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Supplement to Deontic Logic

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We saw above that Kant's Law, when represented as
**OB***p* → ◊*p*, is a theorem of
KT*d*. If we interpret possibility here as practical
possibility, then as the indebtedness example above suggests, it is
far from evident that it is in fact true. However, a stronger claim
than that of Kant's Law is that something cannot be obligatory unless
it is at least *logically* possible. In SDL, this might be
expressed by the rule:

If ~pthen ~OBp.

This is derivable in SDL, since if
~*p*, then
**OB**~*p* by **OB**-NEC, and then by
**OB**-NC, we get
~**OB***p*. Claiming that Romeo is obligated to
square the circle because he solemnly promised Juliet to do so is less
convincing as an objection than the earlier financial indebtedness
case. So SDL is somewhat better insulated from this sort of objection,
and, as we noted earlier, we are confining ourselves here to theories
that endorse **OB**-OD (i.e.,
~**OB**⊥).^{[1]}

However, this points to another puzzle for SDL. The rule above is
equivalent to
**OB**-OD in any system with **OB**-RE, and
in fact, in the context of SDL, these are both equivalent to
**OB**-NC. That is, we could replace the latter axiom
with either of the former rules for a system equivalent to SDL. In
particular, in any system with *K* and RM,
(**OB**p & **OB**~*p*) ↔
**OB**⊥ is a
theorem.^{[2]}
But it seems odd that there is no distinction between a contradiction
being obligatory, and having two distinct conflicting obligations. It
seems that one can have a conflict of obligations without it being
obligatory that some logically impossible state of affairs obtains. A
distinction seems to be lost here. Separating **OB**-NC
from **OB**-D is now quite routine in conflict-allowing
deontic logics.

Some early discussions and attempted solutions to the last two
problems can be found in Chellas 1980 and Schotch and Jennings 1981,
both of whom use non-normal modal logics for deontic
logic.^{[3]}
Brown 1996a uses a similar approach to Chellas' for modeling
conflicting obligations, but with the addition of an ordering relation
on obligations to model the relative stringency of obligations, thus
moving in the direction of a model addressing Plato's Dilemma as
well.

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Paul McNamara mcnamara.p@comcast.net |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy