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Notes to Mental Imagery
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1. One might ask, however, why closing one's eyes or turning one's head away should not count as choosing not to see the elephant. Also, our voluntary control over our imagery should not be overstated. Notoriously, if someone is commanded not to imagine an elephant, almost inevitably they will imagine one.

2. It is also surely in conflict with the arguments that have been made for the ineliminable epistemological role of imagination in scientific thought experiments (e.g., Brown, 1991; Gendler, 1998).

3. Although many philosophers now associate this view mainly with Berkeley's immediate target, Locke (1700), in fact it goes back at least to Aristotle (De Intrepretatione 16a; De Anima 420b), and, indeed, went virtually unquestioned by language theorists throughout the intervening centuries (Wollock, 1997).

4. But see Schwitzgebel (2004) for a qualified defense (and description) of Titchener's introspective methodology. By contrast, Wundt's reputation has seen a considerable revival in recent decades (e.g. Blumenthal, 1975; Bringman & Tweney, 1980; Fancher, 1996).

5. There is no sign in Perky's account of her work that she took any deliberate steps to induce relaxation in her subjects, but Segal found it essential. Segal attributes this difference in their findings to the fact that her subjects, unlike Perky's, were drawn from among "the suspicious, pragmatic students who populated our campuses in the late 1950s and early 1960s" (sic) (Segal, 1971b). Thanks to Orne (1962) and others, psychologists today are very much more alert than they were in Perky's time to the need to take account of the social psychology and social context of the experimental situation when working with human subjects. In particular, it is now well understood that considerable efforts have to be made, in some sorts of experiment, to prevent "experimenter effects" (wherein subjects behave so as to try to produce the results that they believe the experimenters expect or want) from influencing the results. There is good reason to believe that some types of experiment on imagery, particularly those that require a subject to report on their subjective experiences, are especially vulnerable to such influences (DiVesta, Ingersoll, & Sunshine, 1971; Intons-Peterson, 1983; Predebon & Wenderoth, 1985).

6. Bloor (1983) goes so far as to suggest (though without citing any evidence) that the later work of Wittgenstein largely grew out of the reaction to the imageless thought affair. Certainly one of the leading Würzburg school researchers, Karl Bühler, became a prominent psychology Professor in Vienna during the inter-war years, and Wittgenstein is known to have met him there, and seems to have been very struck (probably unfavorably) by his views (Toulmin, 1969; Bartley, 1973). Bühler also taught, and deeply influenced, the young Karl Popper (Popper, 1976), and undoubtedly his views would also have been quite familiar to the Vienna Circle positivists. (In the German speaking world at this time, the fields of philosophy and psychology were still closely institutionally as well as intellectually entwined.)

7. More recently, reflective scientists and engineers seem more likely to claim that imagery plays a vital role in their, or everyone's, thought processes (Ferguson, 1977, 1992; Shepard, 1978a,b; Deutsch, 1981; Miller, 1984; Barsalou, 1999; Damasio, 2003).

8. Skinner, it should be said, resisted the reification of experiences in general quite as much as he resisted that of images in particular.

9. Ever since Galton (1880, 1883) published his pioneering work on individual differences in imagery experience, it has been "well known" that some small minority of otherwise normal people report that they do not experience visual imagery at all. However, this phenomenon remains very poorly understood. Galton's evidence is entirely anecdotal, and no systematic, quantitative research has ever been done on "non-imagers" (although see Sommer (1978) and Thomas (1989) for case studies of individuals). Even their incidence in the general population remains unknown (figures ranging from 10-12% (Abelson, 1979) to "less than 2%" have been suggested, but there is no sign of any objective basis for either of these estimates). Despite this, both Danto (1958) and Lawrie (1970) insinuate that Ryle's views on imagery are only explicable if he was a "non-imager" of the sort described by Galton. Hannay (1971) (although he soon retreats) floats the same notion with regard not only to Ryle, but also to Shorter and Sartre. Similar ad hominem dismissals of anti-pictorialist arguments can also be found amongst contemporary psychologists. Kosslyn, for example, speculates that the leading anti-pictorialist psychologist, Pylyshyn, may be "one of the few (. . .) people who does not experience imagery" (see "What Shape Are a German Shepherd's Ears?" in Other Internet Resources, which is also the source for the "less than 2%" estimate for the proportion of non-imagers in the general population). In fact, however, throughout his writings on imagery Pylyshyn is frequently at considerable pains to make it clear that he in no way intends to cast doubt on the reality of imagery experience. There is some evidence that when people know relatively little about the theoretical issues and empirical evidence concerning imagery there is a correlation between their inclination to believe in inner pictures and the (introspectively reported) vividness of their imagery (i.e., people with more vivid imagery are more likely to believe in inner pictures). However, this correlation disappears once they know more about the issues and evidence (Reisberg, Pearson, & Kosslyn, 2003).

10. Sartre, indeed, is said to have experimented with the hallucinogenic drug mescaline as a young man, and to have not only experienced vivid hallucinations during his actual "trip," but also distressing hallucinatory "afterflashes" for a considerable time following it (de Beauvoir, 1960; Riedlinger, 1982). As for Ryle, it is quite clear, particularly from chapter 3 of his On Thinking (1979), that although he did not regard all thought, or even all imaginative thought, as necessarily involving quasi-visual experience, he certainly accepted that it sometimes does.

11. Bugelski himself was a significant participant in this research activity (e.g. Bugelski, 1970, 1971; Bugelski, Kidd, & Segmen, 1968).

12. Imagery values were determined by averaging the results of numerical ratings produced by many subjects filling out a specially designed questionnaire (Paivio, Yuille, & Madigan, 1968).

13. The difference in memorability of the two sets of words is not in dispute. What has been much disputed, however, is whether the difference in imagery value (or imagability) really causes the differences in memory performance, or whether some other semantic feature of the words (something highly correlated with, but not identical to, imagery value) is the true cause. For example, Richardson (1975) once held concreteness to be the main causally effective variable, but later changed his mind in the face of further evidence (Richardson, 1980 p. 93). Another suggestion is that the predicability of the nouns in question (i.e., "the ease with which what they refer to can be described by simple factual statements") might be the true causally effective parameter (Jones, 1986). Measures of predicability correlate quite well with imagery value, and it is quite plausible that more predicable words might spontaneously give rise to more extensive networks of verbal associations that might account for their greater memorability. In fact, upwards of thirty such alternatives to imagery value have been proposed over the past few decades, but the consensus seems to be that none of them has proven able to account for the full range of the empirical evidence as accurately and comprehensively as imagery value itself (Marks, 1997; see also Paivio, 1983a, 1991; Sadoski & Paivio, 2001). Nevertheless, it is clear, if only from the fact that so many alternative explanations have been proposed, that doubts about Paivio's imagery based explanation of his experimental data remain persistent and deep rooted. These doubts may be partly motivated by lingering doubts about the very reality of imagery, but the more important motivation is probably a commitment (itself motivated by broader theoretical or metatheoretical considerations) to some version of a common coding view of mental representation (see next section).

14. That is not to say that Dual Coding Theory provides the only viable account of the selective interference phenomenon. In fact it is also often discussed in the light of the Working Memory theory of Baddeley (1976, 1994; Baddeley & Hitch, 1974). According to this theory, the working memory system (roughly equivalent to what other psychologists call short term memory) consists of a central executive that controls a number of semi-independent "slave" subsystems, the most important of which are the articulatory (and/or phonological) loop (which holds and manipulates verbal material in consciousness) and the visuo-spatial scratchpad (which does the same for imagery). Two tasks that simultaneously call upon the same subsystem may be expected to interfere with each other. Baddeley, unlike Paivio, does not seem to be committed to the storage of imaginal and verbal memories in separate long term memory stores. However, it is arguable that for many purposes, including the explanation of selective interference and many mnemonic effects, Working Memory theory and Dual Coding Theory function not so much as rival theories, but as alternative formulations of essentially the same theoretical model (Marschark & Hunt, 1989).

15. Codes are systems of representations, and in the context of the discussion of Dual Coding Theory, we are talking about types of mental representation of which we can, at least potentially, be directly conscious, as we often are conscious of both imagery and of "inner speech". None of the arguments made in this section are intended to rule out the possibility that cognition might also involve other sorts of non-conscious representational codes. These might inlcude not only mentalese (conceived as the underlying code of our thought processes), but also, perhaps, specialized representational systems involved in the processing that (on some views) goes on within informationally encapsulated mental modules, including, perhaps, sensory processing modules (Fodor, 1983; Pylyshyn, 2003 b).

16. A fully consistent defense of the unity and cohesiveness of the imagery code may not be entirely compatible with this sort of Empiricism. But although Paivio (1986) explicitly claims to be an Empiricist, this seems to be mainly a way of indicating his commitment to the primacy of the experimental method in science, as opposed to "rationalistic" methods like computer simulation. In fact, he explicitly rejects the wax impression metaphor that is central to the traditional Empiricist understanding of perception and imagery (and from which, of course, the very notion of a "sense impression" derives) (Paivio, 1977).

17. The rejection of the Empiricist picture of perception, amongst both philosophers and cognitive scientists, takes many and various forms, but many recent theorists now view perception as an essentially active process of environmental exploration, and firmly reject the view of the senses as passive input channels (Gibson, 1966, 1979; Neisser, 1976; Bajcsy, 1988; Ballard, 1991; O'Regan, 1992; Blake & Yuille, 1992; Aloimonos, 1993; Churchland et al., 1994; Akins, 1996; Landy et al., 1996; Thomas, 1999b; O'Regan & Noë, 2001; Noë, 2002, 2004). As applied to imagery (Thomas, 1999b), this would appear to be consistent with Paivio's characterization of it as "a dynamic process more like active perception than a passive recorder of experience" (Paivio, 1977).

18. Aristotle (on a plausible and widely accepted interpretation of his texts) associated the imagination [phantasia], "the process by which we say that an image [phantasma] is presented to us" (De Anima 428a 1-4), not with the five special senses (vision, hearing, smell, taste, touch) but with the so called "common sense" [koine aisthesis], the faculty of the soul through which the various deliverances of the special senses are integrated into a coherent and meaningful whole (Beare, 1906; Ando, 1965; Nussbaum, 1978; Modrak, 1987). (Note that the Aristotelian concept of koine aisthesis, although it translates literally as "common sense," is unrelated to the modern colloquial meaning of that expression.) The most direct textual evidence that Aristotle considered the imagination and the common sense to be fundamentally the same faculty is to be found in De Insomniis (459a) and De Memoria (450a). Kant's view of the relationship between imagination and perception seems, in the relevant respects, to have been broadly similar to this (as, of course, are the views of a myriad other thinkers, past and present, directly or indirectly influenced by Aristotle). The Kantian imagination, the einbildungskraft, is primarily responsible for the synthesis of the manifold of experience (i.e., the deliverances of the individual senses) into a form that the understanding can grasp (Kant, 1781/1787 A120, B180-181, A141-142; see Strawson, 1971; Warnock, 1976). It should be noted that Paivio explicitly denies that there is an Aristotelian common sense (Paivio, 1986 p. 580). However, this is apparently because he interprets Aristotle as proposing something like the "amodal" mentalese representations of the sort championed by Pylyshyn (1978; 1984). There are alternative (and, arguably, less anachronistic) interpretations of Aristotle's theory that Paivio might well find less objectionable (see, e.g., Kosman, 1975; Modrak, 1987).

19. 1975 was the year in which Fodor published his book The Language of Thought, which introduced the concept of mentalese. It is sometimes suggested (though not, I think, by Fodor) that the familiar feeling of having something, such as the answer to a question, "on the tip of one's tongue" amounts to a direct experience of a mentalese representation, equivalent to our experience of imagery. However, this is not the case. It is true that the hypothesis of the mentalese code enables a simple and appealing explanation of an otherwise rather somewhat puzzling phenomenon. If information is stored in and retrieved from memory in the form of mentalese, it will clearly need to be translated into a natural language (e.g., English) format before it can be spoken or written down. On this basis, the tip of the tongue phenomenon is readily explained as arising from a successful episode of retrieval from storage, followed by a failure of the stage of translation into natural language. However, mentalese is still functioning as an explanans here, and not an explanandum. It may be fair to say that, because the explanation is principled and fairly simple, the tip of the tongue phenomenon provides relatively direct experiential evidence for the reality of mentalese (as, say, Brownian motion provides direct, easily observed evidence for the reality of molecules), but that is not at all the same as having direct experience of mentalese per se (any more than seeing Brownian motion through the microscope is seeing molecules). It is a far cry from the sort of direct, quasi-sensuous phenomenal experience that we enjoy of imagery and inner speech. The tip of the tongue feeling we consciously experience is actually one of those vague, contentless experiences of "fringe consciousness" (Mangan, 2001). When we experience imagery (or inner speech) we are normally (perhaps even ipso facto) aware of its intentional content, of what is being represented. By contrast, it is of the essence of the tip of the tongue phenomenon that we are not aware of what (if anything) is represented.

Copyright © 2005
Nigel Thomas

Notes to Mental Imagery
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy