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Supplement to Deontic Logic
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The Logical Necessity of Obligations Problem[1]


(1) Nothing is obligatory.

A natural representation of this in the language of SDL would be:

(1′) ~OBq, for all q.

We noted above that OB-NEC entails OB-N: gif OBtop; but given (1′), we get ~OBtop, and thus a contradiction. SDL seems to imply that it is a truth of logic that something is always obligatory. But it seems that what (1) expresses, an absence of obligations, is possible. For example, consider a time when no rational agents existed in the universe. Why should we think that any obligations existed then?

von Wright 1951 notes that since the denial of ~OBtop is provably equivalent to PE⊥ (given the traditional definitional scheme and OB-RE), and since both OBtop and PE⊥ are odd, we should opt for a “principle of contingency,” which says that OBtop and ~PE⊥ are both logically contingent. von Wright 1963 argues that OBtop (and PEtop) do not express real prescriptions (pp.152-4). Føllesdal and Hilpinen 1971 suggests that excluding OB-N only excludes “empty normative systems” (i.e., normative systems with no obligations), and perhaps not even that, since no one can fail to fulfill OBtop anyway, so why worry (p.13; cf. Prior 1958) However, since it is dubious that anyone can bring it about that top, it would seem to be equally dubious that anyone can “fulfill” OBtop, and thus matters are not so simple. al-Hibri 1978 discusses various early takes on this problem, rejects OB-N, and later develops a deontic logic without it. Jones and Porn 1985 explicitly rejects OB-N for “ought” in the system developed there, where the concern is with what people ought to do. If we are reading OB as simply “it ought to be the case that”, it is not clear that there is anything counterintuitive about OBtop (now read as, essentially, “it ought to be that contradictions are false”), but there is also no longer any obvious connection to what is obligatory or permissible for that reading, or to what people ought to do.

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Copyright © 2006
Paul McNamara

Supplement to Deontic Logic
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy