University, Tempe, AZ, October 21, 1991.

"Mass Media, Power, and African American Cultural Resistance," Conference: Knowledge and Power: Colonial and Post-Colonial Contexts, Oxford Centre for African Studies, Oxford, England, June 30, 1991.

"Enlightenment Conceptions of the Rights of Slaves: Hobbes, Locke, and Equiano," Symposium: Race and Ethnicity, APA Pacific Division Meeting, San Francisco, CA, March 29, 1991.

"A No-theory Theory of Contemporary Black Cinema," African American Film and Media Culture: A Re-examination, Whitney Museum, New York City, June 19, 1990.

"Black Urban Youth Culture," College of Urban, Labor, and Metropolitan Affairs, Wayne State University, Detroit, Michigan, April 17, 1990.

"Du Bois on the Invention of Race," Department of Philosophy, Howard University, Washington, D.C., April 16, 1990.

"Aesthetics and Contemporary Black Cinema," Humanities Center, Stanford University, Palo Alto, CA, April 3, 1990.

International Symposia

History of Modern Philosophy: Berkeley and Hume, 18th World Congress of Philosophy, Brighton, England, August 21-27, 1988; presented paper on "Berkeley's Theory of Visual Depth Perception."

The Possibility of Justifying World Government on Hobbesian Principles, University of Helsinki, Finland, May 4-7, 1987; presented paper on "Hobbes's Right of Nature."

La rŽfŽrence Hobbienne du XVIIeme sicle a nos jours: paralleles et confrontation, UniversitŽ de Strasbourg, Strasbourg, France, October 15-17, 1981; presented paper on "The psychology of self-preservation in Hobbes."

Thomas Hobbes, Anthropological Aspects of His Thought, Stichting International School voor Wijsbegeerte, Leusden, The Netherlands, September 17-21, 1979; presented paper on "Hobbes's Mechanistic Psychology."


Panel on John Locke's Theory of Property, American Philosophical Association, Pacific Division Meeting, San Francisco, Spring 2003.

Panel on Hobbes's Political Theory, American Philosophical Association, Pacific Division Meeting, San Francisco, Spring 2003.

Panel on Affirmative Action with John Perry and Kenneth Taylor, Philosophy Department, Stanford University, Palo Alto, CA, June 5, 2002.

Paul Taylor and Charles Mills, Author Meets Critics: Tommy L. Lott, The Invention of Race, American Philosophical Association, Central Division Meeting, Chicago, April 25, 2002.

Jorge Garcia, "Racial and Ethnic Identity: Some Problems" Conference on Passions of the Color Line: Emotion and Power in Racial Construction, University of San Francisco, March 3, 2001.

"Gender and Race in Recent Social Theory" Round Table, 20th World Congress of Philosophy, Boston, MA, August 12, 1998.

Panel on Music and Culture in the African Diaspora, APA Pacific Division Meeting, Berkeley, CA, March 28, 1997.

Panel on African-American Music, Radical Philosophy Association Conference, Purdue University, West Lafayette, Indiana, November 16, 1996.

Panel on Black Documentary Film, Project Black Cinema 5th Annual International Film Festival, Sarasota, Florida, September 20-26, 1996.

"Conversation on Race, Religion and Democracy," APA Committee on Blacks and The Racial Justice Initiative of Riverside Church, Riverside Church, New York City, December 28, 1995. C-SPAN broadcast, January 15, 1996.

Panel on Black Film Aesthetics, Pan-African Cinema Conference, Tish School of the Arts, New York University, March 28, 1994.

Fellowships and Grants

NEH Summer Seminar: Intention, Michael Bratman, Director, Stanford University, Palo Alto, California, June 21-July 31, 1993.

Ford Postdoctoral Fellowship for Minorities.

To work with John Perry on a project in modern philosophy, Stanford University, 1988-89.

Joseph P. Healey Grant, University of Massachusetts/Boston, 1985. To study at the Hobbes archives in Chatsworth, England.

Ford Foundation Fellowship, University of California at Los Angeles,1975-76. To write dissertation.


President's Scholar, San Jose State University, 1999.

African-American Students Outstanding Black Faculty Award, Northeastern University, 1985.

Black Faculty, Outstanding Achievement Award, University of Massachusetts/Boston, 1984.

Rudolph Carnap Essay Award, "Berkeley's Theory of Visual Depth Perception," Department of Philosophy, University of California, Los Angeles, 1973.