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‘Self-knowledge’ is commonly used in philosophy to refer to knowledge of one's particular mental states, including one's beliefs, desires, and sensations. It is also sometimes used to refer to knowledge about a persisting self -- its ontological nature, identity conditions, or character traits. At least since Descartes, most philosophers have believed that self-knowledge is importantly different from knowledge of the world external to oneself, including others' thoughts. But there is little agreement about what precisely distinguishes self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms. Partially because of this disagreement, philosophers have endorsed competing accounts of how we acquire self-knowledge. These accounts have important consequences for the scope of mental content, for mental ontology, and for personal identity.

This entry will focus on the first sort of self-knowledge, knowledge of one's own particular mental states; but I will also touch on some central debates about knowledge of a persisting self. I begin by surveying the leading candidates for the distinctive feature of self-knowledge (Section 1); I then outline the most influential accounts of self-knowledge (Section 2). Section 3 takes up knowledge of the self. Sections 4 and 5 briefly describe two special topics in the philosophy of self-knowledge, respectively: the problem of self-deception, and the consequences of epistemically distinctive self-knowledge for the doctrine of content externalism.

1. The Distinctiveness of Self-Knowledge

What is special about self-knowledge, compared to knowledge in other domains? There are three leading views:
  1. Knowledge of one's own mental states is especially secure, epistemically.
  2. One uses a unique method to determine one's own mental states.
  3. One's pronouncements about one's own states bear a special authority or presumption of truth.

The differences between these are subtle. Position (1) identifies the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as the epistemic status of a certain class of beliefs, whereas position (2) identifies it by the method one uses in forming these beliefs. Position (3) rejects these first-person characterizations, focusing instead on the way self-attributions are treated by others. Views which maintain that ‘privileged access’ captures what is special about self-knowledge fall within (1) and (2). The looseness with which this term is employed, and the ensuing possibilities for ambiguity, are illustrated by Alston (1971), who lists well over a dozen senses of ‘privileged access’. Those who take the subjects' special authority to be the distinctive feature of self-attributions deny that ‘privileged access’ captures what is special about self-attributions. I will summarize the major positions in each of these three categories (subsections 1.1-1.3), and I will explain why some have denied that self-knowledge is special in any of these ways (subsection 1.4).

1.1 Epistemic Security

The strongest epistemic claims on behalf of self-knowledge are infallibility and omniscience. If self-knowledge is infallible, one cannot have a false belief to the effect that one is in a certain mental state. One is omniscient about one's own states only if being in a mental state suffices for knowing that one is in that state. Few if any contemporary philosophers accept infallibility or omniscience in their unqualified forms. Here is a simple counter-example to the claim of infallibility. Kate trusts a friend's insights into her own psychology, and so she believes the friend when he tells her that she wants to live in the country. But the friend is mistaken -- Kate really wants an urban life, though she hasn't reflected on her desires enough to realize this. Hence, Kate has a false belief about her own desires. This case also undercuts the claim of omniscience: in the case described, Kate is unaware of her real desire, which is to live in the city.

Even if we are not strictly infallible about our states, there is a more plausible, qualified version of the infallibility claim. In the case described, Kate's belief about her desires is based on the testimony of another person. Relying on testimony is, of course, a way of gaining knowledge about all sorts of things, not only one's own mental states. As mentioned above, some philosophers believe that one has a special way of knowing about one's own states. (This is the second candidate for what is special about self-knowledge; particular accounts of this special access will be discussed in the following subsection.) If we limit the domain of beliefs to those which are formed by use of a method unique to self-knowledge, we can formulate a more plausible infallibility thesis, as follows. When one carefully, attentively employs the mode of knowing which is unique to self-knowledge, one will not form a false belief about one's own states. (Jackson 1973 defends a limited infallibility claim, regarding one's current phenomenal states. Descartes may have advocated a limited infallibility thesis as well.)

While this infallibility thesis seems preferable to the unrestricted version, it is still quite controversial. A common objection to a thesis of this sort is the claim, often attributed to Wittgenstein, that where one cannot be wrong, one cannot be right either. For instance, Wright claims that the possibility of error is required for concept application, which is in turn required for substantial self-knowledge.“[E]rror -- if only second-order error -- has to be possible, if a genuine exercise of concepts is involved” (Wright 1989, 634). Even if we reject this claim, it will be very difficult to explain how a method which is guaranteed to yield true beliefs is epistemically substantial enough to provide genuine knowledge, short of trivially specifying the method as that which is used when and only when self-knowledge occurs. Another objection to the infallibility thesis stems from Armstrong's (1963) claim that self-attributions are generally subject to correction by others.

The omniscience thesis may be qualified as well. For instance, one may claim (with Chisholm 1981) that a restricted class of states is such that anyone who is in a state in that class knows that she is. Alternatively, one may limit the omniscience thesis by claiming (with Peacocke 1992 and Siewert 1998) that some states automatically justify self-attributing beliefs about them, even if they don't automatically issue in self-attributions.

The infallibility and omniscience theses may be weakened further. It may be argued that, in certain normal circumstances, one will generally avoid false self-attributing beliefs, and will generally be aware of one's own mental states. These claims are obviously more modest, as regards the accuracy of self-attributing beliefs. Moreover, some deny that the source of one's general accuracy about one's own states is a conceptual or logical truth. E.g., Hill (1993) maintains that we are generally accurate about and aware of our own sensations, but only contingently so, because this accuracy derives from “certain facts about the relationships between human cognitive mechanisms” (130). Such claims are probably too weak to deserve the label ‘infallibility’ or ‘omniscience’. What they share with the original infallibility and omniscience theses is the notion that we are especially reliable detectors of our own states.

An alternative notion of epistemic security, one which is not directly linked with reliability, stems from an internalist construal of justification. Whereas the highest degree of epistemic security on the former model is perfect reliability, the highest degree of epistemic security on the internalist model is certainty. Corresponding to this alternative notion is the claim that the specialness of self-knowledge lies in this: one can, at times, be certain that one is in a particular mental state. The certainty may be absolute (Lewis 1946) or relative (Chisholm 1977). The difference between the reliability-based theses (infallibility and omniscience) and this justification-based thesis is that the former concern a person's general accuracy, whereas the latter applies to a single self-attributing belief. Claiming that self-attributing beliefs can achieve certainty is compatible with accepting that many or even most of our actual self-attributing beliefs are false, and that we are aware of few of our mental states.

It is certainty, rather than a general reliability, which is most salient in Descartes' famous use of introspection in the cogito argument. For Descartes' meditator, nothing -- not even an evil genius -- could undermine his evidence that he was thinking. (Of course, the capacity to be certain that one is thinking may imply a limited infallibility.) Some philosophers deny that absolute certainty is possible in any realm (Unger 1975); this denial is one source of objections to certainty-based views. Doubts about the existence of a special method for determining one's own states (Ryle 1949) constitute another source of objections to the certainty claim. For it is hard to see how to explain the purportedly unequalled certainty of some self-attributing beliefs without invoking a special epistemic method. Finally, as we will see in 1.4 below, some philosophers deny that self-attributions enjoy a special epistemic security.

1.2 Special Method

This brings us to the second candidate for what is special about self-knowledge, that it involves a special method of knowing. The term ‘introspection’ -- literally, ‘looking within’ -- captures a traditional way of conceiving how we grasp our own mental states. This term expresses, in spatial language, a divide between an ‘inner’ world and an ‘outer’ or ‘external’ world. For most philosophers, the spatial connotations of this language are purely metaphorical: to say that a state or entity is internal to the mind is not to say that it falls within a given spatial boundary. If the distinction between what is within the mind and what lies outside of it were purely spatial, the difference between introspection and normal visual perception (‘extrospection’) would be trivial, simply a matter of looking in different directions. The term ‘introspection’ is standardly used to denote a method of knowing which is unique to self-knowledge and which differs from perception in important ways. (As we will see in Section 2, however, some philosophers maintain that there are also important features which introspection and perception share.)

How, then, does introspection differ from other methods of knowledge? One standard answer to this question is that introspection, unlike most or all other methods of knowledge, gives one direct access to its objects, one's own mental states. There are two senses of directness that are relevant here. In the first, epistemic sense, the claim is that we can grasp our own mental states without inference; we need not rely on reasoning from observation. The second sense of directness is metaphysical: there is no state or object which mediates between my self-attributing belief (e.g., that I am now thinking that it will rain) and its object (my thought that it will rain). On most views, these senses of directness require that the self-attribution is contemporaneous with the state attributed; reliance on memory would constitute a failure of directness. (But see Burge 1993 for an argument to show that memory needn't always add an inferential step.)

These two senses of directness are closely related. It may be argued that if my access to my own mental states is epistemically direct, it must be metaphysically immediate as well. For anything which stood between my self-attributing belief and its object would, arguably, also constitute an epistemically mediating factor. For instance, Russell (1917) held that introspection is unique among epistemic methods in that it is the only process which yields non-inferential knowledge of contingent truths. He used the epistemic directness of introspective self-knowledge to argue that nothing metaphysical mediates between a subject and a mental state of which she is aware; in his terms, we stand in a relation of “acquaintance” to our own mental states.

The claim that introspective access is both epistemically and metaphysically direct is captured in the familiar view that, for mental states, an appearance and the reality which appears are numerically identical. This claim seems most plausible for the case of sensations. Here are a few representative statements of it.

Pain … is not picked out by one of its accidental properties; rather it is picked out by the property of being pain itself, by its immediate phenomenological quality. (Kripke 1980, 152-3)

[T]here is no appearance/reality distinction in the case of sensations. (Hill 1991, 127)

When introspecting our mental states, we do not take canonical evidence to be an intermediary between properties introspected and our own conception of them. We take evidence to be properties introspected. (Sturgeon 2000, 48)

What does epistemic directness imply about the epistemic status of self-knowledge? Clearly, it does not imply that we are either infallible or omniscient about our own states. Consistent with the epistemic directness claim, we may be fallible in that we may use methods other than introspection, as in the case of Kate; and we may simply fail to reflect on our current mental states, in which case we are not omniscient. But if introspection affords epistemically direct access to our own thoughts, then there appears to be no room for error, for there is no process of inference, etc., that could go wrong. One could argue, on this basis, that epistemic directness can provide for certainty.

While the term ‘introspection’ connotes a looking within, some philosophers have claimed that the method unique to self-knowledge requires precisely the opposite. On this view, we ascertain our own thoughts by looking without, to the states of the world they represent. For instance, in determining whether one believes it will rain this afternoon, one may look to the sky, to see whether dark clouds are gathering. This position was advanced by Wittgenstein (1953), and defended by Evans (1982). It is discussed in 2.3 below.

The “looking outward” claim has been criticized on the grounds that these cases are not ordinary instances of self-knowledge, for the thought that is self-attributed was not present prior to the question. Perhaps you hadn't formed a belief about the likelihood of rain until you were asked; the question is less a question about what one does believe than an invitation to form a belief. It is unsurprising that forming such a belief will involve considering evidence regarding the likelihood of rain.

In response, proponents of the “looking outward” view claim that this objection depends on a naïve picture of self-reflection. According to the naïve picture, mental states are stable particulars, awaiting discovery through introspection. (This is sometimes called the “act-object” conception of self-knowledge: introspection is a quasi-perceptual act of recognizing an independent object.) However, the response continues, mental states are in fact dynamically related to first-person reflection. One's own mental states are not static entities merely to be observed. Rather, insofar as one considers a mental state as one's own, in becoming aware of the state one subjects it to rational scrutiny. This line alleges that models of self-knowledge which treats what is special about self-knowledge as a purely epistemic matter are inadequate; for, as Moran (2001) puts it, these models overlook the fact that “self-consciousness has specific consequences for the object of consciousness” (28). For instance, awareness that one believes that p will, in a rational person, prompt the question whether p, and one's “p” belief will be influenced by one's evidence regarding p.

According to this rejection of the naïve picture, self-knowledge does not consist in simple observation of one's thoughts. If one simply reflects on the evidence regarding the state and does not evaluate its object (by considering the likelihood that it will rain, say), one may gain knowledge about states which are in fact one's own, but not knowledge about states conceived reflexively as one's own -- about states conceived as mine. What is special about the method of knowing one's own states, on this view, is its dynamic quality: specifically, self-attributed states are open to evaluation. (This view is examined in 2.5.)

1.3 First-Person Authority

The agency of the self-ascriber also plays an important role in the third construal of what is special about self-knowledge, that what is special about self-knowledge is that each of us is authoritative as to her own mental states. This means that, in ordinary conversational contexts, self-attributions enjoy a presumption of truth, and it is unreasonable or improper for others to gainsay them. First-person authority is built into our use of self-attributing statements like “I believe that it is raining”, so that one who responds, “no you don't”, under normal circumstances (where there is no obvious reason to think that the self-attributing person is insincere or insane), simply fails to understand how such statements operate. The point is not that each of us is in a privileged position to ascertain her own states; it is, rather, that an understanding of self-attributions is partially constituted by being disposed to defer to self-attributors.

Wright describes this view, which he attributes to Wittgenstein, as follows.

[T]he authority standardly granted to a subject's own beliefs, or expressed avowals, about his intentional states is a constitutive principle. (Wright 1989, 632)

In other words, what is special about self-attributions is that each of us is the default authority about her own mental states, in the sense that self-attributions are not -- except in extraordinary circumstances -- open to challenge by others. Default first-person authority is, on this view, not optional, since self-attributions' immunity to challenge partially constitutes the psychological concepts these attributions employ.

The default authority view does not require that self-attributions be epistemically grounded, for the fact that one is treated as an authority about one's own states does not show that one knows those states at all, let alone in any privileged way. But it does see self-attributions as statements which are exceptionally likely to be true. The fact that we defer to others regarding their own states thus cries out for explanation: what justifies the practice of treating others as default authorities on their own states, given that they are not in an epistemically privileged position to determine those states? Critics of this view, including Wright (1998), say that it fails to justify or even explain the practice of treating persons as default authorities, but is “a mere invitation to choose to treat as primitive something which we have run into trouble trying to explain” (45). In a similar vein, Moran (1997) charges that the default authority view can't capture the fact that self-knowledge is a “cognitive achievement”. Of course, if we find that no more substantive explanation will work, the strategy of treating our deferential practices as primitive may become more appealing.

The idea that each of us is ordinarily the authority on her own states appears compatible with the previous positions regarding self-knowledge's distinctive feature. For we may be the authority on our own states precisely because our beliefs about them are especially secure, epistemically, or because we enjoy a special, privileged mode of access to them. The current view makes a radical departure from these, by claiming that the specialness of self-attributions is not an epistemic factor at all, but a conceptual or pragmatic one. Strictly speaking, then, this third sort of position is not primarily concerned with what is special about self-knowledge, but is instead concerned with the distinctive feature of self-attributions.

There is another, more extreme view which also denies that utterances like “I am in pain” are epistemically special. On this expressivist view, which is sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein as well, such utterances are not genuine self-attributions at all. Rather, they are non-propositional expressions of mental states, on a par with winces and laughter. (Expressivism is discussed in 2.6 below.) Both of these views provide alternative, non-epistemic diagnoses of the apparent epistemic specialness of self-attributions.

1.4 No Specialness

Those discussed in the previous subsection reject the claim of epistemic privilege (described in 1.1 and 1.2), on the grounds that what is special about self-attributions is a non-epistemic factor. Others reject the claim of epistemic privilege on its own, without proposing an alternative diagnosis of the distinctiveness of self-knowledge. For these philosophers simply deny that self-knowledge is truly special. This subsection outlines the grounds for these denials.

The denial that self-knowledge is truly special was especially prevalent during the heyday of behaviorism. For instance, Ryle (1949) claims that the difference between self-knowledge and other-knowledge is at most a matter of degree, and stems from the mundane fact that each of us is always present to observe her own behavior. His chief criticism of traditional claims about self-knowledge targets the idea that self-knowledge involves a uniquely direct epistemic process. If self-knowledge were direct, he argues, then the higher-order mental state which constitutes immediate grasp of one's own mental state would have to be grasped as well. This would quickly lead to a regress, which could be blocked only by positing a state that somehow comprehends itself. But Ryle believes that this sort of reflexivity is impossible; and interestingly, skepticism about reflexive self-awareness was already present in James (1884).

Self-consciousness, if the word is to be used at all, must not be described on the hallowed paraoptical model, as a torch that illuminates itself by beams of its own light reflected from a mirror in its own insides. (Ryle 1949, 39)

No subjective state, whilst present, is its own object; its object is always something else. (James 1884, 2)

Ryle suggests an alternative, which does not involve any sort of second-order grasp of a first-order state: self-knowledge is simply a “standing condition or frame of mind”, in which one is “ready to perform” certain tasks, and thereby “alive to” what one is doing or thinking (Ryle 1949). This does not differentiate self-knowledge from other-knowledge, for one can be similarly “alive to” another's activities and thoughts.

Doubts about self-knowledge are also fueled by more general epistemological views, such as doubts about the possibility of theory-free observations. Dennett (1991) questions whether our self-attributions are due to anything like a direct grasp of our mental states, unsullied by independent theories about the mental. On Dennett's view, the assumption that mental states are inaccessible from the third-person perspective encourages ungrounded speculation about one's own states, for it means that self-attributions go unchecked.

I suspect that when we claim to be just using our powers of inner observation, we are always actually engaging in a sort of impromptu theorizing -- and we are remarkably gullible theorizers, precisely because there is so little to observe and so much to pontificate about without fear of contradiction.” (Dennett 1991, 55-6)

Relatedly, some (including Stich 1983) deny that self-knowledge is special, relative to knowledge of others' states, by claiming that ordinary (“folk”) concepts of psychological states are theoretical concepts. If psychological states are theoretical entities, both self-attributions and other-attributions will proceed by inference from observed data -- presumably, behavior. This understanding of folk psychology is known as “theory theory”; it stands in opposition to “simulation theory” (Gordon 1986), which is usually thought more conducive to the claim that self-knowledge is special. According to simulation theory, one learns of others' states by imaginatively projecting oneself into the other's situation and thereby determining, perhaps through a special mode of self-reflection, what one would believe or desire (etc.) if one were in that situation oneself.

Another general epistemological contention which generates doubt about self-knowledge is the familiar worry that the observational process unavoidably alters the target of observation. The introspective process may be especially vulnerable to this worry, since the observer has some direct control over that which she observes. One reaction to this worry is to adopt the position, mentioned above, which denies that thoughts are stable entities. (See also 2.5.) A more sweeping reaction is to claim that thoughts are never fully grasped: the attempt to grasp a thought inevitably changes the thought, so unobserved thoughts have a nature which is distinct from that which we grasp in introspection, and forever inaccessible. This global skepticism about self-knowledge is rejected by nearly all current philosophers.

Empirical work in psychology constitutes a final source of doubt about the epistemic status of self-attributions. In a much-cited paper, Nisbett and Wilson (1977) present studies which show that subjects routinely misidentify the factors which influenced their reasoning processes. For instance, subjects in one study explained their preference for a product by its apparent quality, while in fact it was the product's spatial position relative to its competitors that led to the preference.

The accuracy of subject reports is so poor as to suggest that any introspective access that may exist is not sufficient to produce generally correct or reliable reports. (Nisbett and Wilson, 1977, 33)

While these studies are instructive, their results are limited in that they apply only to the causal sources of one's decisions. Nisbett and Wilson are silent as to the epistemic status of self-attributions of one's current states, and it is current states to which the claim of specialness least controversially applies. Still, some philosophers have used such studies to argue that presuppositions have a distorting influence on putatively direct self-attributions.

2. Accounts of Self-Knowledge

We have seen that some characterizations of what is distinctive about self-knowledge construe the special feature as an epistemic one, while others construe it as non-epistemic. Corresponding to this difference, accounts of how self-knowledge proceeds are of two sorts, epistemic and non-epistemic. The current section surveys accounts within each of these categories. Subsections 2.1-2.4 describe epistemic accounts, and subsections 2.5 and 2.6 describe non-epistemic accounts. (Those who claim that there is nothing special about self-knowledge need not provide an account of self-knowledge specifically, for they assimilate self-knowledge to other sorts of knowledge.)

2.1 The Unmediated Observation Model

As is the case with many other issues in the philosophy of mind, the model of self-knowledge that most current views define themselves against is associated with Descartes. The Unmediated Observation model of self-knowledge attributed to him holds that we observe our own thoughts, but that these “inner” observations differ from ordinary perceptual observations in that nothing mediates, epistemically or metaphysically, between the observational state and the state observed. Inner observations are thus non-inferential and metaphysically direct. Those who endorse the Unmediated Observation model generally limit its application to a subject's current states, as they claim that the use of memory would involve inference. As explained above, the epistemic and metaphysical directness is thought to provide for infallibility and/or certainty by closing off all sources of introspective error, including faulty inferences and appearance -- reality gaps. For this reason, the Unmediated Observation model has special appeal for epistemic foundationalists, who require a set of self-justifying beliefs to serve as the foundation for other beliefs. (Chisholm (1977) argues that knowledge of our phenomenal states can serve as epistemic foundations, but denies that this is the only sort of foundational knowledge. See also Lewis 1946.)

One contemporary version of the Unmediated Observation model (Chisholm 1981) which focuses on the epistemic features of self-knowledge claims that some psychological properties are “self-presenting”, where self-presenting properties are those with particular psychological and epistemic characteristics. Specifically, (i) no one who has a self-presenting property directly self-attributes its negation (though of course one may indirectly self-attribute its negation, e.g., by attributing it to “the person in the mirror”, when one fails to recognize that it is she herself who is reflected in the mirror); (ii) anyone who has a self-presenting property and considers whether she does, will self-attribute that property; and (iii) a direct attribution of a self-presenting property is certain, in a relative sense.

An alternative modern version (Chalmers 2002) also exploits the notion of directness, but applies only to knowledge of one's own phenomenal states. On this account, the phenomenal quality which one attends to partially constitutes the phenomenal belief. In other words, the phenomenal state which is known just is part of the state which constitutes knowledge of it. This partial constitution secures the metaphysical directness described above, as nothing mediates between the known state and the knowing state. And this sort of account is also meant to secure epistemic directness, by drawing on the relation between a phenomenal quality's appearance and its reality emphasized in the passages from Kripke, Hill and Sturgeon above. Since an appearance of a phenomenal quality and the reality which appears (the phenomenal quality itself) are one and the same, on this account, one can enjoy epistemically direct access to the phenomenal quality by attending to it. (See also Gertler 2001.)

The Unmediated Observation model has been criticized on various grounds. First, as stated above, some deny that any method will yield the strong epistemic results -- most notably, infallibility or certainty -- it claims. In response, proponents of the Unmediated Observation model may narrowly define the observational method, so that self-attributions will be said to be infallible or certain only under sharply limited conditions. Or they may simply forego the more extreme epistemic claims on behalf of self-attributions, maintaining that we directly observe our own states but denying that this directness produces such strongly justified beliefs.

A second objection charges that this model pays an excessively high price for securing metaphysical directness: viz., that it construes introspective belief as too close to its object to qualify as genuine, substantial knowledge of that object. For instance, Wright argues that the Unmediated Observation model will not allow for truly epistemic access to one's own states, since genuine knowledge that one is having a seeing-red experience, say, requires that one correctly apply the concept ‘red’. This in turn requires the possibility of error, for a judgment which is guaranteed to be correct will not qualify as a “substantial cognitive accomplishment”; but the directness posited by the Unmediated Observation model seems to foreclose the possibility of error, and thus to render the resulting judgment cognitively insubstantial (Wright 1989). James beat contemporary philosophers to the punch here as well, by denying that the mere lack of an appearance-reality gap ensures self-knowledge.

[Even if] the esse of a mental state is its sentiri, [in self-knowledge the mental state] must be more than experienced; it must be remembered, reflected on, named, classed, known, related to other facts of the same order. (James 1884, 1)

Another way of putting this second objection is to say that the Unmediated Observation model threatens to reduce one's understanding of the self-attributed quality to an event, viz., one's attending to an instance of that quality. The model thus faces Wittgensteinian concerns about the legitimacy of private language. Sellars (1963) expresses related worries when he claims that the concepts used in understanding putatively “private” episodes cannot themselves be wholly private:

[T]he reporting role of these concepts, their role in introspection, the fact that each of us has a privileged access to his impressions, constitutes a dimension of these concepts which is built on and presupposes their role in intersubjective discourse. (Sellars ibid., sec. 62)

A final worry about the Unmediated Observation model, articulated by Boghossian (1989), questions whether this model can capture the relational features which, on most views, define propositional attitude contents. Such contents are construed relationally not only by externalist theories of content, but also by non-externalist versions of functionalism and conceptual role semantics. Presumably, it is only intrinsic features of states that can be directly observed. If propositional attitude contents cannot be directly observed, then observations can at most provide an inferential ground for knowledge of such contents. And the need for inference is at odds with the immediacy which the Unmediated Observation model requires.

2.2 The Inner Sense Model

Many philosophers deny that self-knowledge is as exceptional as the Unmediated Observation model implies. The Inner Sense model of introspection seeks to minimize the anomalousness and associated mystery of self-knowledge by construing introspection as fundamentally similar to perception. Locke, perhaps the first champion of the Inner Sense model, described the introspective faculty as follows.

This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself … And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call'd internal Sense. (Locke 1975, II.1.iv.)

There is variation among contemporary versions of the Inner Sense model as to the extent of the analogy with perception. Armstrong's (1981) view lies at one extreme. He describes introspection as the brain's “self-scanning process”: the introspective process is “a mere flow of information or beliefs”, resulting in a higher-order awareness of a lower-order state of the brain (Armstrong 1981, 112). In contrast to the Unmediated Observation model, the connection between the introspective (scanning) state, and the introspected (scanned) state, is causal and contingent. In fact, on this view there is no bar, in principle, to scanning others' states. Armstrong (ibid.) argues, against the Unmediated Observation model, that the relation between the introspected state and the introspective state must be causal; and hence, these states must be “distinct existences”. But Armstrong's view shares with the Unmediated Observation model the claim that introspection is non-inferential, because the causal connections between the scanner and the states scanned need not be known by the subject in order to deliver self-knowledge.

Other versions of the Inner Sense model construe the analogy with perception as less comprehensive. Lycan (1996) claims that, unlike perception, introspection need not involve any sensory quality. More importantly, he argues that introspection is limited in principle to one's own states, for in introspective self-attribution one refers to oneself with “semantically primitive lexemes” (of a language of thought) which are applicable only to oneself (Lycan 1996, 61). Still, Lycan's version of the Inner Sense model sees introspection as deeply akin to perception in that it involves a monitoring mechanism, causally sensitive to its objects, that yields representations of its objects through attention. Proponents of the Inner Sense model often hold that conscious states are just those mental states of which the subject has higher-order awareness. (This is known as the Higher-Order Perception, or HOP, theory of consciousness.) Assimilating introspection to perception may thus potentially resolve another puzzle about the mind.

The Inner Sense model has faced three main criticisms. The first is that, by construing the relation between the scanner and the state scanned as causal, the model fails to do justice to the deep epistemic disparity between self-knowledge and other-knowledge. Gertler (2000a) argues on these grounds that no perceptual model can accommodate a noncontingent epistemic disparity between self-knowledge and other-knowledge. In response, the Inner Sense theorist can allow that this epistemic disparity is less significant than some other models, including the Unmediated Observation model, maintain.

A related objection challenges the Inner Sense model's depiction of the capacity for self-awareness as a merely contingent -- albeit evolutionarily important -- feature of persons. Some of the competing models discussed below are predicated on the claim that this capacity is essential to rational agency. For instance, Shoemaker (1994) argues that no rational agent with the relevant concepts could be incapable of self-knowledge. (See 2.4 below.)

The third main criticism (Evans 1982, Dretske 1999) claims that, in construing self-knowledge as looking within oneself, the Inner Sense model neglects the transparency of mental content. This criticism is based on the view (discussed in 1.2 above) that self-awareness does not involve directing one's attention inward, as the Inner Sense model requires. Instead, one becomes aware of one's own mental states by attending to features of the world external to oneself. This objection is the impetus for a different perceptual model of self-knowledge, the Displaced Perception model.

2.3 The Displaced Perception Model

In contrast to the Inner Sense view, the Displaced Perception model denies that there is a perception-like mechanism which is directed inward. On the Displaced Perception model, self-knowledge is “a form of perceptual knowledge that is obtained -- indeed, can only be obtained -- by awareness of non-mental objects” (Dretske 1994, 264). Dretske claims that when one is aware of a non-mental object -- a car parked in the driveway, for instance -- one can infer that one is in a mental state, viz., one which represents ‘car in the driveway’. Hence, Dretske's version of this model differs from the Inner Sense model in taking introspective knowledge to be inferential.

Another version of the Displaced Perception model, one that was mentioned earlier as the ‘looking outward’ claim, is found in Evans (1982).

[I]n making a self-ascription of belief, one's eyes are, so to speak, or occasionally literally, directed outward -- upon the world. If someone asks me “Do you think there is going to be a third world war?,” I must attend, in answering him, to precisely the same outward phenomena as I would attend to if I were answering the question “Will there be a third world war?” (Evans 1982, 225)

In order to determine whether one believes that p, on Evans' view, one must try to determine whether p is true, and one does this by examining the relevant evidence regarding p. This method is distinct from ordinary perception. Ordinary perception requires directing one's attention towards the object of knowledge, whereas on Evans' view, we direct our attention away from the belief, the “inner” object of knowledge. Our ability to ascertain our beliefs by looking at the beliefs' objects is attributed to the “transparency” of belief. One's own beliefs are transparent to one in that one does not notice them as beliefs, but instead looks “through” them directly to their objects.

The idea that one looks outward to determine one's own states need not be restricted to the case of beliefs. A parallel case can be made for desires: when asked, “do you want some ice cream?”, I do not look inward to consult my desires, but instead I think about ice cream, to determine its desirability. A somewhat different case can be made for sensations: when asked “are you experiencing pain in your ankle?”, I consider whether the ankle (a non-mental object) has the quality of hurting, rather than thinking about my pain as such. We have already seen an objection to Evans' version of the Displaced Perception model: that the method described doesn't allow us to determine pre-existing mental states, but rather serves as an invitation to form new mental states. (Martin (1998) discusses limitations of Evans' model.)

It is noteworthy that both the Inner Sense model and the Displaced Perception model locate the asymmetry between self-knowledge and other-knowledge as a difference in the direction of attention. For the Inner Sense view, what is special about self-knowledge is that it proceeds via a special perception-like mechanism, one which is unique in being directed inward. For the Displaced Perception model, what is special about self-knowledge, relative to knowledge of others' mental states, is that it proceeds from directing one's attention outward, towards the features of the world which the mental state represents. Knowledge of others' mental states may incorporate knowledge of their environment, but even on the Displaced Perception model, it will involve attending to the other person and not just to the features of the world her mental state represents.

[W]hile to know what another representational system represents requires examining both the system (to see that it's functioning properly) and the world, to know what oneself (as a representational system) represents requires examining only the world. (Dretske 1994)

In using beliefs about the external world as the basis for this inference, the Displaced Perception model avoids one problem which threatens most inferential models: that they lead to a regress, by grounding inferential knowledge of a mental state on knowledge of other mental states, which is itself presumably inferential (Boghossian 1989). But the use of external objects invites other worries, given the large inferential gap between non-mental and mental states. An objection to Dretske's version of the Displaced Perception model questions whether any belief powerful enough to justify the required inference from external-world facts to mental states could itself be justified (Aydede forthcoming). Even supposing that there were such a powerful, complex belief, it seems unlikely that everyone capable of self-knowledge has such complex beliefs. Proponents of the Displaced Perception model might respond by claiming that awareness of external objects is all that could ground self-awareness, and so it must somehow perform this task, in a way yet to be determined.

The accounts of self-knowledge canvassed thus far share a common feature: they interpret what is special about self-attributions in terms which are not only epistemic but empirical. That self-knowledge is an empirical matter is clearest in the Inner Sense and Displaced Perception models, which emphasize similarities between introspection and ordinary perception. But the Unmediated Observation model is empirical as well. For it portrays introspection as a process of inner examination, albeit one whose objects are directly available to the introspective faculty. By contrast, the next set of views (subsections 2.4-2.6) highlight the importance of a priori connections between mental states and self-attributions.

2.4 The Rationality Model

Proponents of the Rationality model reject the notion that self-knowledge consists in introspective access to evidence, or perception-like reliability. But this rejection leaves room for an alternative epistemic analysis of self-knowledge. I describe two versions of the Rationality model, one which is purely epistemic and one which is partially non-epistemic.

Purely epistemic versions of the Rationality model claim that rationality can justify self-attributions. On one such model (Gallois 1996), anyone who fails to self-attribute beliefs will be faced with “a bizarre picture of the world”, because a change in beliefs will appear, to the subject, as an inexplicable change in the world itself. Because a rational person can know a priori that the world is not bizarre, the ability to self-attribute beliefs is a requirement on rationality. These self-attributions are epistemically underwritten: for conscious beliefs are at least subjectively justified, and one is rationally justified in taking herself to believe everything for which she has subjective justification. That is, your evidence that it is raining suffices to justify your belief that you believe that it is raining. This account covers knowledge of other propositional attitude states as well: for instance, one's reasons for desiring something can suffice to justify her belief that she desires that thing.

Shoemaker (1994) offers a version of the Rationality model which is only partially epistemic. On his view, no rational person who had the concepts ‘belief’, ‘desire’, ‘pain’, etc., could be incapable of self-knowledge -- in his terms, “self-blind”. For a self-blind person would not function as a normal, rational person. He would (i) fall into certain conceptual errors, such as asserting transparency-violating sentences (“It's raining but I believe that it isn't raining”); (ii) lack the ability to share his beliefs with others, and hence to engage in cooperative endeavors; (iii) be devoid of true agency, as agency involves higher-order deliberation regarding lower-order states; and (iv) regard himself “as a stranger”, e.g., in observing his own pain-avoidance behavior without grasping his own pain.

Importantly, Shoemaker sees the capacity for self-knowledge as an essential part of our rational nature. He rejects the notion that self-knowledge is a matter of access to logically independent evidence, on the grounds that this notion treats our capacity for self-knowledge as contingent. He therefore rejects perceptual models of self-knowledge in favor of an account which is, as he recognizes, somewhat Cartesian. This account denies that higher-order states of self-awareness, and the lower-order states they concern, are “distinct existences”. If the relation between lower-order states and higher-order self-attributions is causal -- Shoemaker (1994) is undecided about this -- the causal relation here is importantly different from the relation posited by the Inner Sense model. For it is essential to lower-order states that, under certain conditions, they give rise to awareness of them.

A final difference between self-knowledge and perceptual knowledge, on Shoemaker's account, is that the former is “immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun” (Shoemaker 1968). This means that when we introspectively grasp that there is pain, for instance, we cannot be mistaken about whose pain it is. By contrast, it is clearly possible to perceptually recognize that a property is instantiated, yet misidentify the object which instantiates it: perhaps I think that the brick building in the distance is my house, when in fact it is my neighbor's barn.

While it limits the sorts of error that are possible, this second version of the Rationality model is not fully Cartesian. For the Cartesian Unmediated Observation model sees self-awareness as something which occurs within the subject, by a process which may be unknown to third-person observers. Shoemaker instead claims that anyone who appears to be self-aware is, in fact, self-aware; there is no inner process, hidden from others, which could allow one's epistemic state to deviate from apparent behavioral manifestations of it. (Compare Ryle 1949, Sellars 1963.) For instance, he thinks that appearing rational -- avoiding (i)-(iv) above -- is conclusive evidence that one knows one's own states in a distinctively first-person way. This differs from the first Rationality model, which treats the capacity for self-awareness as, most basically, a fact about the subject's inner life.

In its insistence that the possession of certain mental concepts entails a capacity for self-knowledge, and its rejection of hidden “inner” processes, this second version of the Rationality model resonates with non-epistemic accounts (discussed in 2.5 and 2.6). Still, the view qualifies as epistemic because the rationally necessitated link between mental states and self-attributions is an epistemic one.

Siewert (forthcoming) has argued that Shoemaker's account faces a circularity worry. In order for me to accept, on the basis of Shoemaker's argument, that I am an accurate introspector, it seems I must have reasons to believe that I am rational. After all, Shoemaker claims that my general accuracy is ensured by my rationality. And it is unclear how to establish that I'm rational without using the accuracy of my self-attributions, or how to establish that I'm an accurate self-attributor without using the fact of my rationality. (For a related criticism, which challenges whether the absence of self-blindness suffices for self-knowledge, see Kind (forthcoming). For a slightly different worry about Gallois' version of the Rationality model, see Gertler (2000b).)

More generally, the chief problem for the Rationality model is to defend the picture of rationality on which it depends. It may be objected that this picture is overly demanding, in that the results of failing to self-attribute beliefs -- e.g., having “a bizarre picture of the world”, or satisfying one or more of Shoemaker's (i)-(iv) -- is compatible with a modest degree of rationality. For instance, the phenomenon of self-deception (discussed in Section 4 below) poses a prima facie difficulty for the claim that rational agents cannot be self-blind. Of course, proponents of the Rationality model are free to use a robust notion of rationality; after all, they do not claim that all subjects meet the requirements for rationality. But requiring an excessively high degree of rationality threatens to trivialize the model. For the more rational subjects are, the less surprising it is that they are self-aware.

2.5 The Commitment Model

Epistemic accounts seek to provide an epistemological picture which meshes with the special -- in some cases, only slightly special -- epistemic character of self-knowledge. But as I noted above (1.3), some philosophers deny that the special character of self-attributions consists in an epistemic feature. Doubts about epistemic accounts of self-knowledge have two main sources: (i) broadly Wittgensteinian worries about inner operations conducted in private language, unknowable by others; and (ii) the belief that, by its exclusive focus on the epistemic, these accounts ignore the self-evaluation inherent in recognizing one's own states, and thus overlooks the fact that we are responsible for our attitudes (Sartre 1956).

The first non-epistemic account of introspection I will discuss is the Commitment Model. Proponents of this model argue that purely epistemic models don't do justice to what is special about self-knowledge: that in recognizing an attitude, one also implicitly endorses -- avows -- it.

But, as I conceive of myself as a rational agent, my awareness of my belief is awareness of my commitment to its truth, a commitment to something that transcends any description of my psychological state. (Moran 1997, 151)

We may allow any manner of inner events of consciousness, any exclusivity and privacy, any degree of privilege and special reliability, and their combination would not add up to the ordinary capacity for self-knowledge. For the connection with the avowal of one's attitudes would not be established by the addition of any degree of such epistemic ingredients. (Moran 2001, 93)

One who treats her own thoughts as simple objects of knowledge, without taking any responsibility for them, is “self-alienated”. (This complements Shoemaker's contention that failure to self-attribute thoughts may lead to treating oneself “as a stranger”.) While we may have epistemic access to our own states which others lack, proponents of the Commitment model hold that what is most distinctive about self-awareness is this: so long as a rational person attributes attitudes to herself as such (i.e., as “mine”), she must be committed to those attitudes. The requirement that one be committed to one's self-attributed attitudes ties in with the transparency of mental states. We reflect on our attitudes by directly considering their contents; it is because we consider our attitudes and their contents inseparably that we avoid pragmatic paradoxes such as “It is raining but I believe that it isn't” and “Ice cream is wholly undesirable, but I want some”. (These are known as “Moore Paradoxes”, after G.E. Moore (1942).) Despite the fact that such statements may be true, one who utters them apparently fails to grasp that the subject whose attitudes are specified is identical to the person making the utterance. Grasping this identity will lead any rational person to self-attribute only those attitudes she endorses. But whereas epistemic accounts explain this result by claiming that awareness of the lower-order state justifies (and causes) the self-attribution, the Commitment model explains it by reference to the fact that avowing the state commits one to endorsing it. Because of its focus on non-epistemic responsibility and commitment, this model is especially relevant to debates in moral psychology. (See 3.4 below.)

There is a noteworthy hybrid account, advanced by Peacocke (1998), which combines elements of the Commitment model with elements of the Rationality model. Like the Rationality model, it claims that rational subjects who possess the concepts ‘belief’, ‘desire’, etc., are necessarily self-aware. But it also sees commitment to the attitude as a requirement on self-knowledge. A direct grasp of a conscious, occurrent attitude constitutes knowledge if it simultaneously causes and rationalizes a self-attributing belief. And the conscious attitude will simultaneously cause and rationalize the belief if and only if it is one which the subject would endorse. By making the belief rational, in these conditions, the presence of the conscious attitude justifies the belief; the account is thus at least partially epistemic, and closely related to the Rationality model. Yet in requiring that a subject be disposed to endorse a self-attributed attitude, it is also similar to the Commitment model. Martin (1998) questions whether Peacocke's account is ultimately substantial enough to explain first-person access.

The Commitment model shares with other non-epistemic models the challenge of accommodating the strong intuition that what differentiates self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms is, first and foremost, an epistemic feature. For instance, it might be argued that an epistemic model will best explain what is special about self-knowledge, while the Commitment model pertains to a slightly different issue, namely, what is involved, conceptually and psychologically, in reflecting on one's attitudes considered as one's own. A second objection claims that the Commitment model has only limited application. It is unclear how one can be “committed to” a sensation in the same way that one is committed to beliefs, desires, and intentions. Finally, in its dependence on rationality, the Commitment model confronts the difficulties which faced the Rationality model: it must accommodate cases of (apparent) self-deception, and provide a notion of rationality that is robust enough to bear the substantial implications which the model requires, but not so robust that it trivializes the account.

2.6 The Expressivist Model

The second non-epistemic model construes self-attributions as performances which express one's mental states. It highlights the similarity between self-attributions and other modes of self-expression, such as shouting “yay!” or “ouch!” or “give me that!” These expressions or performances have no propositional content; they cannot be true or false. The most extreme version of this model, Pure Expressivism, holds that self-attributions that appear to be propositional, such as “I am happy”, “I am in pain”, and “I want that”, are also devoid of propositional content, but express one's mental states in much the same way that shouting “yay!” expresses joy, and blushing expresses embarrassment. It's not clear whether anyone has seriously defended Pure Expressivism, but some have interpreted Wittgenstein as holding this sort of view. In diagnosing the apparent propositional structure of self-attributions as merely apparent, Pure Expressivism parallels Expressivism in ethics.

The deepest objections to Pure Expressivism target its implication that self-attributions are non-propositional. For instance, if self-attributions are non-propositional, then subjects seem unable to give a true (or false) description of their own states. But Pure Expressivism allows that others can describe one's state, correctly or incorrectly. The idea that subjects are thus restricted is unpalatable on its own; and it blocks this view from accommodating substantial first-person authority, since the subject cannot so much as articulate her own condition.

The appeal of Pure Expressivism lies in its recognition that the subject is uniquely situated to express her own states. In a series of recent papers (Bar-On 2000, Bar-On and Long 2001), Bar-On and Long have formulated a view which is also based in this recognition, which they label “Neo-Expressivism”. Neo-Expressivism avoids the strongest objections to Pure Expressivism by allowing that self-attributions are propositional. What is special about some self-attributions -- attributions they call “avowals” -- is that they are not the product of observation or reflection, and are not based on reasons. Instead, avowals serve to express or “give voice to” one's mental states, by issuing directly from those states. This process is not an epistemically special method for determining one's own states; Bar-On and Long deny that there is any such special method. But avowals are nonetheless special, on their view, for it is only through an avowal that one can express a condition in a way which is both direct and possesses propositional content. A blush directly expresses one's embarrassment, but is not propositional; a verbal report that “my toenails are painted red” is propositional, but only indirectly expresses one's condition. Exclaiming “I want the teddy!” is both propositional and directly expresses one's desire for the teddy.

Neo-Expressivism thus identifies the distinctive element of self-attributions as non-epistemic. Still, the account sees first-person authority as justified by the subject's unique ability to express her states, and hence rejects outright epistemic deflationism. The greatest challenge to Neo-Expressivism is to explain how first-person authority may be justified by the subject's unique situation, without invoking an epistemic model of self-knowledge.

3. Knowledge of the Self

This entry has thus far focused on knowledge of one's own mental states. Yet as I mentioned at the outset, “self-knowledge” can also be used to refer to knowledge of the self and its nature. Issues about knowledge of the self include: (1) how it is that one distinguishes oneself from others, as the object of a self-attribution; (2) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of the material or non-material nature of the self; (3) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of one's personal identity over time; and (4) what sort of self-understanding is required for rational or free agency. These issues are closely connected with referential semantics, the mind-body problem, the metaphysics of personal identity, and moral psychology, respectively. I will only briefly sketch some prominent views about knowledge of the self arising from debates in these areas.

3.1 Self-Identification

In self-attributing a mental state, I recognize the state as mine in some sense, and my self-attribution partially consists in a reference to myself. This reference is reflexive, in that I think of myself as myself and not, e.g., as BG, or as the shortest person in the room. Nozick (1981) underscores the significance of being able to thus refer to oneself: “To be an I, a self, is to have the capacity for reflexive self-reference.” This raises the question: how is it that I identify myself, and distinguish myself from others?

Consider: seeing a flushed red face on film, I might wonder whether the face I see is mine or my identical twin's, and therefore I may say, “someone is embarrassed, but is it me?” Evans (1982) argues that for some kinds of self-attributions, such a question will not arise. Adopting the term from Shoemaker (1968) mentioned above (2.4), he describes self-attributions of the relevant type as “immune to error through misidentification.”

None of the following utterances appears to make sense when the first component expresses knowledge gained in the appropriate way: “Someone's legs are crossed, but is it my legs that are crossed?”; “Someone is hot and sticky, but is it I who am hot and sticky?”; “Someone is being pushed, but is it I who am being pushed?” (Evans 1982, 220-1)

Evans believes that my immunity to error through misidentification, in such cases, shows that I identify myself directly in these cases. If in identifying myself as the one who is hot and sticky, I used some information beyond the information involved in determining that someone is hot and sticky, then I could possibly be justified in believing that someone was hot and sticky but mistaken in thinking that it was me. Because that scenario doesn't “make sense”, he thinks, I must recognize myself directly, without any identifying information.

Others deny that self-identification is direct, claiming instead that it occurs by way of some sort of description. For instance, Rovane (1993) argues that, in self-reference, the way one thinks of oneself can be analyzed as “the series of psychologically related intentional episodes to which this one [the current intentional episode] belongs” (86). Proponents of descriptive accounts claim that such accounts can accommodate the fact that we don't actually err about who it is that is hot and sticky. On Rovane's view, our reliability in self-identification is to be expected, given that understanding ourselves and our place in the world is required for genuine agency. (I return to the issue of agency in 3.4 below.) Still, there is an important epistemic disagreement between those, like Evans, who claim that self-reference is “identification-free”, and those who claim that we refer to ourselves via a description. The former maintain that there is, in a real sense, no room for error about who is hot and sticky, whereas the latter will say that while such errors are possible, we simply avoid them.

Notably, both “direct reference” and descriptive accounts capture the reflexivity of first-person reference. (For descriptive accounts, this reflexivity lies in the fact that “this one” refers to the very thought of which it is a part.) They thereby fit with the widely accepted belief that self-reference in the distinctively first-person mode is essentially indexical. (See Castañeda 1966, Perry 1979, Lewis 1979.) The dispute between Evans and Rovane is then, in part, a disagreement as to whether the indexical term “I” refers to the self directly, as Evans believes, or instead refers via an implicit indexical of another sort, e.g. “this” or “here”. In general, one's epistemology of self-identification will depend on what sort of indexical one considers most fundamental, in self-reference.

A final issue concerns the relation between self-awareness and awareness of other persons. On the leading traditional view of this relation, one first grasps that one bears psychological properties, and reasons by analogy to the conclusion that other creatures do as well. (This is the “argument from analogy” to the existence of other minds, articulated by J.S. Mill (1867).) Some recent philosophers have challenged this traditional view, contending that self-awareness is logically dependent on at least a conceptual grasp of other persons. For instance, here is Bermúdez:

[A] subject's recognition that he is distinct from the environment in virtue of being a psychological subject depends on his ability to identify himself as a psychological subject within a contrast space of other psychological subjects. (Bermúdez 1998, 274)

3.2 Materialism and Dualism

In a much-criticized piece of reasoning, Descartes (1641/1984) contrasts the certainty afforded by introspection with the dubitability of knowledge of the physical, to show that introspective objects (thoughts) are ontologically distinct from physical things. This strategy for supporting dualism has few current proponents. Commentators still adhere to the basic criticism lodged by Arnauld (1641/1984): that a purely epistemic premise cannot support an ontological one. It is clearly possible to be (relatively) certain that there is water in the tub, while doubting that there is H2O in the tub; yet water is identical to H2O. Many contemporary materialists are similarly concerned to restrict the deliverances of introspection, arguing that while mental states appear, to introspection, to be non-physical, the grasp which introspection affords is partial at best, and systematically misleading at worst.

However, there are materialists who take the opposite tack: rather than rejecting self-reflection as a guide to ontology, they claim that some mental states appear physical. These arguments employ three types of self-reflection: introspective awareness of sensations, introspective awareness of perceptual states, and proprioceptive awareness of bodily states. Proprioception is the putatively direct, non-perceptual awareness of one's bodily state; it is what allows you to know that your arm is raised “from the inside”, that is, without looking at your arm.

The argument for materialism from proprioceptive awareness, due to Brewer (1995), is as follows. Proprioception is epistemically on a par with introspective knowledge, in that (i) it is a species of direct, non-inferential awareness, and (ii) it is “immune to error through misidentification of the first-person pronoun” in Shoemaker's sense (see 2.4 above).

Presumably, introspective awareness of mental states justifies the claim that we are mental beings, by virtue of its epistemic character. But proprioceptive awareness of physical states shares this epistemic character; so we are equally justified in the claim that we are physical beings. This argument falls short of disproving dualism, for it leaves open the question how our mental nature is related to our physical nature.

Brewer (1995) also builds an alternative argument along these lines, which seeks to rule out dualism by focusing on introspective awareness of sensations. This argument takes introspective awareness of sensations as intrinsically mental and, at the same time, intrinsically physical. Like the previous argument, it claims that awareness of physical properties is epistemologically equivalent to awareness of mental properties. But it goes further, contending that introspection provides an awareness of physical and mental properties, in sensations, as inextricable. It thus tries to block the possibility of distinctness between the mental subject and the physical subject.

A final argument to show that self-knowledge supports materialism, advanced by Cassam (1997), uses a somewhat different approach. Rather than relying on the spatial quality of bodily sensations or proprioception, this argument exploits one's awareness of one's own perceptual states. It says that in becoming aware of our own perceptual states and taking these states to represent a physical world, we are driven to conceive of ourselves as physical objects.

Broadly Cartesian objections to introspection-based arguments for materialism illuminate possible ways that the ontological conclusion can be flawed, consistent with the introspective evidence. For instance, the apparent proprioceptive awareness of the position of one's limbs could be nonveridical: an amputee might have a similar sense that her legs are crossed, even if she doesn't, in fact, have any legs. (This does not violate Evans' claim that such judgments are immune to error through misidentification: the error here is not one of misidentifying the subject, but instead of falsely ascribing a property to the self.) A similar argument could be made against the claim that sensations are intrinsically spatial, and that perceptual states represent a physical world. Even if one's sensations portray oneself as spatially extended, the idea that one is non-extended (immaterial) is logically consistent with the presence of those sensations or (apparent) perceptual states. Proponents of these arguments for materialism could respond by claiming either that knowledge of oneself as a mental thing is less certain than this alleged contrast implies, or that knowledge of oneself as a physical thing is more certain than it implies.

3.3 Personal Identity

The ontological views described in the previous subsection have no immediate consequences for personal identity. For it may be that the criteria of persistence through time, for persons, differ from the criteria of persistence for (other) material objects even if, as materialists contend, a person at a time is necessarily constituted by some matter or other. Knowledge of mental states is not usually thought to provide any special insight into one's persistence through time, since it is typically assumed that one enjoys privileged access only to one's current states. In particular, the individual has no special insight into whether her current apparent memories are veridical, and so has no special way to determine whether a particular prior experience was hers. Since views about first-person access played a greater part in shaping theories of personal identity during the modern period than they do today, my brief remarks here will focus on that period.

As mentioned above, Descartes' meditator uses the proposition that there is thinking occurring, to which she purportedly has immediate (indubitable) introspective access, to establish her own existence with certainty. But this does not allow the meditator to grasp a persisting self. For Descartes, the self, like every other substance, is not directly apprehended; it is understood only through its properties.

Hume also claims that we never directly apprehend the self. Unlike Descartes, he concludes from this that there is no substantial self. In a famous passage, Hume uses introspective awareness to show that the self is a non-substantial “bundle” of perceptions.

For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I can never catch myself at any time without a perception, and can never observe anything but the perception. When my perceptions are remov'd for any time, as by sound sleep; so long am I insensible of myself , and may truly be said not to exist. (Hume 1739-40/1978, 252)

Locke agrees that self-reflection can help to reveal the nature of the self, but for him the self is a substantial entity which persists through time. Most important for our purposes is that Locke's criterion for a successful account of personal identity is based on self-awareness.

[A person is] a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and considers itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places. (Locke 1975, II.27.ix, my emphasis).

Locke takes introspectible states as only partial determinants of one's persistence through time; still, he shares Hume's basic strategy of using introspective data to understand personal identity.

Kant repudiates the basic strategy shared by Locke and Hume, for he denies that self-awareness reveals objective facts about personal identity. He concurs with Descartes and Hume that we never directly apprehend the self (this fact is what he calls the “systematic elusiveness of the ‘I’”). And while he holds that we cannot avoid thinking of ourselves as persisting, unitary beings, he attributes this self-conception to necessary requirements for thought which do not directly support substantive ontological conclusions about the nature of the self.

One contemporary view about personal identity is noteworthy in this context. This view, defended by Galen Strawson (1997), does not explicitly draw on introspective reflection, but it implies that the limits of a subject correspond to the limits of what could be introspectively grasped, at a moment. A subject is defined by (indeed, identified with) a period of experience which is “experientially unitary”. Since in humans an appropriately unified experience lasts no more than about three seconds, subjects are in fact very short-lived.

3.4 Agency

The role of self-understanding in agency is a complex topic, and I can only briefly address some leading positions on the issue here. Knowledge of one's relatively stable traits and dispositions -- one's character -- is believed, by some, to be crucial for the exercise of free agency. For instance, Taylor claims that self-reflection is imperative for being human (where this means, in part, being capable of agency),

[T]he human animal not only finds himself impelled from time to time to interpret himself and his goals, but … he is always already in some interpretation, constituted as human by this fact. (Taylor 1985, 75)

In a somewhat different vein, Frankfurt maintains that the capacity to rationally evaluate one's desires is required for freedom of the will. This rational evaluation issues in second-order desires, that is, desires concerning which desires to have or to act upon.

[N]o animal other than man … appears to have the capacity for reflective self-evaluation that is manifested in the formation of second-order desires. (Frankfurt 1971, 7)

It is only because a person has volitions of the second order that he is capable both of enjoying and of lacking freedom of the will. (ibid.,14)

These claims by Taylor and Frankfurt go beyond the merely pragmatic observation that a reasonable degree of self-understanding is required for effective action. Instead, they assert that what is distinctive about the exercise of a free will, in determining one's course of action, is that this exercise involves the capacity to critically reflect on one's basic goals and desires. (For a related view, see Bilgrami 1998.)

While Taylor, Frankfurt, and Bilgrami stress that a broad self-understanding is crucial for responsible agency, other views claim that particular actions require some awareness of one's intentions in performing that action. For instance, Searle (1983) argues that intentions are always self-referential, in that when one performs an action X intentionally, the relevant intention to act includes an intention to X so as to fulfill that intention itself. Anscombe (1981) similarly emphasizes the significance of one's awareness of intentions in acting. In fact, on her view thoughts about actions, intentions, postures, etc. have a special status: it is only thoughts about such aspects of the self that are “unmediated, non-observational, and also are descriptions (e.g., ‘standing’) which are directly verifiable or falsifiable about the person” (Anscombe 1981, 35). And she also believes that action requires some awareness of these features of oneself. For criticism of the idea that action requires awareness of intention, see Cunning (1999).

One contemporary theory of practical reasoning, offered by Velleman (1989), casts knowledge of the self in a particularly important role. Velleman notes that we strongly desire to understand ourselves and, in particular, to understand our reasons for acting. On his view, this desire leads us to try to discern our action-motivating desires and beliefs. (He calls this attempt to gain self-awareness “reflective theoretical reasoning”.) But strikingly, Velleman thinks that the desire for self-understanding also leads us to model our actions on our predictions about how we will act. In this way, our expectations as to how we will act are themselves intentions to act. “Intentions to act … are the expectations of acting that issue from reflective theoretical reasoning” (Velleman 1989, 98). Thus, Velleman can say that our desire to understand what we are doing, at the moment we are doing it, is usually satisfied, since our predictions about how we will act are themselves intentions to act, and hence our beliefs about what we will do are “self-fulfilling expectations”.

Finally, there is an emerging literature which examine the effect of societal influences on subjects' self-understanding and, thereby, on agency. See, e.g., Neisser and Jopling 1997 and Meyers 2002.

4. Self-Deception

One who lacks self-knowledge may simply be ignorant about some aspect or state of the self, perhaps because he or she has not formed any relevant belief. But in extreme cases, an absence of accurate self- reflection, or ignorance about what is guiding one's reasoning, may allow one's interests to shape one's beliefs. When false beliefs are formed due to such motivations, the subject is self-deceived. The phenomenon of self-deception has received a great deal of attention; I can only briefly discuss some of the main issues involving self-deception here.

It seems clear that rational persons may sometimes engage in self-deception: in the face of clear evidence to the contrary, hopes and fears may lead one to believe that her spouse is faithful, or that she is popular, or (even) that she has a fatal disease. However, the idea of self-deception poses conceptual difficulties. The basic problem is that self-deception appears to involve a paradox (Davidson 1985): given that “deception” refers to a deliberate attempt to make someone believe a proposition one believes to be false, self-deception seems to require that one believes the proposition in question to be false. Yet when self-deception succeeds, one (also) believes the proposition in question to be true. And it is doubtful that a rational person can have two explicitly contradictory beliefs.

One way of resolving this difficulty is to see the self as partitioned, and to claim that rationality requires only that each “part” of the self is internally consistent. Self-deceived rational persons can be accommodated so long as the deceiving part of the self is distinct from the deceived part. This approach is exemplified by the claim (Freud 1923) that the unconscious may mislead the conscious self in an effort to shield it from awareness of painful facts.

An alternative approach to this paradox is to deny that self-deceived persons ordinarily have two contradictory beliefs. For instance, Mele (1997) provides an alternative analysis of the case of the husband who believes that his wife is faithful, despite strong evidence that she is having an affair. According to Mele, the husband's desire that his wife be faithful may lead him to fail to attend to the ample evidence that she is deceiving him, or to give too much weight to her declarations of love for him. In this way, Mele claims, the husband simply avoids the obvious conclusion that she is having an affair. Mele terms his view of self-deception “deflationist”, in that it denies that standard cases of self-deception are especially mysterious or pose special explanatory problems. (Compare Barnes 1997.)

Another key dispute about self-deception concerns whether persons deliberately engage in self-deception. Predictably, deflationists deny that self-deception must be intentional, while non-deflationists (I'll call these “traditionalists”, following Scott-Kakures 2002) maintain that deliberateness is central to self-deception. For instance, Bach (1997, 105) claims that self-deception requires an “active effort” on the part of the subject. Scott-Kakures (ibid.) defends a hybrid of deflationism and traditionalism.

Holton (2001) has offered a very different way of understanding self-deception. Holton argues that cases which are ordinarily glossed as cases of deceiving oneself are, in fact, simply cases in which one is deceived about the self. If the self is not the deceiver in these cases, but is simply that about which one is deceived, then no paradox arises.

5. Self-Knowledge and Content Externalism

In recent years, much of the literature which addresses self-knowledge has focused on the question whether content externalism (Burge 1979, Putnam 1975) is compatible with the sort of privileged access we take ourselves to enjoy. Content externalism is the view that mental content is partially determined by factors external to the subject, such as her physical environment, the practices of her language community, or her historical context. There is a natural tension between this view and the claim that we enjoy privileged self-knowledge, especially when first-person privilege is explained by a special access to “inner” facts. For we are not privileged, relative to others, as to the presence of external factors in our own environment. Nearly all who accept content externalism claim that this tension is merely apparent; few are willing to completely abandon first-person privilege. Because of the popularity of content externalism, the need to resolve this tension is pressing.

Arguments to show that content externalism is incompatible with first-person privilege are principally of two types. The first (Boghossian 1989) charges that, if content is determined by environmental factors, then a subject cannot know her own mental contents without examining her environment. In response to this charge, externalists (Burge 1988, Heil 1988) have tried to show that the contents of self-attributions will appropriately track the contents of the lower-order states they concern, even if the subject remains ignorant of the salient environmental factors. Some externalists (Gibbons 1996) argue that the environmental factors which shape lower-order mental contents will also shape the contents of self-attributions. Others deny that the environment directly affects the content of self-attributions, claiming instead that self-attributions inherit their contents from the lower-order, self-attributed states. For their part, externalism's opponents have claimed that these tracking relationships are insufficiently reliable, or not of the right sort to underwrite substantive knowledge.

The second type of argument (McKinsey 1991, Brown 1995) claims that if we can know our own mental contents through introspection, and those contents are determined in part by environmental factors, then contingent facts about the environment can be deductively inferred from introspective self-knowledge. But it is highly implausible that we enjoy “privileged access to the world”. Externalists (Tye and McLaughlin 1998) have tried to block this challenge by saying that an introspective subject must have empirical information about the concepts which her mental states employ, and/or empirical information about the environment, in order to determine how the environment contributes to her mental contents. If this response succeeds, it shows that knowledge of the environment is empirical after all. Critics of this argument (Boghossian 1997) have claimed that the relevant information can be known non-empirically, and hence externalism implies that privileged self-knowledge does yield “privileged access to the world” after all. Finally, some externalists (Sawyer 1998) defend the idea that introspective self-knowledge can yield limited information about the environment.


Works Cited

Further Reading

Anthologies on self-knowledge: Other books and articles:

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

consciousness | dualism | epistemology | folk psychology: as a theory | folk psychology: as mental simulation | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | mental content: causal theories of | personal identity | physicalism | propositional attitude reports | self-consciousness

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Brie Gertler

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