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Identity Through Time

Irving Copi once defined the problem of identity through time by noting that the following two statements both seem true but appear to be inconsistent:
  1. If a changing thing really changes, there can't literally be one and the same thing before and after the change.
  2. However, if a changing thing literally remains one and the same thing (i.e., retains its identity) throughout the change, then it can not really have changed.

Traditionally, this puzzle has been solved in various ways. Aristotle, for example, distinguished between “accidental” and “essential” changes. Accidental changes are ones that don't result in a change in an objects' identity after the change, such as when a house is painted, or one's hair turns gray, etc. Aristotle thought of these as changes in the accidental properties of a thing. Essential changes, by contrast, are those which don't preserve the identity of the object when it changes, such as when a house burns to the ground and becomes ashes, or when someone dies. Armed with these distinctions, Aristotle would then say that, in the case of accidental changes, (1) and (2) are both false—a changing thing can really change one of its “accidental properties” and yet literally remain one and the same thing before and after the change.

Of course, this solution to the puzzle depends on there being a coherent distinction between accidental and essential changes, and between accidental and essential properties. Some philosophers find this distinction problematic and have developed other solutions that don't require this distinction. In what follows, we discuss these solutions to the puzzle, along with other puzzles that arise when considering the identity of objects over time.


1. Introduction

As a number of philosophers have remarked, one of the many puzzles about identity, given its apparent simplicity, is why it proves so puzzling. Indeed, one pervasive sentiment is that identity cannot pose any philosophical problems. Anything that looks like a problem about identity must really be a problem about something else. David Lewis gives striking expression to this sentiment when he says “More important, we should not suppose that we have here any problem about identity. We never have. Identity is utterly simple and unproblematic. Everything is identical to itself; nothing is ever identical to anything except itself. There is never any problem about what makes something identical to itself; nothing can ever fail to be.” (Lewis 1986).

Despite that, problems about identity appear to play a central role in a large number of philosophical issues whose discussion dates back to the ancient world. One of the most venerable concerns identity and change. Things change, but remain the same. The same poker is at one time hot, another time cold. How can something be both identical and different from one time to another? At first sight this problem evaporates once we draw the time honored distinction between numerical and qualitative identity. To say that a and b are qualitatively identical is to say is to say that a exactly resembles b. To say that a and b are numerically identical is, at least, to say a and b are one thing and not two. Whether a and b can have all their qualities in common without being numerically identical is controversial. Nevertheless, it seems that a and b can be numerically identical without being qualitatively identical by having different qualities at different times.

Some find problematic the very same thing having different properties at different times (see the problem of temporary intrinsics discussed below). Setting that general problem aside, there are special cases of it that generate some of the most intractable issues about identity. One results from persisting things putatively having different parts at different times. Consider an object capable of changing its parts, such as a cup at a time when its handle is still attached. At that time the cup appears to consist of the following two parts: a smaller one, its handle, together with a larger one consisting of the rest of the cup. Call the larger of these parts the truncated cup. The cup, otherwise unscathed, proceeds to lose its handle. At the earlier time, with its handle still intact, the cup is surely distinct from the truncated cup. Later, after the removal of the cup's handle, the cup spatially coincides with the truncated cup. Each object is, at the later time, composed from exactly the same atoms. As one philosopher has put it about a different example, at the later time the cup and the truncated cup are as alike as one pea in a pod (Denis Robinson, in conversation). Should we say that the cup and truncated cup are earlier distinct, but later identical? The problem is that saying so arguably conflicts with a fundamental principle governing identity called Leibniz's Law.

Identity looms large in Leibniz's philosophy. He is responsible for articulating two principles that, he claims, are constitutive of identity. The first, more controversial, of these, called the identity of indiscernibles, says that qualitative indiscernibility implies identity. The second, often referred to as Leibniz's Law or the Indiscernibility of Identicals, says that identity implies qualitative indiscernibility. According to Leibniz's Law, if a is identical with b, every quality of a will be a quality of b.

Here are two ways in which, it seems, saying that the cup is earlier distinct from, but later identical with, the truncated cup conflicts with Leibniz's Law. Ostensibly one of the cup's later properties is having earlier had a handle. That is the property the truncated cup never has. So, identifying the later cup and truncated cup appears to violate Leibniz's Law. There is, at least, one property, having formerly had a handle, that the cup and truncated cup never have in common.

Here is a second way in which the claim that the cup and truncated cup are sometimes, but not always, identical appears to violate Leibniz's Law. Let us bestow a name on the cup. Call it ‘Cup’. Let us also call the truncated cup ‘Tcup’. We are envisaging that Cup is sometimes, but not always, identical with Tcup. Leibniz's Law tells us that Cup and Tcup share all their properties at any time they are identical. Some properties are commonly referred to as modal properties. A modal property is the property of possibly or necessarily having some further property. Modal properties include such properties as being possibly red, necessarily extended, possibly taller than a giraffe, or necessarily cup shaped. Arguably one of Cup's modal properties is the property of being necessarily identical with Cup. Suppose Cup and Tcup are at some time identical. In that case, by Leibniz's Law, Tcup will, at some time, share with Cup the modal property of being necessarily identical with Cup. So, if Cup is ever identical with Tcup, then Tcup has the modal property of being necessarily identical with Cup. But if Tcup is necessarily identical with Cup, there can be no time when Tcup is distinct from Cup.

Let us say that the identity of a with b is temporary if a is sometimes, but not always, identical with b. Later we shall look at other types of puzzle cases that provide some motivation for countenancing temporary identity. Despite the existence of such cases the majority of philosophers are reluctant, principally because of the putative conflict with Leibniz's Law, to allow temporary identity. Instead, to deal with puzzles about identity through time a wide range of alternatives have been proposed. These include: maintaining that Cup is later constituted by Tcup (where constitution does not imply identity): denying that Tcup is earlier a proper part of Cup; maintaining that Cup and Tcup are never identical, but only share a later temporal part in common; holding that the identity between the earlier Tcup and later Cup is not literal, but only loose and popular.

By synchronic identity we mean an identity holding at a single time. By diachronic identity we mean an identity holding between something existing at one time and something existing at another. One question is whether synchronic and diachronic identity are different kinds of identity. Some philosophers are willing to countenance different kinds of identity. Others are reluctant to do so. One philosopher who is willing to postulate a multiplicity of different kinds of identity is Peter Geach. Geach, among others, has addressed puzzles about both synchronic and diachronic identity by denying that there is a single absolute relation of identity rather than a host of relative identity relations. On this view we cannot simply say that a is identical with b. Instead there must be a concept of a kind of thing, a so called sortal concept, that serves to answer the question: a is the same what as b? This is so, according to the champions of relative identity, because the following can happen: a and b both fall under the sortal concepts F and G, a is the same F as b, but a is not the same G as b (Geach 1967).

Consider the case of Cup and Tcup. Is Cup at the later time t′ identical with Tcup? Is Tcup at t′ identical with Tcup at t? A relative identity theorist would deny that these questions have answers. For such a theorist to have an answerable question we would need to replace, for example, the first with: At t′ is Cup the same cup as Tcup?

How could insisting on the relativity of the answer to an identity question to a kind help with the diachronic identity puzzle posed by Cup and Tcup? Here is one way that it could. Suppose that nothing is a cup when it is a proper part of a cup. Then Tcup fails to qualify as a cup at t when it is a proper part of Cup. In that case a relative identity theorist can say the following. At the later time t′ Cup is the same cup as Tcup. Since Tcup is not a cup at the earlier time t, neither Cup not Tcup at t′ is the same cup as Tcup at t. Moreover, for any kind K, Cup is not the same K at Tcup at t. Identifying Cup with Tcup as the same cup at t′ places us under no constraint to identify Cup with one of its proper parts, Tcup, at t.

Some of those who reject relative identity nevertheless accept that a cannot be identical with b, unless there is a more specific answer to the question whether a is the same thing as b. Many philosophers distinguish between two kinds of concepts which are applicable to whatever can persist through time. One kind is illustrated by the concepts of gold (as opposed to a quantity or piece of gold), snow, or rain. In the case of any such concept F, there is no answer to the question: how many Fs are there? In contrast, in the case of other concepts such as the concept of a horse, a tall person, an artwork, or a statue there is an answer to the question: how many Fs are there? For example, though we may not know it, there is an answer to the question: how many statues are there? Concepts of this last kind are often referred to as sortal concepts. Those who take the view that the question whether a is the same as b is illegitimate, unless it is construed as elliptical for the question whether a is the same thing of such and such a kind as b typically also hold the following views. We should distinguish between two types of sortal concepts: phase and substance sortals. A phase sortal such as child, utensil or prize is a concept that something can cease to fall under without ceasing to exist. If, in contrast, something falls under a substance sortal, it must always do so. If a at some time t is the same as b at the same, or a different time t′, it must, say advocates of the view in question, be that, for some sortal S, a at t is the same S as b at t′. For example, if John's favorite artwork at t is identical with Sally's most valuable possession at t′, there must be a substance sortal, the concept of a statue as it may be, under which John's favorite artwork at t, and Sally's most valuable possession at t′ both fall. Moreover, a substance sortal is said to go together with a criterion of identity where a criterion of identity associated with substance sortal S is, inter alia, a criterion for some earlier S being the same S as some later S.

Finally, there are a group of issues that fall under the heading of the dispensability of identity. According to one tradition that goes back, at least, to Wittgenstein's Tractatus, we can theoretically dispense with identity talk without loss of information. Some, but by no means all, who take this view, do so because they hold that the predicate ‘is identical with’ corresponds to no genuine property. Issues about the dispensability of identity engage with issues about identity across time in the following way. This section opened with a quote from David Lewis claiming that there is never any philosophical problem about identity. The case of Cup and Tcup rises what is ostensibly a problem about identity across time. That problem only arises, it seems, because the later Cup is putatively identical with the earlier Tcup. If the problem is not, in part, about that putative identity holding, what is it about?

A four dimensionalist like Lewis would not hesitate to give the following answer. The problem is, in part, a problem about whether a cup like object that exists only at t′ is suitably related to a cup like object, itself a proper part of a larger cup like object, that exists only at t so that both cup like objects are temporal stages or parts of a four dimensionally extended cup.

If we are not prepared to endorse four dimensionalism, it remains to be seen how the putative problem about Cup and Tcup's identity through time can be reformulated so that it is no longer a problem about identity through time.

2. Identity and Change

2.1 Diachronic and Synchronic Identity

It is customary to distinguish identity at a time from identity across time. An example of an identity holding at a single time is: the table in the next room is (now) identical with my favorite table. An example of an identity holding across different times is: The table in the next room is identical with the one you purchased last year. Diachronic identities pose some of the most intractable problems about identity. Before looking at those problems, and some of the most frequently proposed solutions to them, let us ask whether there is anything that distinguishes identity from other relations.

The most commonly agreed on distinguishing feature of identity is that it conforms to the Indiscernibility of identicals, what was earlier called Leibniz's Law. Taking ‘∀F’ to be a quantifier ranging over properties, here is one way to formulate Leibniz's Law:

LL: ∀xy[x=y → ∀F(FxFy)]

LL says that if x is identical with y, then any property of x is a property of y. More controversial is the following linguistic counterpart of LL:

Substitutivity: For any pair of sentences S and S′, if S results from S′ solely by the substitution of co-referring expressions (expressions referring to the same thing), then S has the same truth value as S′.

Here is an illustration of Substitutivity. ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’ refer to the same Roman orator. Substitutivity tells us that if ‘Cicero is an orator’ is true, so is ‘Tully is an orator’. Substitutivity can be seen as the linguistic counterpart of LL for the following reason. Suppose we think of a predicate as the result of removing one or more referring expressions from a sentence, and suppose we allow that every predicate corresponds to a property. In that case we will think that Cicero is identical with Tully only if the predicate ‘is an orator’ applies to each one. Moreover, given that ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’ co-refer, it is tempting to think that the predicate ‘is an orator’ applies to both Cicero and Tully only if the sentences ‘Cicero is an orator’ and ‘Tully is an orator’ have the same truth value. That is why a violation of Substitutivety may appear to imply a violation of LL.

2.2 Identity as an Equivalence Relation

A relation R is reflexive if each thing stands in R to itself. It is symmetrical if a's standing in R to b implies that b stands in R to a. It is transitive if a's standing in R to b and b's likewise standing in R to c together imply that a stands in R to c. Identity is trivially reflexive. Each thing trivially stands in the relation of identity to itself. That identity is also symmetrical and transitive follows from Leibniz's Law. Suppose identity fails to be symmetrical, and for some a and b, a is identical with b, but b is not identical with a. In that case, a has a property, being identical with b, which b fails to have. Suppose identity is not transitive, and, for some a, b and c, a is identical with b and b is identical with c, but a is not identical with c. In that case b has a property, being identical with c, that a lacks.

2.3 Leibniz's Law and the Possibility of Change: The Problem of Temporary Intrinsics

Identity through time generates a number of problems posed by puzzle cases such as the case of Cup and Tcup. Later we will review a number of solutions to those problems offered in the literature. One problem about identity through time is not raised by consideration of puzzle cases. It arises simply because persisting things can change their intrinsic properties. For that reason it has been labeled by David Lewis the problem of temporary intrinsics.[1]

Roughly the distinction between extrinsic and intrinsic properties amounts to this. A property F is an extrinsic property of an object O if O having F implies that something distinct from, and not a proper part of, O exists. For example, being married to Sally is an extrinsic property of John's since John can only have that property if something, Sally, distinct from, and not a proper part, of him exists. A property F is an intrinsic property of O if and only if O having F is compatible with nothing apart from O and its proper parts existing, and also compatible with something apart from O existing. For example, the property of being round is an intrinsic property because a surface S having that property is compatible with nothing other than S and its proper parts existing.[2]

Suppose some object, a metal plate we will call Plate, changes from being round at t1 to being square at t2. How can that be? After all, though something can have a round part and a square part, nothing can be round and square. No problem, you might say. Nothing can be round and square at a single time, place and world. But something can be round at one time and square at another.

According to Lewis the original problem of temporary intrinsics remains, unless we can show how something can have incompatible properties at different times. To show how that can be so we need to give, at least a partial, answer to the following question. What is it for something to have a property at a time?

Lewis considers three answers to this question. According to the first for some object O to be F at t is for the relation of being F to tenselessly, or timelessly, hold between O and time t. For example, for Plate to be round at t1 is for the two-place relation of being round at to hold between Plate and t1. Something can stand in the relation of being round at to the earlier time t1 without standing in that relation to the later time t2. So there is no reason to think that standing in the relation of being round at to t1 is incompatible with standing in the relation of being square at to t2. By transmuting the ostensibly one place relational properties of being round and being square into the two place relational properties of being round at and being square at we can show how something can be round at one time and square at another.

Lewis' principle objection to this first solution is that it transforms intrinsic into extrinsic properties. He takes it as evident that properties such as being round and being red are intrinsic. Why so? Call the view that putatively one place intrinsic properties are two place relational properties the relational view. Why does Lewis so adamantly reject that view? One difficulty with answering this question is a difficulty about locating the source of Lewis' disquiet with the relational view.

Is it that Lewis rejects the relational view because it treats putatively intrinsic properties as extrinsic, or because it discerns an extra place in a putatively monadic property? That it is the latter is suggested by the following. The problem of temporary intrinsics appears to arise because nothing can have the intrinsic properties of being round and being square, unless it has those properties at different times. The same goes for pairs of extrinsic properties. The property of being the same height as the Eiffel Tower is extrinsic as is the property of being different in height from the Eiffel Tower. Something can change from being the same height as the Eiffel Tower to being different in height from that structure even though nothing can simultaneously have the properties of being the same height as, and being different in height from, the Eiffel Tower. Suppose we say that something can be the same height as the Eiffel Tower at some time t1 without being the same height as the Eiffel tower at some distinct time t2. In that case we appear to be confronted with the same problem as the one that originally raised the problem of temporary intrinsics. We are confronted with the task of explaining what it is for something to have, in this case, the property of being the same height as the Eiffel Tower at time t1. If we respond, it is for the three place relation of being the same height as at to hold between some object, the Eiffel Tower, and time t1 we are, treating an ostensibly two place relation as a three place one even though we are not treating an intrinsic property as extrinsic.

Lewis considers an alternative explanation of what it is for an object to have a property at a time. What might be called the ‘according to’ explanation. We are used to something having a property according to one story, but failing to have that property according to another. If we think of a time as a set of propositions describing what holds at that time, we can say that according to one such set plate is round, but according to another it is square.

Lewis gives the according to explanation short shrift. We may think it cannot be so readily dismissed if it is combined with a view about existence and time that has received considerable discussion in recent years. The view is called Presentism. On the Presentist view the only things that exist without qualification are things that presently exist. Suppose t1, a time when plate is round, is the present. In that case if Plate is ever square it will be, or was square. What is it for Plate to be round? Given that plate is presently round what makes it the case that Plate is round is not just that Plate is round according to some set of propositions about the present. Instead what makes it the case that Plate is presently round is that plate exists and is round. So, what makes it the case that Plate, say, will be square? Not, the Presentist will say, this: Plate tenselessly or timelessly exists, and will be square. So what makes it the case that Plate will be square? Perhaps this. What makes it true that Plate will be square is that Plate is square according to some relevant future tensed presently existing propositions.

Whether or not a Presentist wishes to take over in this way the ‘according to’ explanation, Presentism provides a solution to the problem of temporary intrinsics. Presentists can deny that it follows from something at one time being round that will at another time be square that there exists something both round and square.

Lewis, we saw, denies that a sentence such as ‘Plate is square at t1’ states something true just in case Plate stands in the square at relation to t1. In his original exposition of the problem of temporary intrinsics, Lewis does not consider a variety of other ways of understanding sentences attributing ostensibly intrinsic properties to objects at times. Here is one. Many take it that a relation of instantiation holds between a property and its instances. Suppose instantiation is not a two place, but, at least, a three place relation holding between an object, property and time. If so, Plate is round at t1 if and only if Plate stands in the instantiation relation to the (non-relational) property of roundness and t1. Moreover Plate standing in the instantiation relation to roundness and t1 is clearly consistent with Plate failing to stand in the instantiation relation to roundness and the different time t2.

Alternative ways of taking ‘a is red at t’ include treating ‘at t’ as an adverbial modifier, or as a sentential operator. According to the first ‘at t’, better written as ‘at t-ly’, is an adverbial modifier specifying the way in which something has a property. So ‘Plate is round at t1’ is true just in case Plate has roundness at-t1-ly. Plate, on this view, can be round at t1, but square at t2 because Plate can have roundness at t1-ly without having roundness at-t2-ly (See Johnston 1987, Haslanger 1989).

According to the temporal operator view ‘at t1’ and ‘at t2’ should be understood as the temporal operators: ‘at t1 it is true that …’ and ‘at t2 it is true that …’. Just as ‘it is possible that: Plate is round’ is consistent with ‘it is possible that: Plate is square’ so ‘at t1 it is true that Plate is round’ is consistent with ‘at t2 it is true that Plate is square’.

Solutions to the problem of temporary intrinsics abound. Here is another that treats being true and being false as three place relations between propositions, facts and times. Consider the propositions:

(i) Plate is round,

And:

(ii) Plate is square.

We should distinguish between a property of a proposition, and a property that is a constituent of a proposition. Being a proposition is a property of (i), but is not a constituent of (i). In contrast, being round is a constituent of (i), but is not a property of (i). Propositions have no shape. Can we hold that (i) and (ii) are both true compatibly with taking roundness and squareness to be intrinsic properties?

It is plausible to suppose that that the truth value of a proposition such as (i) or (ii) depends on the existence of something distinct from that proposition. Since that is so, let us, as some adherents of a correspondence theory of truth would do, allow that if (i), say, is true, it has a relational property of being true. For example being true may be a relation that holds between (i) and the fact that Plate is round.

How many places are there in what we may call the truth relation? It is often though to be a two place relation. Suppose that is wrong, and truth is a three place relation holding between a proposition, fact and time. In that case, the three place relation of truth can hold between (i), the fact that Plate is round, and t1, without holding between (i), the same fact and t2.

Lewis favors a different solution to the problem of temporary intrinsics (Lewis 1986). Whether or not there is a problem with the same object being round and square, there is no problem with the same object having a round part and a square part. To solve the problem of temporary intrinsics, Lewis invokes the view that, in addition to their spatial parts, objects have temporal parts or stages. This allows him to hold that Plate is round at t1 and square at t2 because Plate has a round part at t1 and a square part at t2. Plate's round t1 part exists only at t1, and Plate's square t2 part exists only at t2. Hence there is no problem posed by either temporal part changing its shape. Plate itself is an object consisting of a suitably interrelated sequence of such temporal parts. For the t1 temporal part of Plate to be round is just for it to be round. For the longer lived Plate to be round at t1 is for Plate to be appropriately related to a round temporal part at t1.

As we have seen in invoking temporal parts or stages Lewis endorses one species of what has come to be called Four Dimensionalism. The expression ‘Four Dimensionalism’ has been applied to a number of different positions that it is well to distinguish here since not all of them are relevant to identity across time. ‘Four Dimensionalism’ has sometimes been used for the thesis, particularly associated with Relativity Theory, that time is space like. On another use of ‘Four Dimensionalism’ a persisting thing is identical with its history. On this view an object is a sequence of events. Sometimes ‘Four Dimensionalism’ is used to label the view that, contra Presentism, things past present and future are equally real.

Lewis' version of Four Dimensionalism should be distinguished from all of the above. It is the view that, just as an object such as Plate is extended in space with spatial parts, so it is extended in time with temporal parts.

The problem of temporary intrinsics focuses on the possibility of persisting things changing their properties, or, at least, changing their intrinsic properties. Many of the problems about identity through time are posed by puzzle cases that involve change of parts. Four dimensionalism is one, widely accepted, solution to those puzzles. It is not overstretching it to suggest that each of the puzzle cases we will shortly consider appears to be a case of temporary identity. That is, each one appears to be a case of the following. For some x and y, at some time t x is identical with y, and at some time tx is distinct from y.

In the first section we briefly looked at one argument, the so-called modal argument for the necessity of identities, for denying that there could be temporary identities. Some philosophers have responded to some of the diachronic identity puzzles by maintaining that there could be indeterminate identities. An argument with a similar structure to the modal argument has been deployed to rule out indeterminate identities. Give their implications for identity across time the modal argument and the argument against indeterminate identities are set out in more detail in the next section.

3. Necessary and Determinate Identities

Here are two examples of identity statements:

(i) The table in the next room is (now) identical with my favorite table.

(ii) The table in the next room is identical with the one you purchased last year.

(i) and (ii) are contingent. Even if the table in the next room is my favorite table, it might not have been. Even if the table in the next room is the one you purchased last year, it might not have been. One of the most important discussions of identity is to be found in Saul Kripke's paper ‘Identity and Necessity’ and his book Naming and Necessity (in Munitz 1971, Kripke 1980). One lesson to be learned from Kripke's discussion is that it is illegitimate to infer from identity statements such as (i) and (ii) having their truth value contingently that the relation of identity can hold contingently.

Why is this inference illegitimate? Compare (i) with:

(iii) The table in the next room is the same size as my favorite table.

Being the same size as is an equivalence relation that holds contingently. What does it take for that relation to hold contingently between the table in the next room and my favorite table? Thinking in terms of possible worlds the table in the next room is contingently the same size as my favorite table just in case the following is so. The table in the next room is the same size as my favorite table, but, in some possible world W, something identical to (or a counterpart of) the actual table in the next room is not the same size as what is actually my favorite table.

Without having recourse to possible worlds, what this comes to is that the table in the next room is contingently the same size as my favorite table only if, in addition to (iii), the following is true:

(iv) (∃x)(∃y)[(x = the table in the next room) & (y = my favorite table) & (possibly, x is not the same size as y)].

Likewise the table in the next room is contingently identical with my favorite table only if, in some world W, what is actually my favorite table is not identical with what is actually the table in the next room. That condition need not be satisfied for (i) to be contingently true. All it takes for (i) to be contingently true is that, for example, (i) is true, but in some world W something qualifies as my favorite table without also qualifying as the table in the next room. For that to be so nothing need be identical, or counterpart related, across worlds.

Kripke and Ruth Barcan Marcus offer an argument to show that there are no contingent identities. Here is one version of that argument often referred to as the Modal Argument for the Necessity of Identities:

Suppose:

(1) a=b.

But each thing is necessarily identical with itself. Hence;

(2) □ (a=a)

Taking ‘[λx Φ]’ to mean: being an x such that Φ (where Φ is some logical formula in which ‘x’ is a free variable), we supposedly have:

(3) [λx □(x=a)]a

Since, by Leibniz's Law, if (1) then a and b share all properties in common. Hence (1) and (3) yield:

(4) [λx □(x=a)]b

which in turn yields:

(5) □(a=b).

Though widely accepted this type of argument can be contested. Leibniz's Law (LL) is used to derive step (4)—b has the property of being necessarily identical with a—from step (3), a has the property of being necessarily identical with a. We might deny that there are any such modal properties. Doing so blocks the argument if the application of LL is restricted to properties. Alternatively we might allow that there are such properties as being necessarily identical with a, but deny that (3) follows from (2). On one view all that follows from (2) is that a has the property of being necessarily identical with itself expressed by the predicate ‘[λx x=x]’. We need to distinguish the property of being necessarily identical with itself, which every existent has, from the property of being necessarily identical with a—which only a has (Lowe 1982). Finally, we might reject (2) on the following grounds. There is a well entrenched convention that repeated tokens of the same type of name, constant or variable are assigned the same value. From the existence of this convention it follows that ‘a = a’ expresses a truth. It does not follow that ‘a = a’ expresses something necessarily true. A like observation applies to ‘a is identical with itself’.

Philosophers have appealed to contingent identities to solve identity puzzles. They have also appealed to vague or indeterminate identities to solve such puzzles. Consider a club that over an extended time changes its rules, membership and location. Is the original club identical with the club having a new location, rules and membership? Call the original club the Identity Club, and the club with new rules, membership and location the Constitution Club. Is the following true?:

C: The identity Club = The Constitution Club.

Some would say that that the identity stated by C is vague or indeterminate. What does it mean to say that an identity is vague or indeterminate? At least this. C is not determinately true, or determinately false. If C does lack a determinate truth value, is that enough to ensure that the identity of the clubs referred to by C is indeterminate?

In the case of the identity sentence:

(i) The table in the next room is (now) identical with my favorite table.

we saw the need to distinguish between (i) having its truth value contingently, and (i) stating an identity that holds only contingently. We likewise need to distinguish C having an indeterminate truth value from C stating an identity that holds only indeterminately. C may lack a determinate truth value because one, or both, of the referring expressions ‘The Identity Club’ and ‘The Constitution Club’ lacks a determinate referent. Nevertheless for any determinate choice of referents for those expressions C has a determinate truth value.

Can it happen that the referring expressions ‘a’ and ‘b’ refer precisely in the identity sentence ‘a=b’ without that sentence being determinately true or false? Here is one version of an argument, due to Gareth Evans and Nathan Salmon, that is supposed to show that it cannot (Evans 1978, Salmon 1981). Let ‘Ip’ mean: it is indeterminate whether p, that is p is neither determinately true nor determinately false, and let ‘Dp’ mean: it is determinate that p. We have:

(1′) I(a=b).

But:

(2′) D (a=a).

(2’) yields:

(3′) [λx D(x=a)]a

Suppose:

(4′) a=b

Applying Leibniz's Law to (3′) and (4′) gives:

(5′) [λx D(a=x)]b

from which it follows that:

(6′) D(a=b),

which contradicts (1′). Hence (1′) implies:

(7′) ¬(a=b)

If (7′) is true then it is not true that a is identical with b. So if (7′) is true, a is determinately distinct from b. (1′) cannot be true.

Of course, defenders of indeterminate identity do not let this pass unquestioned. One assumption of the argument is that (7′) implies that a is determinately distinct from b rather than just that a is not determinately identical with b.

4. Diachronic Identity Puzzles

In the introduction we encountered one type of puzzle about identity across time: the case of Cup and Tcup. The puzzle arose because we envisaged Cup losing one of its parts, and coming to have the same material constitution (being, for example, composed of exactly the same atoms as), and spatial boundaries as Tcup. Call this the cup case. Let us say that a and b are coincident at a time t just in case something is a proper part of a at t if and only if it is a proper part of b at that same time. Cup and Tcup are coincident at the later time since something at that later time is, for example, and atomic part of a if and only if it is an atomic part of b.

There are cases that pose similar diachronic identity puzzles that do not involve change of parts. One of the best known involves a lump of clay which, at an earlier time, is coincident with a statue, but, at a later, say as a result of deformation, is just a shapeless lump of clay. Other much discussed cases of putatively distinct things at one time being coincident at another involve fission or fusion. One of the most famous examples of a fission case is provided by the ship of Thesus. Over a long period all of the planks composing a certain ship are replaced one by one. Eventually a ship indiscernible from the original, but composed of entirely different planks, results. Call that later ship Replacement. As each plank is removed from the original ship it is used to construct a ship that is constituted from all and only the planks belonging to the original ship. Call the ship composed of the same planks as the ones initially composing the original ship Reassembly.

Identity is, very plausibly, an equivalence relation [see Section 2.2]. One consequence of it being an equivalence relation is that it is subject to transitivity: the principle that if aRb and bRc, then aRc. Saying that, in the case of Theseus' ship, Replacement and Reassembly are both identical with the original ship putatively conflicts with the transitivity of identity since Replacement seems to be later clearly distinct from Reassembly.

What is the best account of these cases? Here are some of the major ones on offer:

4.1 Constitution

Constitution accounts pivot on the distinction between constitution and identity. Defenders of such accounts hold that constitution, unlike identity, is not an equivalence relation (Baker 2002). Constitution is said to be, at least, non-symmetrical. According to a constitution account, we say the following about the three types of puzzle cases described above. Cup is never identical with Tcup. Later Cup is constituted by Tcup [alternatively: Cup and Tcup never constitute each other, but later are constituted from the very same atoms]. Likewise the lump of clay is never identical with the statue, but earlier only constitutes the statue. Finally, the reassembly ship is never identical, but only constituted from exactly the same planks as, the original.

The constitution view has come in for its share of criticisms. Some think it engages in metaphysical multiple vision, seeing a multiplicity of things at a given place and time where there is plausibly only one. Others argue that constitution is identity (see Noonan 1993).

Relative Identity

Advocates of relative identity deny that there is a single identity relation (see Geach 1967, Griffin 1977). On their view it is improper to ask whether, say, the statue is the same thing as the later lump of clay. Instead we should ask whether it is the same statue, or the same lump of clay. For an advocate of relative identity denying that the earlier statue is the same statue as the later lump of clay is consistent with allowing that the earlier statue is the same lump of clay as the later lump of clay. It is natural for the relative identity theorist to insist on relativising the transitivity of identity to the same sortal concept in the following way. What the relativised transitivity principle says is that: a is the same F as b, and b is the same F as c implies only that a is the same F as c (see Griffin 1977).

One objection to relative identity is that it conflicts with Leibniz's Law. Here is one way in which such conflict may be thought to arise. Consider the property version of Leibniz's Law:

LL: ∀xy[x=y → ∀F(FxFy)]

The relation of identity mentioned in the antecedent of LL is unrelativised to a sortal. To make it acceptable to the relative identity theorist, let us amend LL to:

LLR: ∀xy[∀F(x is the same F as y) → ∀G(GxGy)]

Suppose we replace ‘is the same F as y’ in LLR with ‘is the same lump of clay’, ‘x’ with ‘the earlier statue’, ‘y’ with ‘the later clay lump’, and instantiate the quantifier ∀G with ‘is the same statue as the earlier statue’. We then obtain:

R: the earlier statue is the same lump of clay as the later clay lump → (the earlier statue is the same statue as the earlier statue → the earlier statue is the same statue as the later clay lump ).

The trouble is that R is false. The earlier statue is the same lump of clay as the clay lump, and the earlier statue is the same statue is the same statue as the earlier statue, but the earlier statue is not, contrary to LLR, the same statue as the later clay lump.

4.3 Identity: ‘Strict’ and ‘Loose’

Following Bishop Butler [see Section 5], Roderick Chisholm distinguishes between a strict and a loose sense of identity (see Chisholm 1969). To see what this distinction comes to, and how it might help with the puzzle cases, consider the case of Cup and Tcup. For Chisholm things have their parts essentially in the following sense. It is impossible for a to be identical with b in the strict and philosophical sense, unless a and b have all their parts in common. Earlier Cup has a part, a handle, that later Cup, not to say earlier and later Tcup, lacks. Hence, on Chisholm's view, Earlier Cup is not strictly identical with later Cup.

Earlier Cup is nontheless identical with later Cup in a loose and popular sense. What then, according to Chisholm, is it for earlier Cup and later Cup to be identical in a loose and popular sense? To simplify let us suppose, unrealistically, that the only change of parts that Cup [in, Chisholm would say, a loose and popular sense] undergoes is loss of a handle. Call Hcup the object that consists of Cup's handle together with Tcup. Chisholm would say this. Cup is earlier wholly constituted by Hcup, that is Tcup plus handle, and later wholly constituted by Tcup alone. Moreover Tcup is related to Hcup in such a way that, as Chisholm puts it, Tcup at t2 is the ens successivum of Hcup at an earlier time t1. For Chisholm what makes Tcup at t2 an ens successivum of Hcup at t1 seems to be this. Tcup is a proper part of Hcup at t1. There is a sequence S of cups such that each member of S that is not identical with Hcup is, at some time, a proper part of some member of S. For each time between and including t1 and t2 Cup is wholly constituted by some member of S.

Cup is wholly constituted by Tcup at t2. Since the later Cup is wholly constituted by something, Tcup, that is an ens successivum of something, Hcup, that wholly constitutes Cup we may say that earlier cup is loosely identical with later Cup.

4.4 Arbitrary Undetached Parts

One solution to the problem posed by the cup case is to reject what Peter van Inwagen calls the Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts (see van Inwagen 1981). In setting the problem up we assumed that earlier Cup consists of the following parts: a handle together with Tcup. That assumption is justified if the following is. Tcup existed as a part of Cup when Cup still had its handle. Van Inwagen would reject that assumption. According to him it is illegitimate to assume that any old way of notionally dividing up an object yields an existing undetached part.

Instead of denying that Tcup exists at t1 when it is ostensibly a proper part of Cup, we might instead deny that Tcup at t1 is identical with what looks very much like Tcup at t2. In this way we can, gain, preserve transitivity without having to identify the earlier cup with one of its proper parts.

One way to allow that Tcup earlier exists without conceding its later identity with Cup is, following Michael Burke, to maintain that Tcup goes out of existence when Cup loses its handle (see Burke 1994).

4.5 Four Dimensionalism

Here is what a classical four dimensionalist would say about the case of the cup. Suppose the interval from t1 to t2 is the time during which Cup has a handle attached to it, and t2 to t3 the interval during which Cup is without a handle, and, so, putatively identical with Cup. As before Hcup is the fusion of Tcup and Cup's handle. According to the four dimensionalist Cup, Tcup and Hcup are all extended in time as well as space. Tcup has a temporal part that extends from t1 to t2 together with a temporal part that extends from t2 to t3. Tcup's t1 to t2 and t2 to t3 temporal parts are distinct from each other as well as being distinct from the temporally longer Tcup. Hcup, that is Tcup plus handle, is a four dimensional object that extends from t1 to t2. Cup itself consists of the following two, among indefinitely many other, temporal parts: Hcup and the t2 to t3 part of Tcup.

What we should say according to the classical four dimensionalist is this. The t1 to t2 temporal part of Tcup is a proper temporal and spatial part of Hcup. Hcup and the t2 to t3 temporal parts of Tcup are proper temporal parts of Cup. Cup is not identical with any of Hcup, Tcup from t1 to t2, Tcup from t2 to t3, or Tcup from t1 to t3. In particular there is no question of Cup being literally identical with Tcup from t2 to t3, when they are indiscernible, though, following David Lewis, we may say that Cup and Tcup are identical at any time between t2 and t3 in the sense that they share temporal parts during those times (see Lewis 1986).

Many four-dimensionalists subscribe to a principle that a number of writers call unrestricted mereological composition. According to that principle any set of, in this case four-dimensional, objects constitute a further four dimensional object. Armed with the unrestricted mereological composition principle a four-dimensionalist can say that what there is, in the case of Thesus' ship, is a Y branching object dividable in an indefinite number of ways into four dimensional proper parts an indefinite number of which are ships. For example the ship consisting of the stem together with the replacement branch has as two of its proper parts a ship consisting of just the stem, and one consisting of just the replacement branch.

Apart from the argument that it provides the best solution to diachronic identity puzzles four dimensionalism has been defended on a number of other grounds. One we have reviewed already; the argument that four dimensionalism gives the best solution to the problem of temporary intrinsics. Another, also offered by David Lewis, invokes the principle that facts in general supervene on facts about the instantiations of intrinsic properties and external relations. Call facts about the instantiation of intrinsic properties and external relations basic facts, and let R be the spatio-temporal region occupied by Plate throughout its career. According to Lewis there is a world W in which a sequence of shorter Plate-like objects occupy R, and all of the basic facts that obtain in our world obtain in W. Lewis' supervenience principle tells us that all facts supervene on basic facts. The same basic facts obtain in both our world and W. So whatever is true of the occupant of R in W is true of the occupant of R in our world. The occupant of R in W is a sequence of, appropriately interrelated Plate-like objects. Hence the occupant of R in our world, that is Plate, is likewise a sequence of interrelated Plate-like objects.

Recently Sider (2002) developed an argument for Four Dimensionalism from considerations about vagueness. He argues that Four Dimensionalism is true if it cannot be vague how many things there are, and also that it cannot be vague how many things there are.

It should be noted that Sider defends an alternative version of Four Dimensionalism which identifies objects with what, on the first version, would qualify as their stages (Sider 2002).

4.6 Temporary Identity

In the case of, for example, the truncated cup we saw that one option is to claim that Cup is earlier distinct from Tcup [cup minus its handle], but later identical with Tcup. According to this option the identity of Cup with Tcup is only temporary. We also saw that many refuse to countenance temporary identity because it allegedly conflicts with Leibniz's Law [LL]. After all, later Cup, but not Tcup, apparently later has the property of having had a handle.

Despite this putative conflict with LL, some philosophers are prepared to defend temporary identity as the best solution to the puzzles about diachronic identity. George Myro does so by restricting the scope of LL to exclude such properties as having had a handle (Myro 1985). Gallois (1998) does so by arguing that if the identity of Cup and Tcup is temporary, we cannot infer from Tcup having had a handle earlier that earlier Tcup has a handle.

4.7 Further Puzzle Cases

We have focused attention on one type of case that raises a puzzle about diachronic identity. Such a case involves something ostensibly becoming, or ceasing to be identical with something that is ostensibly one of its earlier or later proper parts. It would be wrong to give the impression that such a Deon-Theon case is the only, or even main, type of case posing a problem about diachronic identity.[3] In addition there are what are often referred to as fission and fusion cases. A fission case has the following features. We have putatively distinct things b and c existing at some later time t2. Each of b and c is related to a, which exists at an earlier time t1, in such a way that each one is ostensibly identical with a.

Fission cases come in two varieties: symmetrical and asymmetrical. Examples of symmetrical fission cases include amoebic and hemispheric division [for the latter see Personal Identity below]. In a symmetrical case there is some relation that each of b and c stand in to a, where standing in that relation is what makes each one putatively identical with a. In an asymmetric case, b is putatively identical with a because it stands in a certain relation to a, but c is putatively identical with a because it stands in a different relation to a. The best known example of an symmetric fission case is the Ship of Thesus described at the beginning of this section.

Let us see how the proposals for dealing with the cup case apply to fission cases. Constitution only delivers a candidate solution in a symmetric fission case. As we noted above, a constitution theorist can say the following about Theseus' Ship. The ship resulting from the replacement of the original planks is identical with, but not constituted from the original planks. The ship reconstituted from the original planks is not identical with the one originally constituted from those planks.

Some relative identity theorists have this to say about Theseus' Ship. In that case conflict with the transitivity of identity is avoided by maintaining the following. The replacement ship is the same ship as the original, and the original is the same collection of planks as the reassembly ship. Conflict with transitivity is avoided because we need not allow that the reassembly ship is the same ship as the original.

Distinguishing between a strict and loose sense of ‘identical’ yields the following solution in the case of Theseus' Ship. Let Original be the original ship, Replacement be the ship that results from replacing Original's original planks, and Reassembly the one that results from their reassembly. In that case, deploying the distinction between a strict and loose sense of identity, we can say this. Reassembly is strictly identical with Original, but Replacement is only loosely identical with Original. A conflict with transitivity of identity is avoided for the following reason. It follows by transitivity from Replacement being identical with Original, and Original being identical with Reassembly, that Replacement is identical with Reassembly only if a single relation of identity is involved.

Here is what a four dimensionalist such as Lewis will say about Thesus' ship. In that case there are two initially indiscernible ships. The first is a four dimensionally extended ship located where the original ship is initially located that ends up coinciding only with the reassembly ship. The second, also initially located where the original ship is initially ends up coinciding with the replacement ship. We thus have a Y-branching four dimensionally extended object with one ship constituted by the stem together with one branch, and the other constituted by the stem together with the remaining branch.

Four Dimensionalism, like the thesis that identities can be temporary, applies to both symmetric and asymmetric cases of fission.

A temporary identity theorist will hold that Replacement and Reassembly are identical at t1, but distinct ships at t2.

In the previous section we reviewed an argument designed to rule out indeterminate identities. If that argument can be met, it is open to us to say the following about Theseus' Ship. Each of Replacement and Reassembly is indeterminately identical with Original.

5. Personal Identity

Personal identity is perhaps the most extensively discussed special case of identity. What is it for a person existing at one time to be identical to a person existing at another? This question was first clearly posed by John Locke in his celebrated discussion of personal identity in the Essay (Locke 1975). Locke distinguishes between being the same man and being the same person. To be the same man is to be the same member of the species human being. For Locke what is crucial is that having the same consciousness is not sufficient for being the same man, but is sufficient for being the same person.

Famously Locke calls the concept of a person a forensic concept. For Locke much of the importance attaching to being the same person is that moral responsibility for past deeds goes with being the same person, rather than being the same man or even the same immaterial substance, as a past person. In his view it is enough to be morally responsible for some deed that one is the same person as its performer. It is not required that one be the same man or the same immaterial substance as the one who performed the act in question.

What then, according to Locke, is it to have the same consciousness as some past person? He is customarily interpreted as holding that person A is the same person as earlier person B just in case A is able to remember enough of what happened to B. This is sometimes referred to as the memory criterion of personal identity. The memory criterion was criticized by Butler and Reid principally because it was said to be circular, and, as a criterion of personal identity, incompatible with the transitivity of identity [see Section 2.2: Identity as an Equivalence Relation].[4]

The argument for the circularity of the memory criterion went like this. Suppose we think of the memory criterion as giving what would be later called an analysis of A being the same person as B. If so, we are invited to analyze A being the same person as b in terms of A remembering enough of what happened to B. But any plausible analysis of A remembering what happened to B will mention, in the analysans, A being the same person as B.

Sydney Shoemaker has responded to the circularity charge by distinguishing remembering from what he calls Q-remembering (Shoemaker 1975). A Q-remembers something that happened to b just in case there is an appropriate causal link between the event Q-remembered and A's memory impression of that event. Unlike remembering, Q-remembering a past experience does not imply the identity of the one having the Q-memory with the one who had the experience. We can avoid the charge of circularity by restating the memory criterion in the following way. A is the same person as some earlier individual B if and only if A Q-remembers enough of what happened to B.

The charge that the memory criterion conflicts with the transitivity of identity was illustrated by the famous case of the schoolboy, the young lieutenant and the elderly general (Reid 1975). The elderly general can Q-remember enough of what happened to the young lieutenant to qualify, by the memory criterion, as being the same person as the young lieutenant. The young lieutenant in turn Q-remembers enough of what happened to the young schoolboy. But the elderly general can remember almost nothing of what happened to the young schoolboy. Since the memory criterion has it that A Q-remembering enough of what happened to B is a necessary condition for A being the same person as an earlier person B, it follows that, according to the memory criterion, the elderly general is not the same person as the young schoolboy. Hence, the memory criterion implies, contrary to the transitivity of identity, that, although the elderly general is the same person as the young lieutenant, and the young lieutenant is the same person as the schoolboy, the elderly general is not the same person as the young schoolboy.

The memory criterion came to be modified in two further ways. The first modification provides a way of reconciling the memory criterion with the transitivity of identity in the light of cases such as the elderly general. Instead of saying that A is the same person as some earlier B if and only if A can Q-remember enough of what happened to B, we say the following. A is the same person as B if and only if there is a Q-memory chain linking A with B. For there to be a Q-memory link between A and B, either A remembers enough of what happened to B, or A remembers enough of what happened to someone who remembers enough of what happened to B, or A remembers enough of what happened to someone who remembers enough of what happened to someone who remembers enough of what happened to B, and so on. In the case of the elderly general, the elderly general does remember enough of what happened to, someone, the young lieutenant, who remembers enough of what happened to the young schoolboy to count, by the modified criterion, as the same person as the young schoolboy.

The second modification extends the memory criterion to include forward looking psychological connections, such as that between present intention and future action, as determinants of personal identity.

With these modifications incorporated the memory criterion has come to be known as the psychological continuity criterion of personal identity. The psychological continuity criterion is an improvement on the original memory criterion. Nevertheless one of the problems confronting the original memory criterion, its putative conflict with the transitivity of identity, can be brought against its successor in a different form. We saw that making certain identifications in a fission case such as the ship of Thesus [see Section 4: Diachronic Identity Puzzles] threatens the transitivity of identity. One much discussed type of fission case, hemispheric division, is taken by many to show that the psychological continuity criterion is, after all, incompatible with the transitivity of identity (Nagel 1975).

Suppose, as may one day be medically feasible, an individual A's still functioning upper brain is transplanted from A's body to the debrained, but living, body formerly belonging to B. Upon being transplanted A's upper brain is connected to what remains of B's central nervous system so that a person, call her A-B, results. A-B believes herself to be A, can Q-remember what happened to A, has A's psychological dispositions, and so on. Should we say that A-B is the same person as A, the same person as B, or an altogether new person? Psychological continuity theorists will have little hesitation in answering that A-B is the same person as A.

A person can function fairly normally with much of their brain destroyed. Suppose A loses an entire brain hemisphere. Given the plasticity of the brain, and aided by our hypothetical future medical technology, it may be that A could survive such a loss. If so, it would be unreasonable to deny that A could survive the transplantation of only one brain hemisphere given that she could survive the transplantation of he entire intact upper brain.

The putative conflict with transitivity arises when we consider a case in which both of the separated hemispheres of A's original brain are transplanted to separate bodies resulting in what certainly look to be distinct individuals. Suppose, one of A's brain hemispheres is transferred to B's body, resulting in a person PB, and the other to C's body resulting in a person PC. It flouts transitivity to say that PC is identical with A, and that A is identical with PB, but deny, at it seems we should, that PC is identical with PB.

There are a number of ways that defenders of a psychological continuity criterion have attempted to evade this result. One, adopted by David Lewis, goes like this (Lewis 1976). We say that earlier, when A is around with an intact brain, there are two indiscernible individuals, PB and PC, sharing a single body. Another, advocated by Robert Nozick, concedes that if both hemispheres are successfully transplanted, neither of the later individuals with just one brain hemisphere is identical with the earlier one with an intact brain, but insist that if only one hemisphere is transplanted, the resulting individual is identical with the former possessor of two hemispheres. On this view whether, for example, PB is identical with the earlier person with A's body depends on whether there is an equally good later candidate, such as PC, for being the earlier A-body person (Nozick 1981).

In one of the most influential discussions of personal identity Derek Parfit defends a view close to Nozick's by distinguishing between survival and identity (in Perry 1975). In Nozick's view what psychological continuity guarantees is not identity, but survival. In the case where both of A's hemispheres are transplanted to yield PB and PC, A survives as PB, and survives as PC, though she is identical with neither PB nor PC.

Parfit, Nozick and Lewis all take psychological continuity to be integral to personal identity in the following sense. In cases where there is no branching psychological continuity is sufficient to ensure the identity of a later with an earlier person. A number of philosophers would reject this claim insisting that bodily persistence is required for personal identity. Some, for example Eric Olson, would argue that psychological continuity is irrelevant to the identity of those things, human beings, who are the only things we know to be persons. Instead, on this view, what is crucial to personal identity for humans is continuing to be the same animal (Olson 1997).

6. Criteria of Identity

As noted above the phrase ‘criterion of identity’ has been used to mean different things. Here are some of the leading interpretations:

  1. For any x and y, a necessary and sufficient condition for x being identical with y.
  2. For any substance sortal F, a necessary and sufficient condition for something being the same F.
  3. For any substance sortal F, a necessary and sufficient condition for an F continuing to exist.
  4. A specification of what it is for x to be the same F as y in terms of things such as Chisholm's ens successivum that may not be an F, standing in some relation other than identity.
  5. A specification of all of the purely qualitative intrinsic properties instanced between [and including] t and t′ so that the identity of x at t with y at t′ supervenes on that specification.
  6. A way of telling, for any substance sortal F, whether x is the same F as y.

An example of (i) is the criterion of identity defended by Baruch Brody. Brody suggests that we may combine the Indiscernibility of identicals LL [see above] with the identity of Indiscernibles to give necessary and sufficient conditions for any x being identical with any y (Brody 1980). An example of (ii) would be the psychological or bodily continuity criteria of personal identity which, if we take personhood to be an essential property of anything that is a person, would provide an example of (iii).

Two examples of (iv) are given by Frege's discussion of the criteria of identity for directions, and by Chisholm's discussion of loose identity [for Chisholm see Diachronic Identity Puzzles]. Frege gives his criterion for the identity of the direction of line L1 with line L2 in the following way (see Frege Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik). The direction of line L1 is identical with the direction of line L2 just in case L1 is parallel to L2. In this way we say what it is for things of one category, directions, to be identical by talking about a relation other than identity, being parallel to, holding between things of another category: viz. lines. We can do so because a canonical way of referring to a direction is by means of a referring expression that mentions a line. (iv) is illustrated by Chisholm's discussion of loose identity in the following way. For x to be loosely identical with y is for something related to x to be appropriately related to something related to y. For example, in the case of Cup and Tcup discussed earlier [see Section 4: Diachronic Identity Puzzles], Cup is loosely identical with later Cup because earlier Cup is constituted by something, Hcup, that stands in the entia successiva relation to something, TCup, that constitutes later Cup.

(v) is illustrated by David Lewis' commitment to what he calls Humean Supervenience. According to Humean Supervenience All facts, including identity facts, supervene on facts about the distribution of intrinsic, purely qualitative time bound properties (Lewis 1986).

Finally, (vi) is illustrated by the view of those who hold that it is a conceptual truth that the concept of being an F is linked to a way of telling when something is the same F.

Which, if any, of (i)-(vi) we expect to be available will, of course depend on other views held about identity. For example, if, with Wiggins and Geach, we think that it is incoherent to speak of the identity of x with y unless we can in principle say what more specific sortal x and y fall under, we will be unsympathetic to the demand for a criterion of identity in sense (i). Again, if we think x being the same F as y amounts to x and y are both Fs, and x=y, we will feel it as a less urgent matter to provide a criterion of identity in senses (ii) or (iv).

Bibliography

A. Identity and Change

B. Necessary and Determinate identity

B.1 Necessary Identities

B.2 Determinate Identities

C. Diachronic Identity Puzzles

D. Identity and Essence

E. Personal Identity

F. Criteria of Identity

G. The Dispensability of Identity

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

change | identity | identity: relative | intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties | mereology | sortals | supervenience | temporal parts

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Andre Gallois
agallois@syr.edu

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