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Supplement to Deontic Logic

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Let's note that adding *T*, □*p* → *p*,
allows us to explore a classical issue connected with determinism and
deontic notions. Given axiom *T*, □ is now naturally taken
to encode a truth-implicating notion of necessity in systems
containing it. For this reason, we can now easily augment KT*d*
with an axiom expressing determinism:

p→ □p. (Determinism)

It is obvious on a moments reflection that, along with *T*,
Determinism (as an axiom schemata), yields a collapse of modal
distinctions, since *p* ↔ □*p*, and *p*
↔ ◊*p* would then be provable. However, we can also
explore, the classical question of what happens to moral distinctions
if determinism holds. This question is also settled from the
perspective of KT*d*, since the following is a derivable rule
of that system:

If (p→ □p), then (p↔OBp).

To prove this, assume Determinism,
(*p* → □*p*).

a) We first show
*p* → **OB***p*. Assume
*p*. Then by Determinism, □*p*. So by NEC′,
namely □*p* → **OB***p*, we get
**OB***p*, and thus
*p* → **OB***p*.

b) Next, we show
**OB***p* → *p*.
Assume **OB***p* and ~*p* for reductio. By
Determinism, we have ~*p* → □~*p*. So
□~*p*. This yields **OB~***p*, by
NEC′. But then we have **OB***p* &
**OB**~*p*, which contradicts a prior demonstrated
theorem, NC. So
**OB***p* → *p*.

So, from the standpoint of the classic Andersonian-Kangerian
reduction, where the notion of necessity is truth-implicating (and
thus axiom *T* is intended), the addition of the most natural
expression of determinism entails that truth and deontic distinctions
collapse. This in turn is easily seen to imply these corollaries:

If (p→ □p), then (p↔PEp)

If (p→ □p), then (OBp↔PEp)

If (p→ □p), then (~p↔IMp)

If (p→ □p), then ~OPp.

For example, consider the last corollary. By definition, *p* is
optional iff neither *p* nor ~*p* is obligatory. But
given determinism, this would entail that neither *p* nor
~*p* is true, which is not possible. So nothing can be morally
optional if determinism is true.

Return to Deontic Logic.

Paul McNamara mcnamara.p@comcast.net |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy