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Notes to Intergenerational Justice
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1. See Mill (1969), ch. 5.

2. In the following I will speak of moral rights rather than legitimate claims, but nothing hinges on this as long as it is understood that having a legitimate claim implies another person's or persons' standing under the correlative duty to respond to the claim.

3. Barry (1977), 243-44; Barry (1989), 189.

4. Parfit (1984), part IV; Heyd (1992).

5. See Cowen and Parfit (1992), 148.

6. See, for example, Birnbacher (1988), 140-72, 175-79; Jonas' notion of a “Heuristik der Furcht” (heuristics of fear) in (1979), 63-64. Another issue is whether we have reasons to discount the future in the sense of discounting future persons' well-being. See, for example, Cowen and Parfit (1992); Broome (1994).

7. Partly due to these features as well as the unchangeable asymmetry in power-relation between currently living people and remote future generations, currently living people's compliance with their obligations to remote future people is likely to be less reliable. See, for example, Meyer (2000).

8. De George (1981), 161; see also Macklin (1981), 151-52.

9. But see Partridge (1990), 54-55 (suggesting that future people have rights in the present).

10. See Hoerster (1991), 98-102.

11. See Schwartz (1978); Kavka (1982); Parfit (1984), part iv.

12. A probabilistic and a necessarian reading of this “fact” (see Parfit's “Time-Dependence Claim” ((1984), 351-52) can be distinguished and, thus, of the scope of the non-identity problem. According to the necessarian reading it matters that the same person or people could have existed had we not carried out the act or policy. Whether it is in fact likely or unlikely to have happened does not matter. According to the probabilistic reading, if it was extremely unlikely and the probability was close to zero, it is reasonable to hold that the same person would not have existed. The latter view can be attributed to Parfit ((1984), 352). For discussion whether it normatively matters that genetically identical people can be brought about by different acts and under different circumstances, see Simmons (1995), 178-79; Roberts (1998), sects. 3.4 and 3.5.; Gosseries (2000), ch. ii. In this entry we follow Parfit in holding that currently living people can face different people choices and in explaining this factual claim by relying on a probabilistic understanding of the genetic identity view.

13. Many contributions on what we owe to future people concentrate on what Parfit calls “same people choices” ((1984), 355-56), i.e., such decision-situations in which we assume that future people's existence, identity and number are not contingent upon our decisions.

14. Narveson (1967); see also Narveson (1973); Parfit (1976).

15. See Heyd (1992), chs. 1 and 4. Whether future people can be said to and have a right to non-existence under certain circumstances is the central issue of “wrongful life” cases, which are to be distinguished from both “wrongful birth” and “wrongful pregnancy” cases. The latter two concern interests of parents in not giving birth to a defective child and in not having an unwanted pregnancy, respectively. “Wrongful life” cases concern the interests of children in not being brought into existence under certain circumstances.

16. See Govier (1979), 111.

17. See Heyd (1992), 96-97.

18. On how to understand the relevant threshold see nn. 36-42 and accompanying text. To define such a threshold we do not have to compare the value of such a life with the value of non-existence (see nn. 29-34 and accompanying text).

19. It is beyond the scope of the entry to work out an interpretation of harm that specifies the necessary and sufficient conditions for wrongful harming. See Feinberg (n. 35).

20. See Heyd (1992), 102, 105-06, 241-42.

21. Parfit (1984), 487.

22. For problems with this account, see Heyd (1992), 59-60.

23. Parfit (1984), part iv, and especially ch. 17.

24. For a defense of the view that certain types of inactions, namely omissions, can be harmful see, e.g., Feinberg (1984), ch. 4.

25. For the distinctions see Parfit (1984), 487-90; Woodward (1986), 818; Morreim (1988), 23; Fishkin (1991); Fishkin (1992), 63-64; Shiffrin (1999). For the wording of these notions of harm see Pogge (2003).

26. The formulation may be misleading in suggesting that by t2 we refer to a moment of a person's life. Rather, the readings of harm as distinguished in this entry should be understood to allow for differing interpretations of the relevant unit of well-being (e.g., the life of the affected person as a whole or future periods of her life). For discussions of how to interpret and measure the well-being of people see Griffin (1986), part i; Hurka (1993), ch. 6; Scanlon (1998), ch. 3.

27. “Acted with respect to this person” is meant to include the act that causes this person's existence. It is difficult to interpret such acts as interactions. We prefer “had we not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all” to David Gauthier's “in our absence” (Gauthier (1986), 203-05). Both formulations are problematic and it is beyond the scope of this entry to discuss their respective problems at length. Gauthier himself points out that his formulation runs into difficulty in dealing with situations in which a person has assumed a certain social role, e.g., the role of a life-guard that is, in part, defined by positive duties vis-a-vis others. If a person assumes such a role her “absence” in a situation where she is duty-bound to intervene can render the situation of others worse (ibid., 205). For the formulation we prefer it seems plausible to suggest that assuming such a role does constitute an “interaction” of the then duty-bound person with those to whom she is bound where fulfilling the duties of her role is concerned.

28. This is why this type of notion of harm is also called identity-independent. See Fishkin (1991); Fishkin (1992), 63-64.

29. This is assuming that to compare an existing person's current state of well-being with the state of this person had the person not been conceived is to compare an existing person's current state with this person's “never existing”.

30. Heyd (1992), 37 and see 113.

31. But see Roberts (1998), 151 (assigning zero-value to never having existed).

32. See Nagel (1979), 8-9.

33. Raz (2001), 85.

34. How to compare the value of prenatal nonexistence with death for a living person is a different issue. See Kamm (1993), 36; Raz (2001), 90-92.

35. Feinberg (1984), 102, suggests that the inapplicability of notion (II) precludes “criminal liability for ‘wrongful conception’”. According to Feinberg, in the context of the criminal law “harming someone” should presuppose worsening a person's condition, i.e. setting back a person's interests. Thus, Feinberg does not consider our notion (III) a notion of harm to be applied in delineating criminal liability. However, in his analysis the afflicted child in wrongful life cases was “wronged” (ibid. and 34-35) by having been deprived of his “birth rights” (ibid., 99) and “the wrongful progenitors ... should ... be held civilly liable to pay damages to the child” (ibid., 102). Feinberg (1990), 327, proposes “a clear categorical exception” to his (liberal) interpretation of the criminal law for “malicious or reckless conceptions”, i.e., cases in which a child is “born with a serious and permanent impairment -- though not one that is so serious that the child would prefer even nonexistence to it -- ” (325) and the parents could have easily avoided having a child in an impaired condition. Feinberg suggests that such cases “can in principle be legitimately proscribed by the criminal law even though they harm no one in the sense required by the harm principle.” (327) See also Feinberg (1990), 27-33.

36. See Casal (forthcoming), ch. 1.

37. Shiffrin (1999), 123-24; McMahan (1998), 223-29.

38. Whether we wrongfully inflict non-comparative harms on a person by causing this person's existence is normally understood to depend upon certain aspects of the identity of this person: we cause such harm by bringing a person to existence only if this person's postnatal potential of development and his life span are drastically reduced (Kavka (1982), 105-06) and especially so if the person experiences pain (Harris (1991), 65-66; Schöne-Seifert and Krüger (1993), 257-58). However, Shiffrin (1999) suggests that causing people to exist is prima facie objectionable regardless of the particular identity of the person. Since causing someone to exist always causes the person to have interests that will be frustrated and since the frustration of some of these interests is attributable to the act that caused the person's existence, causing a person to exist always inflicts some non-comparative harms. In her understanding this is objectionable because the person cannot consent and these harms are not necessary to prevent a greater harm. If this is to violate the person's right and this fact cannot be outweighed or justified by the goods that the person is also caused to have, then it is objectionable to have caused the person to exist.

39. Barry (1977), 248; Barry (1989), 347; Barry (1995), 195.

40. For a recent discussion see Marmor (2003); Steiner (2003); and Raz's response (2003).

41. Sher (1979), 389.

42. See, for example, Barry (1999).

43. This is a variation of Derek Parfit's example of “The 14-Year-Old Girl”. See Parfit (1984), 358, 364.

44. Woodward (1986), 815, fn. 12; Woodward (1987), 808-09.

45. See n. 26.

46. See Parfit's “same number quality claim” (principle Q) in Parfit (1984), 360; Kavka (1982), 98-99.

47. See n. 26.

48. See n. 29 and accompanying text.

49. Even if one accepted the subjunctive-different-person understanding of harm (IV) for same number cases, this would not provide a solution in the different number cases. See Parfit (1984), part iv.

50. Rawls (1971) and (rev. edition 1999), especially para 44; Rawls (1993), 274; Rawls (2001), especially para 49.2 and 3.

51. Rawls (2001), 159.

52. For a comparative assessment of Rawls's substantive principle see Gosseries (2001).

53. Rawls (1971), para 22.

54. Rawls (1971), 291. For a critique of this claim see Gosseries (2001), 318-19. For a critique of Rawls's related claim, namely, that the difference principle is inapplicable in the transnational context (Rawls (1999), 113-20), see Pogge, (1994), especially 211-14.

55. Rawls (1993), 274; Rawls (2001), para 25.2.

56. Rawls (1993), 274, fn. 12. For criticisms of his proposal in (1971), see Hubin (1976/77), 70-83; English, (1977), 91-104; Heyd (1992), 41-51.

57. Rawls (1971), 144-45.

58. Rawls (1971), ch. vi.

59. Rawls (1993), 274; Rawls (2001), 160.

60. Rawls does not discuss the question of whether, and in what ways, the just savings principle might be sensitive to the number of people who will live in the future -- however, how many people will live in the future seems clearly to matter for determining how much we should save. See Heyd (1992), 47; Dasgupta (1994); Casal and Williams (1995); Barry (1999), 107-11; Gosseries (2001), 330-33. the just savings principle could indirectly be sensitive to the number of future people: it would at very least be unjust to choose those further futures in which more people exist than there are resources for just institutions. By not discussing the relevance of the number of future people for the specification of the just savings rate, Rawls might best be understood to have bracketed the non-identity problem. Nor has Rawls addressed the question of how we should respond to the impact of past generations' not having saved at just rates. See Dasgupta (1994), 107-08.

61. Parfit (1984), 355-56.

62. De-Shalit (1995), ch. 1; Meyer (1997).

63. However, this will depend upon the substantive content of the conception of non-comparative harm. One can hold the view that currently living people's concerns for the well-being of actual future people are fully captured by the substantive content of the conception of non-comparative harm. But see sec. 6.

64. Meyer (1997), 139-41.

65. Baier (1981); Meyer (1997), 141-50.

66. It is worth noting that in discussing the combined view, it is superfluous to consider notion (II): when notion (II) is applicable, notion (III) is applicable as well; notion (II) is applicable when counterfactual considerations play no role in the application of notion (III).

67. For this example see McMahan (1998), 221-22. As used here, the example presupposes that if the person had not died, this would have been better for her even though she would have been disfigured. Saying this does not require, that we compare the value of the state of being dead to the value of continuing to exist for the person in question. See Raz (2001), 85.

68. As opposed to what people could perfectly well do if they chose to and made a serious effort.

69. Of course, not only our (CV) as stated above fulfills this requirement. Any combined view that entails notion of harm at (I) as a sufficient condition for causing harm will fulfill this requirement. Thomas W. Pogge suggested to me an understanding of the combined view that gives priority to the subjunctive-historical notion of harm: (CV*) Having acted in a certain way (or having forborne from acting in that way) at a time t1, we thereby harm someone only if either (III) we cause this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had we not interacted with this person at all; or this test is inapplicable and (I) we cause this person's life to fall below some specified standard, and, if we cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, do not minimize the harm. For discussion see nn. 71 and 74.

70. Parfit (1984), 367.

71. According to (CV*) (see n. 69) only one set of conditions (as specified by each reading of harm) can obtain. (CV*) might also imply that it makes a moral difference which test we cancel: It might well make a moral difference which reason we have for objecting to cancel either test. However, (CV*) will not give us two reasons for objecting to cancelling pregnancy testing. Thus, we could not interpret the supposed difference in terms of there being two reasons for objecting to cancel the pregnancy testing and just one reason for objecting to cancel preconception testing.

72. It is assumed here that in the context of taking a decision on whether or not to treat the fetuses, the fetuses are actual future people (see sec. 2). In other words, the treatment of the fetuses will not have compositional effects as might be induced by post-conception genetic interventions. For the feasibility of such post-conception genetic therapy and surgery and their implications for interpreting wrongful life claims, see Buchanan, Brock, Daniels, and Wikler (2000), 6 and ch. 6. If pregnancy testing leads to post-conception intervention that has compositional effects, Parfit's two medical programs become indistinguishable with respect to the applicability of the comparative notion of harm.

73. For the distinction between and a discussion of these two versions of the No-Difference View, see Woodward (1986), sects. II and III; Parfit, (1986), 856-59.

74. Note that (CV*) (see n. 69) is also incompatible with the theoretical reading of the No-Difference View: According to (CV*) we have different (but not additional) reasons for objecting to the harming of actual people.

75. There are other reasons for preferring the combined over the exclusive view. The combined view is compatible with the central understanding of harm and compensation as these notions are normally understood in tort law. In cases which do not involve the non-identity problem and in which the harmful act reduces the well-being of the victim to a level that is still above the threshold, the comparative notion of harm provides the relevant standard for restitution and compensation.

76. For the claims of descendants of slaves in the USA see, for example, Bedau (1972); Boxill (1992); Brooks (1999), parts 6 and 7; Soyinka (1999), 44-69; Fullinwider (2000); Lyons (2003). For an analysis of the relevance of historical injustice for claims of groups to political self-determination or autonomy see, for example, Buchanan (1991); Brilmayer (1991); Thompson (1990); Kymlicka (1999); Gans (2001); Meyer (2001).

77. See Fishkin (1991), 91-93.

78. People can be harmed by events, say, by a natural catastrophe. The following reasoning applies when such an event occurs before the person who makes the claim to being compensated owing to the event comes into existence.

79. We cannot rely on the diachronic notion at (II) either. It presupposes that we can attribute a state of well-being to the descendant at the time his or her ancestors are being wronged.

80. The relevance and importance of the forward-looking assessment of the normative significance of past wrongs has been stressed by, for example, Lyons (1977); Waldron (1992); Ackerman (1992), 72-73; Ackerman (1997). For a theory of justice that grounds our obligations in backward-looking reasoning see Nozick ((1974), 152-53). The theory relies upon counterfactual reasoning. For critique see Lyons (1977); Sher (1992); Waldron (1992). For epistemic reasons only, Nozick proposes Rawls's difference principle -- a forward-looking principle, specifying what the future should be like -- as a “rough rule of thumb for rectifying” historical injustice ((1974), 231). This idea does not address the problem of the inapplicability of a non-comparative notion of harm as discussed in the text. For alternative impersonal interpretations of how the past matters normatively, see Vallentyne (1988); Hill (1990/91); Feldman (1997), chs. 1, 4.

81. “Das vergangene Unrecht ist geschehen und abgeschlossen. Die Erschlagenen sind wirklich erschlagen.” In a letter to Walter Benjamin 1937, as quoted in Tiedemann (1983), 107.

82. See Mulgan (1999), 54-55.

83. See Feinberg (1980); Feinberg (1977), 301-02.

84. See Gosseries (2000), ch. iv, sects. 4-5.

85. See Wellman (1995), 155-57.

86. See n. 2.

87. Partridge (1981), 259-61, discusses the example of Alfred Nobel and defends a rule-utilitarian reading of death-bed promises.

88. See also Meyer (1997), 141-43.

89. See Waluchow (1986), 734.

90. See Ruben (1988), 223-31.

91. Ruben (1988), 217, fn. 7, understands this be a sufficient condition.

92. Ruben (1988), 216-17, 223. In the following I will speak of relational and non-relational changes. The former change brings about that an object has a relational property the object did not have before; the latter brings about that an object has a non-relational property the object did not have before.

93. Ruben (1988), 230.

94. Ruben (1988), 224, 231.

95. Ruben (1988), 232, 236.

96. It is beyond the scope of this entry to provide an interpretation of how undergoing non-real changes can be relevant for quality of the life of a person. See Aristotle (1984), 1738-40 (Nicomachean Ethics, 1100a-1101b); Kagan (1994). For a reconstruction of the Aristotelian position see Solomon (1976); Goldstick (1988). For discussion of whether and in what sense posthumous states and events can affect the quality of the life of a person Silverstein (1980), 413-21; Bigelow, Campbell, Pargeter (1990); Feldman (1992); Lamont (1998).

97. See Meyer (2001), sec. 8.

98. For a comparison of the memorials for the victims of the Shoa in Poland, Germany and Israel, see Young (1988), 1799-811.

99. See Nozick (1993), chs. 1 and 2.

100. Anderson (1993) provides a theory of expressive reasoning and the relation between expressive reasoning and consequentialist reasoning.

101. “Never again!” -- which is also the title of the reports of the Argentine (1984) truth commission, of the report that was secretly prepared in Brazil (1985) as well as of the Uruguayan report of non-governmental organizations (1989). See Nino (1996), 78-82; Weschler (1990), part i, and 235.

102. For example, the Roma (Gypsies) were victims of a racially motivated genocide committed by the Nazis -- a truth that has been long denied with the result that most surviving victims as well as the descendants of those murdered were excluded from compensation and restitution. See Meyer (2001), 269.

103. See, e.g., Thompson (2002) who discusses the reasons for attributing such an obligation to current members of ongoing political societies (e.g., states) whose previous members committed egregious wrongs in the name of the society and with harmful consequences for currently living people.

104. For detailed comments and criticisms on a number of drafts I would like to thank Thomas W. Pogge. For discussion of early drafts of most sections I am grateful to Brian Barry and David Heyd. Rachel Brown edited my English and improved the presentation of the arguments in numerous ways. I would also like to thank Brian Bix, Tony Daniel and Barbara Reiter.

Copyright © 2003
Lukas Meyer
Universität Bremen

Notes to Intergenerational Justice
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy