This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Deontic Logic
Citation Information


The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation (Åqvist 1967)

Consider:

(1) The bank is being robbed.
(2) It ought to be the case that Jones (the guard) knows that the bank is being robbed.
(3) It ought to be the case that the bank is being robbed.

Let us symbolize “Jones knows that the bank is being robbed” by “Kjr.” Then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) - (3) in SDLs (augmented with a “K” operator) is:

(1′) r
(2′) OBKjr
(3′) OBr

But it is a logical truth that if one knows that p then p is the case (surely Jones knows that the bank is being robbed only if the bank is in fact being robbed). So proves Kjrr would hold in any system augmented with a faithful logic of knowledge. So in such a system, it would follow by RM that proves OBKjrOBr, but then we can derive (3′) from this conditional and (2′) by MP.[1] But it hardly seems to follow from the fact that it is obligatory that the guard knows that the bank is being robbed, that it is likewise obligatory that the bank is being robbed. It seems that SDL countenances inferences from patently impermissible states of affairs that someone is obliged to know hold when they hold to the conclusion that the same impermissible states of affairs are obligatory.[2]

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2006
Paul McNamara
mcnamara.p@comcast.net

Supplement to Deontic Logic
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy