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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Deontic Logic
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Determinism and Deontic Collapse in the Classic A-K-Framework

Let's note that adding T, □pp, allows us to explore a classical issue connected with determinism and deontic notions. Given axiom T, □ is now naturally taken to encode a truth-implicating notion of necessity in systems containing it. For this reason, we can now easily augment KTd with an axiom expressing determinism:

proves p → □p. (Determinism)

It is obvious on a moments reflection that, along with T, Determinism (as an axiom schemata), yields a collapse of modal distinctions, since p ↔ □p, and p ↔ ◊p would then be provable. However, we can also explore, the classical question of what happens to moral distinctions if determinism holds. This question is also settled from the perspective of KTd, since the following is a derivable rule of that system:

If proves (p → □p), then proves (pOBp).

To prove this, assume Determinism, proves (p → □p).

a) We first show proves pOBp. Assume p. Then by Determinism, □p. So by NEC′, namely □pOBp, we get OBp, and thus proves pOBp.

b) Next, we show proves OBpp. Assume OBp and ~p for reductio. By Determinism, we have ~p → □~p. So □~p. This yields OB~p, by NEC′. But then we have OBp & OB~p, which contradicts a prior demonstrated theorem, NC. So proves OBpp.

So, from the standpoint of the classic Andersonian-Kangerian reduction, where the notion of necessity is truth-implicating (and thus axiom T is intended), the addition of the most natural expression of determinism entails that truth and deontic distinctions collapse. This in turn is easily seen to imply these corollaries:

If proves (p → □p), then proves (pPEp)
If proves (p → □p), then proves (OBpPEp)
If proves (p → □p), then proves (~pIMp)
If proves (p → □p), then proves ~OPp.

For example, consider the last corollary. By definition, p is optional iff neither p nor ~p is obligatory. But given determinism, this would entail that neither p nor ~p is true, which is not possible. So nothing can be morally optional if determinism is true.

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Copyright © 2006
Paul McNamara

Supplement to Deontic Logic
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy