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Personal Identity and Ethics

What justifies our holding a person morally responsible for some past action? Why am I justified in having a special prudential concern for some future persons and not others? Why do many of us think that maximizing the good within a single life is perfectly acceptable, but maximizing the good across lives is wrong? In these and other normative questions, it looks like any answer we come up with will have to make an essential reference to personal identity. So, for instance, we are justified in holding X responsible for some past action only if X is identical to the person who performed that action. Further, I am justified in my special concern for some future person only if he will be me. Finally, many of us think that while maximization within a life affects only one person, a metaphysical unity, maximization across lives affects many different, metaphysically distinct, persons, and so the latter is wrong insofar as it ignores this fundamental separateness of persons.

Until quite recently, the history of philosophy revealed two implied positions on the relation between personal identity and ethics: (1) it is the identity relation that grounds the patterns of concern essential to answering these sorts of normative questions, and (2) the proper account of identity thus constrains the answers to these sorts of normative questions. Significant work over the last forty years, however, both in metaphysics and in ethics, has yielded important questions about both positions. We will thus start with a brief survey of notable historical and contemporary discussions of the relation, including a discussion of whether or not it is even the identity relation that matters for normative concerns. We will then turn to a discussion of different methodological approaches to the issue: on the assumption that there is a relation between identity and ethics, which is prior? We will then be in a position to discuss various ways in which considerations of identity (or the relation that really matters in its stead) might have important implications for more specific arenas in ethics, including normative ethics, metaethics, and applied ethics.

1. Historical Highlights of the Relation

For the most part, the philosophical history of the relation between identity and normativity up until the 17th Century is really about the relation between identity and prudential concern, and not ethics per se. Plato is a prime example. He held in the Phaedo that I (and all persons) will survive the death and destruction of my body insofar as what I essentially am is a simple, immaterial soul, something whose own essence is being alive. This yields the direct implication that, insofar as I will survive the death of my body, I am justified in anticipating post-mortem experiences. Lucretius, on the other hand, while also focused solely on the relation between identity and prudence, denied the Platonic view that I would be justified in post-mortem anticipation, simply because "if any feeling remains in mind or spirit after it has been torn from body, that is nothing to us, who are brought into being by the wedlock of body and spirit, conjoined and coalesced" (Lucretius 1951, 121). In other words, I am essentially a union of body and soul, and so even if my soul lives on, and even if it is capable of having experiences, I am not justified in anticipating them given that my body — an essential component of me — will have disintegrated. Once again, though, identity is thought to be what grounds prudential concern: the difference between Lucretius and Plato is only over what identity consists in (although for a contrasting interpretation of Lucretius, see Martin and Barresi 2003, 10).

It was not until John Locke that there was an explicit attempt to connect personal identity with specifically ethical concerns. Locke famously called "person" a forensic term, "appropriating actions and their merit; and so belongs only to intelligent agents capable of a law, and happiness, and misery" (Locke 1694, 50-51). This means, then, that an account of the identity of persons across time will have forensic — normative — implications. And so it does.

Locke's account of personal identity appealed to what seems a crucial condition of moral agency, namely, self-reflective consciousness. On his view, then, a person — a moral agent — Y at t2 is identical to a person X at t1 just in case Y's consciousness "can be extended backwards" to X (ibid., 39), and this is typically taken to mean that Y remembers X's thoughts and experiences. Now once we have this account of identity in hand, we can see what implications it will have for various normative issues. Start with prudential rationality. On Locke's view, I am appropriately concerned, both for the past stage of myself to whom my consciousness extends, but also to some future person — me — to whom my consciousness will extend. This is the mechanism by which I would be justified, for example, in anticipating the afterlife, for "at the resurrection" there will be someone to whom my present consciousness extends, and this person will be me even though he might have a very different body than I have now (ibid., 44). It is unimportant to me, on this view, what substance (body or soul) to which I find myself attached. If, for example, my little finger were cut off and my consciousness traveled with it, "that would be the same self which was concerned for the whole body yesterday, as making part of itself, whose actions then it cannot but admit as its own now" (ibid., 46).

It is this sort of remark — about my identification with certain actions — that yields our first explicit connection between identity and ethics, specifically moral responsibility, for one is justifiably held accountable only for those actions performed by a self to whom one's present consciousness extends, i.e., it is only for those actions I remember performing that I can justifiably be held morally responsible. As Locke puts it, if I am punished for the actions of a self whose thoughts and experiences I do not remember, "what difference is there between that punishment, and being created miserable?" (ibid., 51) Thus, on the Day of Judgment, "The sentence shall be justified by the consciousness all persons shall have, that they themselves, in what bodies soever they appear, or what substances soever that consciousness adheres to, are the same that committed those actions, and deserve that punishment for them" (ibid.).

The key for Locke, regarding the normativity of both prudence and moral responsibility, is that what grounds the various patterns of concern is the identity relation, a relation uniquely unifying temporally distinct person-stages via consciousness. And it was because Locke prized apart personal identity from biological identity, and any other sort of substance identity, that later philosophers like Joseph Butler and Thomas Reid objected to it. So, for example, Butler accuses Locke of a "wonderful mistake," which is that he failed to recognize that the relation of consciousness presupposes identity, and thus cannot constitute it (Butler 1736, 100). In other words, I can remember only my own experiences, but it is not my memory of an experience that makes it mine; rather, I remember it only because it's already mine. So while memory can reveal my identity with some past experiencer, it does not make that experiencer me. What I am remembering, then, insists Butler, are the experiences of a substance, namely, the same substance that constitutes me now.

Similarly, Reid affirms Butler's objection and then adds a few of his own. One is that Locke's criterion implies the contradictory position that someone could both be and not be identical to some past stage, an objection illustrated by the Brave Officer Case. Suppose that as he is stealing the enemy's standard, a forty-year-old brave officer remembers stealing apples from a neighbor's orchard when he was ten, and then suppose further that when he is eighty years old, a retired general, he remembers stealing the enemy's standard as a brave officer but no longer remembers stealing the neighbor's apples. On Locke's account the general would have to be both identical to the apple-stealer (because of the transitivity of the identity relation: he's identical to the brave officer, who himself is identical to the apple-stealer) and not identical to the apple-stealer (given that he has no direct memory of the boy's experiences) (Reid 1785, 114-115). Another objection is based precisely on the link between identity and ethics: how can identity — sameness — be based on a relation (consciousness) that changes from moment to moment? A person would never remain the same from one moment to the next, "and as the right and justice of reward and punishment are founded on personal identity, no man could be responsible for his actions" (ibid., 117). But such an implication must be absurd. And Butler concurs, expanding the point to include normative considerations of prudence:

[If Locke's view is correct,] it must follow, that it is a fallacy upon ourselves, to charge our present selves with any thing we did, or to imagine our present selves interested in any thing which befell us yesterday, or that our present self will be interested in what will befall us to-morrow; since our present self is not, in reality, the same with the self of yesterday, but another like self or person coming in its room, and mistaken for it; to which another self will succeed tomorrow (Butler 1736, 102).

Both Reid and Butler, then, wind up rejecting Locke's relational view in favor of a substance-based view of identity.

What Butler and Reid retain in common with Locke, though, is the assumption that identity grounds patterns of concern, both prudential and moral. As Reid puts it, "Identity … is the foundation of all rights and obligations, and of accountableness, and the notion of it is fixed and precise" (Reid 1785, 112). What they disagree over is just what identity consists in. But notice one of the most important methods of disagreement they both deploy: if Locke's view were right, it would require a host of radical changes to our practices of responsibility attribution and prudential deliberation. But, goes the argument, because making such changes would be crazy — we are strongly committed to the correctness of our current ways of doing things — Locke's view cannot be right.

What we see in this exchange are the seeds of two important elements in the contemporary debate about the relation between personal identity and ethics. First, while nearly all parties agree that there is a relation between identity and normativity, they disagree over which one has methodological priority. In other words, should our theories of identity constrain our ethics (or normativity generally), say, or should our practical ethical commitments constrain our theories of identity? Can a theory of identity be correct if it has revisionary implications for our patterns of normative concern? Locke himself seems to go back and forth on whether his view was revisionary for normativity or merely a clear-headed description of our pre-existing normative commitments: he admits that he has made some suppositions "that will look strange to some readers" (Locke 1694, 51), but he is also at pains to show that our practices are typically in conformity with the implications of his view, e.g., human law emphasizes at least the necessity of persisting consciousness, "not punishing the mad man for the sober man's actions, nor the sober man for what the mad man did" (ibid., 47). What we may glean from the exchange, then, is that there are three possible methodological approaches: (a) one might advance the methodological priority of metaphysics over ethics, such that we ought to alter our practices in conformity with the implications of our theory of identity, whatever those implications turn out to be; (b) one might advance the methodological priority of ethics over metaphysics, such that our theory of identity ought to be constrained by our practical normative commitments and ethical conclusions; or (c) one might advance a method of reflective equilibrium, according to which we start with certain of our fairly settled, considered convictions about both our identities and our normative commitments, and then proceed to organize the various implicit principles involved in these convictions into a coherent theory of both. While it is the last method that seems most plausible, much of the historical and contemporary debate has been a clash between the first two.

The second thing to notice about the historical exchange is less about methodology than about content: what exactly does the theory of identity imply about ethics? Both Butler and Reid believe Locke's view implies that no one exists beyond the present moment, i.e., that Locke's view is just the following: X at t1 is identical to Y at t2 just in case Y's consciousness is the same as X's consciousness. But because consciousness changes from moment to moment, X's consciousness could never be identical to Y's. Unfortunately, this is a gross misunderstanding of the theory (perhaps based on both authors' ground-level assumptions that personal identity just had to be based on substance-identity). Instead, X and Y are, on Locke's actual view, identical just in case X and Y are related via consciousness, i.e., just in case Y remembers the thoughts and experiences of X. But if that is the view, then identity could be just as strict, fixed, and precise as both Butler and Reid seem to want, for Y could be identical to X only in case that relation obtains, no matter how strongly or weakly.

Notice, though, that Locke could have introduced a less "strict" account of identity by emphasizing that what is involved in consciousness does indeed admit of degrees: I may remember my ten-year-old self only to a limited extent, whereas I remember much more about my yesterday's self. This move might, then, have allowed for the possibility of the admission of degrees into the normative arena, implying, for example, a reduction in the degrees of moral responsibility corresponding to a reduction in the degree of memory that obtains. In addition, Locke might have considered what to say were the consciousness of one person duplicated in two different bodies, i.e., if two simultaneously-existing people were related to some past X by consciousness, would they both be identical to X? And if so, what would that mean for their relation to each other? And if identity were somehow lost in such an arrangement, would that matter for normativity? As it turns out, these are the sorts of questions that are at the heart of the contemporary approach. (Martin 1998, 3-5 actually points to Locke as the first one to introduce the possibility of fission to the literature in his example of a finger gaining a separate consciousness from the rest of a person's body, but because a finger lacks the capacity for genuine agency and because Locke does not make clear what the similarity relations are between the finger and both the person from whose body it derived and the fingerless person still in existence, as it stands his case fails to raise the questions most contemporary theorists have found most important.)

2. Contemporary Accounts

The contemporary approach to personal identity and ethics really began with Derek Parfit's seminal early 1970s articles, "Personal Identity" and especially "Later Selves and Moral Principles," and then with his restatement and development of the view in Part III of his 1984 book Reasons and Persons (from which the present exposition is taken). Parfit's is, in many respects, a Lockean account of personal identity, although there are significant departures. He is a "reductionist," according to which the facts about persons and personal identity consist in more particular facts about brains, bodies, and series of interrelated mental and physical events (Parfit 1984, 210-211). The denial of reductionism is called "nonreductionism," according to which the facts about persons and personal identity consist in some further fact, beyond the facts about physical and psychological continuity, typically a fact about Cartesian egos or souls.

While Parfit's arguments against nonreductionism and in favor of reductionism are striking and important, for our purposes what matters is how he articulates and develops reductionism and how he argues for the surprising conclusion that the identity relation is in fact not what matters in survival. To begin, the most plausible reductionist criterion of personal identity is Lockean, consisting in overlapping chains — continuity — of the sort of direct psychological connections that hold to a significant degree from day to day in the lives of ordinary persons (called "strong connectedness") (ibid., 206). These connections consist, of course, in Locke's favorite — memory — but they also include other relations such as intentions executed in action, persistence of beliefs/desires/goals, and resemblance of character. So this neo-Lockean criterion of identity holds that X at t1 is the same person as Y at t2 just in case X is uniquely psychologically continuous with Y, i.e., just in case there are overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness obtaining between X and Y, and the chains obtain only between X and Y (and not some other simultaneously-existing Z) (ibid., 207). Talk of both "chains" and "uniqueness" is crucial. First, appeal to overlapping chains of direct connections avoids Reid's Brave Officer worry: if direct memory of some past stage, say, is unnecessary for identity, then the sort of contradiction he points to (where a descendant-stage both is and isn't identical to the ancestor stage he no longer directly remembers) is avoided. Second, psychological continuity is potentially a branching, one-many relation, i.e., it could conceivably hold between me-now and more than one person in the future. But identity is an equivalence relation — it is reflexive, symmetrical, and transitive — so it holds only one-one. Thus only by including a "no branching" clause can the criterion of identity avoid yet another contradiction.

By way of explanation, consider the case Parfit uses in support of his claim that identity is not what matters: fission (ibid., 254-255). Suppose both of my brain hemispheres are functional duplicates of the other, and that each of my other two triplet brothers has suffered irreversible brain damage. A brilliant neurosurgeon can transplant one of my brain hemispheres into each brother, and so each survivor (we will stipulate) will be fully psychologically continuous with me upon waking up. What has happened to me? If we lack the "no branching" clause, we are forced to say that, because both brothers are psychologically continuous with me, they are both me. But then (given the transitivity of identity) both survivors would also have to be identical to each other, which seems obviously false (although see Belzer 2005 for doubts about this assertion). So to avoid violating this transitivity requirement, we simply have to stipulate in our criterion of personal identity that, if the relations in which identity consists may hold one-many, they must obtain uniquely for identity itself to obtain.

But then what has happened to me in fission? It seems I cannot survive as both, so the identity relation does not obtain between me and the survivors. In addition, there simply is no non-arbitrary reason why it should obtain between me and just one of the survivors, so the only remaining option is that I do not survive fission (see Parfit 2001, 42; see also Brink 1997b, 140-141). But is this like an ordinary case in which I don't survive, i.e., like death? Clearly not: both survivors will seem to remember my thoughts and experiences, they will fulfill intentions I had in action, they will have the same beliefs/desires/goals as me, and their characters will be exactly like mine. Indeed, it will be just as if I had survived. Everything that matters in ordinary survival (or nearly everything), therefore, is preserved in fission, despite the fact that the identity relation is not. What this must mean, then, is that the identity relation just is not what matters (or is not what matters very much) in survival; instead, what matters has to consist in psychological continuity and connectedness (what Parfit calls "Relation R"). As long as that relation holds between me-now and some other person-stage — regardless of whether or not it holds one-one — what happens to me is just as good as ordinary survival.

While there are plausible alternative reactions to fission that maintain the importance of the identity relation (see, e.g., Lewis 1976; Sider 2001a) — and such views will be explored later — for now it is important to see what Parfit's version would mean, if anything, for normativity. What, after all, do we do if identity is not what matters in survival? Given that we have long taken identity to be the relation grounding our patterns of concern (for both prudence and moral matters like responsibility), we are now faced with two options: either we take those patterns of concern to be unjustified or we find new grounds for them. In Reasons and Persons, Parfit is officially agnostic on the proper approach (he claims that arguments for both stances are defensible, yet also can be defensibly denied; see, e.g., pp. 311-312). Nevertheless, it surely seems most plausible to retain the patterns of concern formerly grounded on identity and simply find a new justification for them. And it seems obvious that Relation R could provide such a justification. After all, if we formerly thought identity justified these patterns insofar as it was what we thought mattered for survival, but it turns out that identity — Relation R plus uniqueness — is not what matters only because uniqueness is not what matters, then it seems overwhelmingly natural and plausible to cite the remaining aspect of identity (Relation R) as what grounds our patterns of concern in virtue of being what truly matters in survival (see, e.g., Jeske 1993; Shoemaker 2002a). How, in other words, could uniqueness have provided all the relevant justifications? Indeed, Parfit himself seems drawn to such a conclusion in the discussion of normativity that follows.

So let us assume that Relation R grounds our patterns of concern. Consider, then, prudential rationality. While it is ordinarily thought to be imprudent to discount the interests of one's Much Later Self (MLS) just because that self will not come into exist for a long time, Parfit suggests that reductionism provides a different, more plausible reason to do so. Since one of the relations in R (connectedness) obtains by degrees, it is very likely it will obtain to a much reduced degree between me-now and my MLS than it will between me-now and my tomorrow's self. But if R grounds my patterns of concern, and a reduced degree of connectedness is one part of R, then a reduced degree of connectedness justifies a reduced degree of concern. Thus, I may be justified in caring much less about my MLS than about my tomorrow's self. This conclusion, then, justifies discounting my MLS's (expected) interests in favor of my present interests.

Of course, given that we still think great imprudence is wrong, how might we criticize it if we made these revisions to our practices? One way to do so would be to recognize that, since my MLS would really be more like a different person than me, he should be treated as such, i.e., how I treat him should now fall under the rubric of morality, and insofar as it is wrong to harm others without their consent, it would be wrong for me to harm him as well. Great imprudence like this, in other words, would be immoral (Parfit 1984, 318-320).

Parfit's theory has often been called "revisionary," in part because of moves like this one (see, e.g., Rovane 1998, 11; Martin 1998, 15). The thought is that both his theory of identity and its implications for our prudential and moral practices and concerns require us to change our views both of ourselves and of what matters. But this judgment may be mistaken. After all, Parfit seems to be trying to show that (a) what in fact matters to us in survival (revealed by the fission case) is Relation R, not identity, and (b) what these antecedent commitments about survival imply about prudence and morality is that the wrongness we currently attach to great imprudence should merely be called a wrongness of morality. But in neither case is there any call for revision of anything substantive in our views of ourselves or in our normative practices. Indeed, people simply are less concerned with their MLSs than with their tomorrow selves, and it is not difficult to see why: if they cannot imagine being the self in question, it is extremely difficult either to imagine what that self's interests are or to take those interests into account equally with their more closely related stages in practical deliberation. But what generally enables that act of projective imagination is the expectation of a significant degree of psychological connectedness, so the less there is of that relation, the less our concern for those distant stages is likely to be. This suggests, then, that Parfit's view is less revisionary than revelatory: he may be taken to be providing a clear-headed description of our practices and commitments, and in so doing revealing to us just what those practices and commitments actually involve and entail for other aspects of our lives (although see the various articles by Mark Johnston for considerations to the contrary).

At any rate, we have seen enough of both the historical and contemporary approaches by now to articulate just what the various positions are and how they might relate to ethics. First, there is nonreductionism, according to which persons exist separately and independently from their brains and bodies, and so their lives are unified from birth to death in virtue of that separately existing entity, what we will call a Cartesian ego. And although there is logical space available for a nonreductionism according to which identity isn't what matters for survival and our normative concerns, the universal view is instead the opposite. Notice, then, that this view implies both a deep unity within individual lives and a deep disunity between lives. After all, if what unifies my life is a particular persisting ego-substance, and that substance is wholly present at every stage of my life, then every temporal slice of my life is just as much a part of me as every other, so if prudential concern is to track identity, I ought to be equally concerned for every part of my life. Further, given that my particular ego-substance is distinct from every other person's particular ego-substance, my special prudential concern justifiably ends at the boundaries of my epidermis (or at the "boundaries" of my ego).

Now one important problem for this view is that it is very difficult to see why my patterns of special concern should track this particular ego, and not instead the psychological features constituting Relation R. What is it about this substance that warrants my special concern? If it is in virtue of its function as the carrier of the various psychological connections, then we might well wonder why we shouldn't care directly for those connections, rather than merely for the "package" they come in. But if we make that move, then we have already switched to reductionism, it seems, and because those direct connections may hold one-many, identity cannot be what matters.

On the other hand, the nonreductionist might insist that I am justified in having special concern for my future ego simply insofar as it is the only thing that will be me, regardless of whether or not Relation R is preserved by or within it. On this account, then (what Parfit 1984, 228 calls the "Featureless Cartesian View"), who I am — my essential identity — is independent of any particular psychological properties. But if identity is entirely prized apart from psychology in this way, and if the ego to be tracked is an immaterial substance (as it is, of course, on the Cartesian version), we are left with two related puzzles. First, if the particular ego I now have (or am) can be perceived or identified neither directly, via some empirical means, nor indirectly, via a particular set of psychological properties it might be thought to evince, then we actually have no reason to believe that there is just one such ego unifying the various stages of our lives. Instead, our bodies might get a new, qualitatively identical ego every year on our birthdays, or perhaps every day, or perhaps there is a river of them flowing through us from moment to moment. If this were to happen, then I would cease to exist, replaced by a qualitatively identical person who then inherits my psychological properties. But no one would even notice! This would be rather odd, to say the least, and this is because of the connection we think should obtain between our metaphysical criterion of personal identity and our epistemological criterion of personal identity. In other words, we tend to think there is a close connection between our theory of identity and our theory of reidentification: what makes X at t1 the same person as Y at t2 should point to the same thing that enables us to determine that X is the same person as Y. So if what makes X and Y identical is sameness of body, it will also be the body that enables us to determine that X is Y. Similarly, if what makes X and Y identical is some kind of psychological continuity, then determining that X and Y are identical will be a matter of determining whether psychological continuity obtains. Now in both the body and the psychology cases, we have the capacity to do the tracking in question. If the Featureless Cartesian View is correct, though, we do not. We cannot track immaterial egos floating free from any particular psychological properties, so on this view we would never be justified in claiming to have reidentified anyone, nor would we be justified in claiming special concern for some future stage of our bodies: in both cases, we could have no reason whatsoever for thinking that the persons in question were who we thought they were (Perry 1977, 369-372; Parfit 1984, 228).

Now the defender of the view might maintain that, given the correctness of the metaphysical criterion, we should simply abandon our desire for epistemic access to identity. And it is indeed the case that this version of nonreductionism could be true: there is simply no way to show that I am not, after all, an essentially immaterial substance unattached to any particular psychological properties. But if this true, and there becomes no way to make justified judgments of identity, then the second problem is that the theory is just irrelevant. And so this sort of nonreductionism is: we in fact make judgments of identity and reidentification based on physical and psychological properties — we lack the capacity to do anything else — so even if the Featureless Cartesian View were true, it would be useless in answering our motivating questions either way. If, then, we want to articulate a useful relation between personal identity and ethics (and other forms of normativity), we may have to abandon nonreductionism (Shoemaker 2002b, 148).

Let us turn briefly now to a second general position, a possible version of reductionism according to which identity still matters. This view is typically defended by advocates of four-dimensionalism, according to which objects have both spatial and temporal parts (see, e.g., Sider 2001a; Lewis 1971, 1976; Noonan 1989). This view allows one to say that, in the fission case, both post-fission people existed all along, completely coinciding spatially pre-fission (so that each shared that temporal stretch of his life with the other). In other words, they might be like two distinct roads that coincide for a while before separating off in different directions. Thus, if both post-fission person-stages are stages of the same person as the pre-fission stages (but there are indeed two distinct persons all along), then one can maintain the thesis that the identity relation is what matters, for now identity is also preserved through fission (whereas in Parfit's version while what matters is preserved through fission, identity is not).

Of course, this does not mean identity is really what matters. Perhaps instead the identity relation merely always accompanies, but is not constitutive of, what matters. Indeed, this point may be pressed on the four-dimensionalist. Why, after all, would it be identity that matters in my relation to some future person-stage? Suppose we regularly lived to be 1000 years old. On the four-dimensionalist account, I now would be unified with — I would be part of the same spacetime worm as — my 900-year-old self. But it is extraordinarily difficult, if not psychologically impossible, for me to project myself into his shoes, for I expect him to be radically different, psychologically, from me. There would be between us, then, virtually nothing of what actually matters in ordinary survival, despite the obtaining of identity. Of course, one might maintain instead that it is some strong degree of psychological connectedness that provides the unity relation between various temporal stages, but then it seems explicit that the relation preserving what matters is just connectedness, not identity per se.

There is much more to say about this view, of course (see, e.g., Belzer 2005), and we will return to it later. But for now, at least, it looks initially that a third position is somewhat more plausible than the other two, viz., the version of reductionism according to which identity is not what matters. What, then, does this view imply for the various branches of moral philosophy? As it turns out, this question may be premature. It assumes, after all, that the metaphysics ought to be prior to the ethics. But should it be? Perhaps, instead, the metaphysics should be constrained by the ethics. If this is so, then the relation between personal identity and ethics might look very different than we have thus far taken it to be.

3. Which Comes First, Metaphysics or Ethics?

Recall that both Reid and Butler objected to Locke's account of personal identity, in part, because they thought it had absurdly revisionary implications for our practices of moral responsibility. So rather than give up those practices, they said, we would be better off giving up Locke's theory. On this view, our normative commitments provide a check on our view of personal identity. Nevertheless, the consideration about moral responsibility is only one of many objections both critics run against Locke. They also launch purely metaphysical objections as well, the thought being that Locke's view fails both on its own terms and in light of its absurd normative implications. So actually, while our normative commitments provide an important consideration that the theory of personal identity should account for, it remains open that such commitments could be overridden or revised, depending perhaps on the independent plausibility of the theory in question.

For some authors, however, the role of our normative commitments in this debate is much stronger: they actually authoritatively constrain or even shape one's theory of personal identity. There are at least three ways in which this might be the case.

First, there is the Kantian view, advanced by Christine Korsgaard, that conceiving ourselves as practical agents simply requires us to view our lives as unified, despite the weakness or strength of various psychological connections that may or may not obtain between our various temporal stages. My conception of myself as a unified agent is not based on any metaphysical theory; it is instead based (a) on the basic need I have to eliminate conflict among my various motivational desires in order to act (producing my unified agency at any given time, i.e., synchronic unity), (b) on my deliberative standpoint, within which I view myself — a single deliberator/decider — as being over and above my various desires, weighing them and deciding between them, and (c) on my need to pursue any ends or carry out a rational plan of life (presupposing my unified agency across time, i.e., diachronic unity). In any case, I must be a unified agent both at a time and across time because I have only one body with which to act. This unity, therefore, has no need of any metaphysical support; instead, it is simply a requirement of being an agent, a doer of deeds and a thinker of thoughts (Korsgaard 1989).

Second, there is the communitarian view, advanced by philosophers like Alasdair MacIntyre and Charles Taylor, that all proper conceptions of the self are dependent on social matrices. In order to understand the self, we must view it both in its relation to the good and in its relation to other selves, for two reasons. First, we have an indispensable ability both to have certain moral intuitions and to articulate the grounds of those intuitions, and this ability presupposes the existence of what Taylor calls evaluative frameworks, frameworks also presupposed by our concept of personhood. So crucial to understanding who I am is understanding where I stand in moral space: my identity is bound up in, and at least partially constituted by, my strong attachments to a community that provides the evaluative framework within which I am able to articulate what is good and valuable. Thus, to ask about a person abstracted from his self-interpretations is to ask "a fundamentally misguided question" (Taylor 1989, 34).

The second general reason selves can be understood only by reference to community and morality comes from a consideration of human actions. As MacIntyre notes, human actions are intelligible only if viewed in a particular setting. We can understand a piece of human behavior only when we have situated the agent's intentions within the two contexts of their role in the agent's history and their role within the history of their particular setting(s). In doing so, we are writing a narrative history. Intelligible actions are actions for which the agent is accountable, actions which have a place in an ongoing narrative (MacIntyre 1984, 206-208). Thus arises the notion of narrative unity. My life, my entire life, from physical birth to physical death, can be understood only as a narrative, as an ongoing story. Now the unity of a narrative requires unity of character, and unity of character presupposes strict, numerical personal identity. To be the subject of a narrative is to be accountable for past actions that have composed that narrative life. To understand your actions now, then, I have to understand them as actions situated in a life story, your life story, as actions interrelated with your prior actions. As a result, "all attempts to elucidate the notion of personal identity independently of and in isolation from the notions of narrative, intelligibility and accountability are bound to fail. As all such attempts have" (ibid., 218).

Both the Kantian and communitarian objections target the disunifying implications of a metaphysical theory like reductionism, insisting instead that we are indeed unified as either practical agents or selves in moral space for purely normative reasons. Any theory of identity we construct, then, must be constrained by these normative considerations, which are thus obviously prior. Nevertheless, we may have some reason to doubt these claims. Consider first narrative unity. For one thing, it is not clear that intelligible actions are those for which the agent is accountable. Actions of children and the insane can be perfectly intelligible — even intelligible within some kind of narrative structure — without being those for which the agents are accountable.

More troublesome, though, is the status of the narrative unity claim. Is it descriptive or prescriptive? If descriptive, asserting that selves simply conceive themselves as unified over their lives within a narrative structure, then it seems false. As Galen Strawson points out, some people (and he claims to be one) are "Episodics," those who have "little or no sense that the self that one is was there in the (further) past and will be there in the future," and thus "are likely to have no particular tendency to see their life in Narrative terms" (Strawson 2004, 430). In addition, this observation bodes ill for the Kantian, insofar as it asserts the possibility of practical agency for those who do not view themselves as diachronically unified, i.e., unified practical agency may indeed not be a practical necessity. On the other hand, if the narrative unity thesis is supposed to be prescriptive, urging that people ought to view themselves as unified over time within a narrative structure, then it poses no threat to disuniting theories of identity like reductionism, for it would have to allow that life-long unity may simply not occur. Indeed, if the account is prescriptive, then it actually makes more sense to consider persons to be disunified, if what they ought to strive for is greater unity. If unity were a given, such striving would be unnecessary.

But even if we grant the need for the kind of unity desired by both the Kantians and the communitarians, this does not yet imply that we must grant the life-long unity on which they both insist. It may be instead that only certain parts of one's life are unified in the way they describe, and these could in fact be stretches defined also by the obtaining of strong psychological connectedness, say. In other words, it could be that reductionist theories of personal identity dovetail with these normative considerations already, so that rather than constituting a constraint on that theory (and disuniting theories like it), such considerations actually buttress it.

A third argument that ethics constrains metaphysics insists that, because our commonsense intuitions are at loggerheads over the thought experiments motivating the various metaphysical theories, the only plausible methodological solution to this underlying conflict is going to be revisionary, requiring us to abandon one of the conflicting sets of intuitions. But on the basis of what? Carol Rovane suggests that we start with something with which everyone could agree, namely, a conception of the kind "person" built into the foundations of every ethical position (including anti-theoretical ones). Once we have a conception of the condition of personhood in place — what Rovane calls "the ability to engage in agency-regarding relations" (Rovane 1998, 5) — we can then go on to construct a metaphysical theory of personal identity on top of this ethical concept. For Rovane, this will yield the rather surprising possibility of both group persons, composed of many human bodies (insofar as the group can function as an individual agent), and multiple persons, simultaneously existing within only one human body (insofar as each "personality" can function as an individual agent) (ibid., chapters 4-5).

Others have been moved as well by the thought that our conflicting intuitions in the puzzle cases require a very different approach to the issue of personal identity (see, e.g., Wilkes 1988; Schechtman 1996). But it is not entirely clear why this ought to be the case. After all, the fact that our intuitions conflict does not necessarily mean that there is some deep-seated, ineliminable incoherence in our concept of a person. Instead, it may simply mean that there are conditions restricting the deployment of our concept to anything other than paradigm cases (so that we have inclinations about the puzzle cases, but any intuitions we claim to have are extrapolations from, and not applications of, that restricted concept we have), or it might mean that we are actually unsure what our intuitions are about the puzzle cases (for the former objection, see Gendler 2002a, 231; for the latter, see Degaynesford 2001, 171). In any case, the move to reject the method altogether seems as yet unmotivated. Further, it is also unclear just why a rejection of the standard methodology necessitates the move to an ethical concept of personhood and personal identity, as opposed, say, to a prudential or aesthetic version (both of which would still be normative). Finally, even if we do agree to the need for a distinctly ethical concept, it is not clear why the one Rovane has chosen is supposed to be uniquely suited to our purposes. After all, there will be plenty of other possible concepts that are least as plausible as having the agency-regarding ability, including concepts emphasizing the ability to experience complex emotions, to control certain aspects of their world, or to feel pleasure and pain (see Gendler 2002a, 236). Why privilege agency-regarding capacities over these?

In this section we have examined a variety of challenges to the standard methodological view, all suggesting in one way or another that, if there even is a relation here, it runs from ethics to metaphysics, that is, ethics is methodologically prior to, and both informs and constrains, our metaphysics. What we have seen, though, is that the success of these arguments is far from established, and that despite their urgings, we may still have good reason to maintain the belief that there is indeed an important relation between personal identity and ethics and, further, that the ethics depends, in certain respects, on the metaphysics. We will now turn to a discussion of the various forms such a relation might take.

4. Prudential and Moral Units

Suppose, then, that considerations of identity — or at least of what matters in identity — have an impact on normative theory. What people typically take this to mean is that some criterion of personal identity will fill in a key blank in the normative theory, namely, regarding what the prudentially or morally significant metaphysical units are. In other words, our conclusions about identity will hopefully inform us as to just what the unity conditions are for the targets of prudential and moral theorizing. Consider prudence, for example. In deliberating about what is in my best interest, what is needed is some conception of the scope of the "my" in question, i.e., what unit my deliberations are to cover. Similarly, when it comes to the question of moral responsibility, we want to know what units are subject to attributions of praise or blame, whether, for instance, X at t1 and Y at t2 are unified in a way that justifies holding Y responsible for the actions of X. In each case, what we want is a specification of certain metaphysical unities we can target in our prudential or moral theorizing.

But notice that a specification of possible metaphysical unities will not be sufficient for these purposes, for what we need in addition is a specification of which such unities are significant for prudential or moral purposes. To see why this is an issue, consider just reductionism. Reductionism is actually quite a general metaphysical view, holding at its most basic that the facts about identity simply consist in more particular facts about brains, bodies, and so forth. But even if one accepts reductionism, and so abandons appeal to some further, nonreductionist fact to explain personal identity, and even if one also believes that identity is not what matters in survival, one still has much work to do before being able to apply the theory to prudence and ethics. This is because there are actually three possible metaphysical units — unified by three of the more particular relations involved in identity — that could be targeted for normative theorizing. First, we might target what we can call persons, entities unified by psychological continuity (overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness). These entities would endure from psychological birth to psychological death, and so would closely correspond to the lives of ordinary persons as we know them. Second, we might target selves, entities unified by strong psychological connectedness. Such units would have significant duration, but they would not be likely to endure for as long as persons, insofar as memories typically fade, beliefs and desires are lost or revised over time, and so forth. Third, we might target atoms, or momentary experiencers, "units" defined and delimited by the duration of an experience. In other words, it may be that, if the further fact of identity is gone, there just are no other relations of significance that can be put in its stead, so all that remains are merely the basic atomic moments of people's lives (Shoemaker 1999b, 401; for a similar distinction, see Brink 1997b, 110-115, where he labels the three possible units "persons," "person-segments," and "person-slices").

(Notice also that the unity relation is not the same as the identity relation. After all, I may bear the unity relation of psychological connectedness, say, to both of my fission products, without either of them being identical to me, given that the logic of identity prevents it from holding one-many. But when we give up on the importance of the identity relation per se, we do so in favor of one or more of the unity relations in which identity, absent uniqueness, consists.)

So it is not enough that we articulate the various possible metaphysical units. We further must figure out a way to identify which one we ought to target for prudence and ethics (or whether just one will do the trick for all forms of normative theorizing). So in its purely metaphysical guise, reductionism must settle merely for presenting these three alternatives, remaining officially neutral on which one the normative theorists should adopt. This two-step process — identifying the possible metaphysical units, then narrowing down the list to the prudentially and morally significant metaphysical units — is often overlooked by those wishing to adopt metaphysical conclusions in their normative theorizing, but both steps are important (a notable exception to the trend is Brink; see his 1990, 1997a, and 1997b).

Once we make the switch from talk of identity to talk of unity relations as being prudentially and morally significant, however, things can also get quite complicated. For there seems no reason in principle why two of the contending intrapersonal unity relations — continuity and connectedness — cannot also hold interpersonally. That is, not only could psychological continuity, say, hold one-many, between me-now and more than one person in the future, but it could also hold between me-now and other spatially distinct, simultaneously-existing persons (Brink 1997a, 141-143, 1997b, 125-128). And the same could be true as well of psychological connectedness (Shoemaker 2000, 355-362). At least some of the psychological relations making up connectedness and continuity can obviously obtain interpersonally, e.g., sameness of beliefs/desires/goals, and resemblance of character. But it also seems perfectly possible that memories and intentions may be shared between persons, produced by some common cause (ibid.). Recognizing these connections widens the boundaries of what counts as a targeted unit (and in so doing it may also blur the boundaries between prudence and morality), but the ensuing messiness may not be worth it. After all, if the proper moral unit is a self, say, unified by psychological connectedness, which obtains by degrees, that means that my unity with many others — and with future stages of myself — will be only partial, obtaining to various people to varying degrees. But if these are the units targeted by morality, how do we mark their boundaries such that the moral concepts and principles coherently apply (McMahan 2002, 62)? In addition, who exactly would the practical agents in question be, where people are more or less unified with each other (Brink 1997b, 113-114)? And there may also be worries about how to apply moral concepts admitting of no scalar dimensions — like promises — to moral units — like selves — that do (Williams 1976, 202-204). These questions (and more) pose genuine challenges for accounts allowing for such interpersonal unities. On the other hand, as we will see, there are certainly features of commonsense morality that the interpersonal relations view can explain that other views may not.

5. Identity and Normative Ethics

We turn now to examine specific ways in which personal identity may have implications for various branches of moral philosophy. The most widely discussed branch in the literature thus far has been normative ethics, the realm of ethical theory. We have already seen the way in which Kantians and communitarians have tried to show how normative ethics constrains theories of personal identity. One speculative (and ad hominem) reason for this attempt may simply be that those who argue in the opposite direction — by trying to show the implications of personal identity theory for normative ethics — have, by and large, been doing so in order to boost the plausibility of consequentialism, and, more specifically, utilitarianism. There are various ways in which such an attempt proceeds.

First, one might identify a serious objection to utilitarianism, say, and then show how considerations of personal identity (or at least of what matters in identity) dissolve the objection. This is the approach Parfit takes in Reasons and Persons. The objection he is concerned to refute is Rawls' famous "separateness of persons" charge, the contention that utilitarianism fails to take seriously the distinction between persons, because it controversially jettisons interpersonal distributive principles in exactly the way we uncontroversially jettison them intrapersonally (Rawls 1971, 22-27). That is, in extending the principle of rational choice to society-wide decision-making (via use of the imagined impartial spectator), utilitarianism treats the interests of all members of society as if they were the interests of one person, and so conflates different persons into one. What Parfit suggests is that, if the objection depends on a hard-and-fast metaphysical distinction between persons (i.e., on the non-identity of different persons), and if this distinction depends on the further fact of identity — a nonexistent fact if reductionism is true — then the distinction is nothing to take seriously in the first place. Utilitarians, in other words, may be reductionists, justifiably ignoring the "distinctness" between persons — and the distributive principles such a distinction might support — because the non-identity of persons is just a less deep fact (Parfit 1984, 329-345; see also Broome 1991 for a reductionist-based argument in support of utilitarianism's account of goodness).

There are several subtle arguments in support of this general conclusion (for a summary, see Shoemaker 2002a, 60-63, 66-68), but note for now that the success of the argument actually depends on the specific version of reductionism being advanced. After all, there are three possible morally significant metaphysical units compatible with (psychological) reductionism, and it turns out that the larger the unit, the less successful the argument will be. In other words, if one believes that the only relevant units are person-atoms (momentary experiencers), given that in the absence of the further fact of identity one believes there just are no other unifying relations of any significance, then it is easy to see the complete analogy between individual lives and sets of lives: neither are unified by any significant metaphysical relations, so we could think of them both as just big collections of experiences, in which case there would seem to be no reason to apply distributive principles within either (or, alternatively, no reason not to apply such principles to both — how much weight they ought to bear in that case would remain open, however). But notice that if one adopts either of the other two versions of reductionism, according to which either selves or persons are the basic moral units, the argument may not be as successful. If, for instance, it is psychological continuity that matters instead of the further fact of identity — and matters just as much as identity was thought to — then persons are the morally significant metaphysical units, but then there remains a metaphysical distinction between persons, for psychological continuity, in the absence of interpersonal connectedness, fails to unify sets of lives in the way it does individual lives (see Jeske 1993; Brink 1997a). And the same goes for psychological connectedness, which would unify selves in a way rendering them metaphysically distinct from sets of lives (Shoemaker 2002a).

It looks, then, as if the only way to bolster support for utilitarianism (with a version of this argument, anyway) is to adopt the extreme view, that the morally significant metaphysical units are momentarily-existing person-atoms. But this is implausible, for it is very difficult even to make sense of a momentary agent. Agents, after all, have interests and projects they seek to advance that necessarily project them into the future. In order to be what one is at any moment, then, one must identify with one's future. "When the person is viewed as an agent, no clear content can be given to the idea of a merely present self" (Korsgaard 1989, 114; see also Williams 1976, 204-207, and Brink 1997b, 112-113). But if one moves away from atoms as the basic moral units for these sorts of practical reasons, the separation between selves/persons and sets of lives becomes more distinct.

Unless, that is, one allows that the relations that matter in identity can hold interpersonally, in which case a number of interesting possibilities arise. For instance, Brink argues that the possibility of interpersonal continuity supports a kind of consequentialism via rational egoism. If one is a rational egoist, one will aim to promote one's own good. What counts as one's own, though — what counts as contained within the prudentially significant metaphysical unit — given reductionism, is defined by psychological continuity (Brink argues against the coherence or practical feasibility of both atoms and selves as the basic units). But if continuity also holds interpersonally, then the rational egoist must, if truly rational, promote the good of all those with whom he is continuous, which, given the thought that each of us bears only six degrees of separation from every other person, generates an important kind of impartial, universalist consequentialism: "the egoist can recognize derivative but non-instrumental reason to be concerned about others" (Brink 1997b, 127). Of course, if the utter impartiality of a universalist consequentialism is implausible for the way it overlooks the importance to us of the special concern we have for friends and loved ones, perhaps one can introduce the idea of degrees of continuity, in which case the concern the egoist must have for others "is proportional to the amount of psychological continuity that exists between the agent and others" (ibid., 128; see also McMahan 2002, 59-66).

Of course, while connectedness clearly comes in degrees, it is less clear that continuity does. For one thing, if continuity consists in strong connectedness, and what makes for such strength is the obtaining of an amount of direct psychological connections above some specified threshhold (as it does for Parfit 1984, 206), then continuity is not a matter of degree: either strong connectedness obtains at each link in the chain or it does not (Belzer 2005). But even if we allow that some links in the chain may be weaker than others, if what matters is the existence of the chain, it is difficult to see why its strength in certain patches is relevant. In other words, even if we allow that continuity comes in degrees, it is not entirely clear why our patterns of concern ought to track the amount and not simply the fact of continuity. Indeed, if what matters is supposed to be the degree of continuity, it might seem to make more sense simply to focus on the more obviously scalar relation in which continuity consists, viz., connectedness, as delivering the units of significance in the form of selves.

While focus on selves could perhaps yield a very complicated form of consequentialism (involving the introduction into deliberation of the good of all affected parties — including future selves — weighted according to the degrees of connectedness obtaining between them and the deliberator), another, perhaps more promising, approach would be to appeal to reductionist selves to buttress a different ethical theory altogether, namely contractualism. One longstanding objection to the theory is that it has no way of motivating the amoralist to adhere to the demands of morality. But we can assume that the amoralist is at least prudentially rational. If so, then one very plausible way to model ordinary prudential deliberation is as consisting of a desire that one's actions be justifiable to all affected future stages of oneself (see, e.g., McClennen 1990, 217). But if the relation that matters in identity is connectedness, it should ground such prudential concern in a way that restricts required justification only to those stages with whom one expects to be connected. But then if connectedness holds interpersonally, the rational amoralist must also extend that desire for justifiability to all those with whom he is psychologically connected, and this will take him a long ways towards having the moral motivation at the heart of contractualism (for this sort of argument, see Shoemaker 2000; for the basic view of contractualism presupposed here, see Scanlon 1982 and 1998).

As we can see, then, one may deploy reductionism in very different ways to achieve very different results for ethical theory, depending on the basic units one emphasizes. Of course, there may simply be no single relation appropriate for the tracking of all our patterns of concern, i.e., some patterns of concern may properly track continuity, some may track connectedness, and some may target simple momentary experiences. If this is the case, then it may be difficult to see what uniform conclusions, if any, can be drawn for ethical theory. But one element is common across all approaches to the issue: if any metaphysical identity or unity relation is relevant for ethical theory, it will be distinctly psychological; no physicalist or animalist criterion of identity will have a bearing on ethical theory, because bodies and animals are not (necessarily) persons, and it is personhood — and its close cousin moral agency — that ethical theory is concerned with when it comes to issues requiring tracking across time, such as compensation, moral motivation (where the moral deliberator is related to the moral actor), and distributive principles generally (obviously, ethics is also concerned with the treatment of both animals and bodies, but the concern in such cases is always focused on moral status at a time — regarding experiential elements like pleasure and pain, or certain physical and psychological capacities and potentialities — and not over time).

Of course, there is a different way to put this that reveals that biological theories of identity do actually have an impact for ethics, namely, if they are true, then numerical identity is just irrelevant for the practical relations that matter ethically, i.e., identity just is not what matters for ethics (see Olson 1997, 70-72). Obviously, this would be very surprising for theorists like Butler, Reid, and even Locke to hear, but if we are to preserve even a modicum of our current concern-based practices in ethical theory, it must be true.

6. Identity and Metaethics

Following Michael Smith, we may categorize problems regarding the nature and conditions of freedom and moral responsibility as metaethical (Smith 1997, 293). That being the case, the obvious place to look for a relation between personal identity and metaethics will be with one of our opening questions: what justifies our holding a person morally responsible for some past action? And here, intuitions about the tightness of the connection between the identity relation and legitimate responsibility are very strong. For example, Theodore Sider takes it to be a platitude that "no person can be held responsible for another's crime" (Sider 2001a, 203-204). Now while this platitude purports to be about what sort of legal responsibility is appropriate, it seems simply a specification of the more general principle that no one can be justifiably morally responsible for anyone else's actions. Implied by the platitude, then, is that a necessary condition of Y's being morally responsible for the earlier actions of X is that Y is the same person as X (there may very well be mitigating factors, though, that prevent identity from being a sufficient condition for moral responsibility).

It is important to be clear about the nature of the platitude. One might think, for instance, that there are obvious counterexamples: parents are sometimes held responsible for the actions of their children, and accomplices are held responsible for the crimes committed by others. But the defender of the platitude may simply point out that, in each case, the person held responsible is actually being held responsible for what he or she did. For example, the parent is being held responsible, not for what his child did, but for his (in)action in letting the child do what she did, say. Or the accomplice is being held responsible, not for what the criminal did, but for what the accomplice did in aiding the criminal. So in both cases there is some properly specified action for which only the person identical to the actor may be held responsible.

Ordinarily, of course, what grounds legal responsibility is something like a physical criterion of identity: as long as X and Y have the same DNA, then they are the same person, and so Y can justly be held responsible for the crimes of X. But it seems clear that these physical strands are merely contingent, albeit reliable, indicators of the identity-condition that actually matters, viz., some form of psychological relation. What we are looking for, after all, is the same moral agent — a psychological being — and given that, for us humans as presently constructed, sameness of moral agency corresponds to sameness of DNA, say, identification of DNA patterns reliably tracks the responsible agent in question. But it is easy to see that, if DNA patterns changed over time, or it were possible to alter them in a way that nevertheless preserved psychological continuity, they would be about as useful as indicators of responsibility as would be the color or length of one's hair. Indeed, criteria of legal responsibility are typically epistemological criteria, whereas what we are interested in with respect to moral responsibility are metaphysical criteria, the criteria presupposed by the epistemological criteria in the first place (you must know what you are looking for in order to know whether you have found it). And once again it seems obvious that such criteria will need to involve some sort of psychological continuity.

This is what Locke thought, of course, as have most others, so it seems natural to advance the familiar Psychological Criterion as the account of personal identity constituting the necessary condition for Y's being justly responsible for the actions of X: X at t1 is the same person as Y at t2 if and only if Y is psychologically continuous with X. The standard problem for this view, however, is provided once more by the fission case. Were X to divide into Y and Z, both would be psychologically continuous with X (rendering them both, on this criterion, identical with X), but they could not be identical with each other (violating the transitivity of identity). To avoid this violation, then, we must install a uniqueness clause into our criterion, such that Y is identical to X only if the relation of continuity obtains between them uniquely. But suppose that X had robbed a bank and then rushed to the fission doctor. Both Y and Z thus would seem to remember X's theft, they would still be buzzing over the thrill of the getaway chase, they would each have inherited an intention to spend the money on wine, women, and song, they would each persist in X's beliefs about the justification for the crime, and so forth. Yet once we include the uniqueness clause, neither is identical to X, and if identity is a necessary condition of responsibility, neither is morally responsible for his crime. But this would strike us as terribly implausible (nevertheless, it is a view the nonreductionist is probably saddled with in the fission case; see Parfit 1984, 323-325).

There are two plausible replies, familiar by now. On the one hand, we can go four-dimensionalist (as does Sider), and hold that Y and Z are indeed two people who were, essentially, present all along, overlapping in all their spatial parts during the temporal stage of the life when they were known as "X." This allows us to preserve the platitude that one person cannot be held responsible for the actions of another — in other words, it is identity that is necessary for responsibility — while also preserving the thought that the high degree of psychological continuity that obtains between the various parties is what grounds our belief that X has not gotten away with his crime just by undergoing fission.

Nevertheless, this option has some uncomfortable implications. For one thing, we think "I" uniquely refers, but "I" in X's mouth would, in this case, actually be referring to two people, Y and Z. Or perhaps that is not quite right; perhaps instead "I" in X's mouth refers to only one person, either Y or Z. But in that case, no one, not even "the" speaker, could possibly know to which one it referred. And there are other worries. For instance, whether or not the pre-fission X consists in two overlapping persons depends entirely on what happens in the future, i.e., on whether or not X goes through with the fission. So if X is driving from the bank to the fission doctor and then gets cold feet, there will be no fission and thus no Y or Z. But then whether or not Y or Z exist at the time of X's cold feet depends on whether or not X even gets cold feet, which seems, at the very least, quite odd. Whether or not "I" now consist in one or two people should not, we want to say, depend on what happens to me in the future.

Now these are just standard puzzles for four-dimensionalism about persons (see Olson 1997, van Inwagen 2002, and Olson's entry on personal identity). But there are also puzzles for four-dimensionalism specific to its treatment of the responsibility case. For instance, if responsibility depends on identity, and identity is a transitive relation, then if Y is responsible for the actions of X (insofar as Y is unified with X as part of the same person-worm), and Z is responsible for the actions of X (insofar as Z is unified with X as part of the same person-worm), then wouldn't Y also be responsible for the actions of Z (and vice versa)? Of course, unity relations are not identity relations, but it is unclear just why they do not have to be transitive in the way the identity relation is supposed to be (in Sider 2001a, 203, he simply insists that they do not have to be, without saying why). Furthermore, the four-dimensionalist solution is meant to preserve the commonsense platitude, but it does so in virtue of a solution that seems about as far from commonsense as it can be. Indeed, the platitude is about the responsibility of persons, but four-dimensionalism offers only a solution regarding the responsibility of person-stages (ibid.; see also Parfit 1976).

A second reply, then, is reductionist, and it simply denies the platitude. In other words, identity is not what matters for moral responsibility. Instead (the reductionist could say), what matters is psychological continuity (or connectedness). This allows the reductionist to handle the fission case in the following way: while neither Y nor Z is identical with X, both are fully psychologically continuous with him, and insofar as psychological continuity is the necessary condition for responsibility, both Y and Z may be morally responsible for X's crimes. Alternatively, one may want to insist that it is connectedness that matters for justifying responsibility, and insofar as connectedness comes in degrees, so does responsibility, such that Y and Z are responsible for X's crimes to the degree to which they are psychologically connected with him.

This approach is not without its problems either, however. For one thing, it does deny an actual platitude: it is very counterintuitive to say that one person (or, in our imagined case, two persons) could be responsible for the actions of someone else. In addition, if we allow the possibility of interpersonal connectedness/continuity into the mix, then even in non-fission cases we would have to allow for the possibility that one could be responsible for the actions of all those with whom one is connected/continuous, which on its face seems terribly implausible. But our options are fairly stark, given the possibility of fission: either (a) we reject that psychological relations matter for responsibility, (b) we reject the platitude that identity is necessary for responsibility, or (c) we reject the commonsense belief that persons come one to an "I"-reference (or body). These are hard choices, and the answer we settle on will likely depend on what precisely it is we really want our theory of moral responsibility, at the end of the day, to do.

7. Identity and Applied Ethics

Perhaps the most exciting and variegated explorations of the relation between identity and normativity are taking place these days in the arena of applied ethics, specifically in medical ethics and bioethics. These typically involve attempts to chart the relation between some clear-cut person and either an earlier or later entity "at the margins of life." We will here discuss just two arenas in which the relation between identity and ethics is thought to be particularly relevant.

7.1 Embryonic Research and Abortion

There are several ways in which personal identity is taken to be relevant to the debates over these topics. Consider first embryos and the contemporary dispute over the morality of stem cell research. The most commonly cited argument against such research is that, in its most promising form, it will involve destruction of two- to five-day-old embryos (in order to harvest their inner cell mass, which is what is used for the development of stem cells). But because human beings come into existence at the "moment" of conception, embryos are human beings, and insofar as it is prima facie immoral to kill human beings, it is prima facie immoral to kill embryos (see, e.g., Peters 2001, 129).

References to identity in this debate come from objectors to this argument, who apply the argument from fission to a real life version of it, namely, twinning. Any time generally before the two-week point in fetal development an embryo might split, such that the now two embryos develop into fully formed infant twins. The question for the advocate of the above argument to consider is, in such a case, what happens to the original human being, the embryo we will call Adam? There are only three possibilities: (a) either Adam survives as both twins, (b) Adam survives only as one or the other of the twins, or (c) Adam does not survive. Option (a) cannot be right, given that the twins will live distinct, individual lives, and so will clearly be two human beings, not one. Option (b) cannot be right, for what non-arbitrary reason could there be for one of the twins to be Adam and not the other? They will both be qualitatively identical to Adam, after all. The only remaining option, then, is (c), in which Adam does not survive. But this has two bad implications for the above advocate. First, if it is a tragedy when a human being dies, then twinning involves a tragedy, and Adam's death, it seems, ought to be mourned. This seems absurd (McMahan 1995 and 2002, 26; Shoemaker 2005; although see Oderberg 1997 for an embrace of this implication). Second, if the metaphysical analysis is right, then Adam's death brings about the existence of two new human beings (call them Barney and Claire). But this means (1) that it is not the case that all human beings come into existence at conception (some come into existence at twinning), and (2) that death can somehow occur with no earthly remains, which is at best odd and at worst false (Kuhse and Singer 2002, 190; for these sorts of points applied to theological arguments about ensouled embryos, see Shoemaker 2005).

There are several possible replies, though. First, it is not clear that the options in twinning are exhausted by the three possibilities articulated above. A fourth possible option, it seems, is that of the four-dimensionalist, who can maintain that the embryo is a human being from the moment of conception by saying that the pre-twinning temporal parts of both Barney and Claire simply overlapped, i.e., what we called Adam was really a shared stage in the lives of both Barney and Claire. McMahan, for one, simply dismisses this possibility as absurd (McMahan 2002, 26), but it is not clear why, especially given that it is a straightforward application of a powerful metaphysical theory that has quite a bit of independent support (despite having its own set of problems, discussed briefly earlier). Second, the implications involved may not be as bad as indicated. For one thing, "death by twinning," while still a kind of death, may not be of a kind warranting the same sort of mourning typically expected to accompany regular "bodily" death. Furthermore, this kind of ceasing to exist, if it is a different kind of event than that of regular death, perhaps should not be expected to have the same kind of conditions — like the leaving of earthly remains — as regular death either. Think here of how we think of the similar "deaths" of splitting amoebas (ibid., 27).

Consider now just one way in which personal identity enters into the broader debate over abortion. Perhaps the most famous anti-abortion argument in the philosophical literature comes from Don Marquis, who argues that, because it is prima facie wrong to kill any entity with a future like ours, and because a fetus has a future like ours, it is prima facie wrong to kill a fetus (Marquis 1989). Peter McInerney and others, however, have denied that fetuses have futures like ours by appealing to considerations of identity. To have a future like ours, for instance, presupposes that one is identical to some person who will experience said future. But a fetus is not a person, it seems, and so it cannot be identical to any future person. Indeed, none of the relations deemed relevant to ordinary personal identity are present between a fetus and anything else, simply because a fetus lacks a psychology with memories, beliefs, desires, intentions, and a general character capable of establishing any sort of plausible connection to a future experiencer, so that any experiences that experiencer undergoes cannot be the fetus's future experiences (McInerney 1990; Brill 2003). (The same point might be true as well for infants, but instead of taking that to be a reductio of the objection, one might also quite plausibly take it simply to be a point in favor of rejecting Marquis's criterion of the wrongness of killing: given that infants also lack a future like ours, Marquis's account is substantially incomplete, for it fails to explain why killing infants is wrong, when it obviously is.)

This objection assumes a purely psychological criterion of identity, however, one in which, further, "person" is a substance sortal, a term designating a kind to which an individual always and essentially belongs throughout its existence. But "person" might be merely a phase sortal, designating a kind to which the individual belongs — if it does at all — for only part of its existence. This could mean, then, that I, now a person, could still be identical qua individual, to some organism — a fetus, say — that was not a person. Thus if some past fetus is identical to me — if we are one and the same animal, or organism — then he did indeed have a future like ours (for a view like this, see Olson 1998; for specific application of this view to the above objection, see Marquis 1998).

Clearly, though, if it is identity alone that renders a future experiencer's experiences as mine, then the view runs into difficulty when, once more, we consider the possibility of fission. If I undergo fission, then, given the standard arguments, I will not survive (setting four-dimensionalist considerations aside). Nevertheless, surely we want to say that I still have a valuable future — indeed, it is overwhelmingly plausible to say I will have two valuable futures. This only makes sense, though, if we prize apart the having of a valuable future from the obtaining of the identity relation. If we do so, though, we are insisting that the relations that matter in the having of a valuable future are definitely psychological, in which case, even if I am identical with some past fetus (qua organism or animal), that is irrelevant: what matters in the having of a valuable future does not obtain between us, so while a fetus has a future, it really does not have a future like ours.

A third kind of stance taken regarding identity and abortion is that there just is no relation of significance between them. Earl Conee argues in this way, insisting that the four main attempts to bolster some view about abortion with metaphysical conclusions fail, and thus that the metaphysics simply makes no moral difference, a conclusion "indicative of a general epistemic irrelevance of metaphysics to the moral issue" (Conee 1999, 619). But just because the various arguments fail (and Conee seems right about that), it does not yet follow that metaphysics generally makes no moral difference to questions about fetuses and embryos; indeed, we have just discussed two cases in which it clearly does. As Timothy Chappell puts it, Conee "does nothing to show that the right metaphysical doctrines — combined of course with the right moral doctrines — could not give us genuine reason to turn one way rather than the other in debates about abortion, or other similar debates about the extent of the moral community" (Chappell 2000, 279). And so it is to one of those "similar debates," this time regarding the other end of life, that we now turn.

7.2 Advanced Directives.

The philosophical puzzle regarding advance directives is fundamentally a puzzle about personal identity. Suppose that a woman is in the earliest stages of Alzheimer's disease, and she recognizes that there will come a point where she is in a demented state and will thus be incompetent to make autonomous or informed decisions about her treatment. Because she values her creativity and autonomy, she does not want that future demented self to be kept alive — its life will not be worth living — so she signs an advance directive stipulating that no life-saving measures are to be used on that future demented self (FDS). However, by the time her FDS gets pneumonia, she is quite content in her state and, when asked, says she wants to live (McMahan 2002, 497).

There is obviously a conflict here, but of what sort? If FDS is identical to the early-stage Alzheimer's self (EAS), then the conflict is between temporally distinct interests of the same person. But if that is the case, then we typically discount past interests in favor of present ones. If, when I was a ravenously carnivorous 20-year-old, I swore to myself that I would never pass up an opportunity to eat a juicy steak, yet I now find myself a vegetarian who gets queasy at the sight of medium-rare flesh on the table, it is obviously my present interests that will — and ought, we think — win the day.

On the other hand, if FDS is not identical to EAS — if, instead, she is a different person, or is at least a different self — then it may not be so obvious what the conflict is after all, for FDS has made her preferences clear, and if she is importantly distinct from the signer of the advance directive, then there seems little reason why the interests of EAS are relevant to FDS's life. But then again, FDS is not competent, and EAS, if not identical to her, is at least akin to her closest relative, one might think, in which case her earlier wishes perhaps ought to hold sway after all (see Luttrell and Sommerville 1996). (But EAS and FDS will be very psychologically different, we are supposing, so why think they are closely related at all? Indeed, wouldn't FDS be more closely "related" to her fellow end-stage Alzheimer's patients? So why think EAS has any more right to make life-or-death decisions about her than any of these others?)

And here is yet another way of looking at the matter. Suppose we agree with Parfit and others that identity just is not what matters for, among other things, defining and delimiting the scope of egoistic concern; suppose instead it is Relation R. FDS, because of her loss of memory and the like, will bear a very limited degree of that relation to EAS. EAS will thus be strongly R-related with most of the previous stages of her life (the chains of connectedness, let us stipulate, are very strong), but very weakly R-related with FDS, even though, it seems clear, FDS remains a stage of her life. But the part of her life most deeply prudentially unified — the far larger, more dominant part of her life — is the part of which EAS was still a strongly R-related part. Thus it might be that the wishes of EAS to preserve a coherently meaningful and valuable life ought to control here, given that the longer FDS lives, the worse she might retrospectively render EAS's life. That is, what is good for the deepest, longest prudential unity will be closest to what is best for the life as a whole, so FDS's good ought to be sacrificed for the sake of the good of the whole, as articulated by EAS in her advanced directive (see McMahan 2002, 502 for an argument like this).

Of course, once we abandon identity as what matters — especially if we do so in favor of a relation(s) that does not guarantee life-long unity (e.g., connectedness) — then it is not so clear anymore why what is best for the life-as-a-whole "unit" should matter at all. But if considerations of life-long welfare are set aside, then it is hard to see how EAS's advance directive could still have any moral authority over FDS's expressed interests. EAS's "life" would be over, for all intents and purposes, so it seems that no matter what happens to FDS, it cannot retroactively affect the value of EAS's already-completed "life."

As should be evident from just this very brief discussion, though, the issues here are quite complex, but they are most definitely issues depending on considerations of both personal identity and the importance of various possible unifying relations (and this is true as well for other topics in applied ethics drawing from personal identity, e.g., euthanasia, human cloning, and gene therapy). Once again, then, identity and ethics are closely intertwined.

8. Conclusion

The relation one finds, if any, between personal identity and ethics typically depends on what it is one wants from a theory of either. So, for example, beginning as we did with the motivational questions about responsibility, anticipation, and distributive principles suggested, quite naturally, that certain ethical questions depend on personal identity, that, for example, the proper theory of identity will constrain our conclusions about who counts as morally responsible, whose experiences one is justified in anticipating, and what units across which we may justifiably maximize. Thus, beginning the inquiry in this way yields the methodological direction of dependence assumed throughout much of our discussion.

Alternatively, one might start with certain inescapable normative commitments — e.g., the standpoint of practical agency, or the assumption of the intelligibility of action — and then explore what those commitments imply for — how they constrain — a theory of identity (thus those who start in this direction usually explore the world of identity theories in order to criticize those theories for ignoring one or more of our binding practical commitments). Or, finally, one might enter into the arena of personal identity indirectly, as merely one specific subtopic in a more general theory of the metaphysical identity of objects across time. Looked at in that way, personal identity may simply bear no relation to ethics — witness the animalism of Olson.

But if we what we want is some normative payoff to our metaphysical ruminations, we can certainly find it, essentially by assuming that it exists by the motivational questions we ask! In other words, if we want answers to these sorts of questions, about responsibility, maximization, and the like, and so we look to metaphysics to find them, we are likely to ignore certain theories of identity — again, like Olson's — given that they do not seem to have a direct bearing on normative issues. This desire for a relation between personal identity and ethics thus invariably leads to some sort of psychological criterion of identity, insofar as what we want depends on the moral significance of certain psychological relations, the relations of memory, intentions, desires, and character that typically comprise moral agency (indeed, this may be one way to read Locke's assertion that "person" is a forensic concept). And it is an easy step from there to the view that reductionism of some sort is true, that the identity relation per se is not what matters, and that responsibility, anticipation, maximization and the like actually depend on the existence and strength of certain psychological unity relations with a scalar dimension, such that (perhaps) we must revise certain of our normative practices as a result.

While this process may seem to be a paradigm case of question-begging, such an assessment may be both too harsh and too quick. After all, as briefly suggested much earlier, what we might be looking for, given our motivating questions, is neither a theory of personal identity nor a theory of ethics but instead a theory of the relation between the two. Thus, by employing reflective equilibrium, we bring to the table some of our commitments in ethics (compensation and moral responsibility presuppose numerical identity, say, and they require the obtaining of some sort of psychological relation) and some of our commitments in personal identity (it is an equivalence relation, it cannot hold one-many, and so forth), and then we try to achieve some sort of equilibrium across the board, occasionally abandoning some of the commitments we brought to the table while holding fast to others. Thus we may achieve answers to our questions without begging any, simply by allowing from the beginning that the commitments providing our starting point are merely provisional, and that we may wind up being quite surprised with the overall theory (and the concomitant commitments) with which we find ourselves at the end of the day. But this possibility in turn suggests that any relation that exists between identity and ethics is one that we in fact concoct in order to satisfy our distinctly normative ends. Indeed, how else could we bridge the is/ought gap between metaphysics and ethics in the first place without introducing what matters about the various metaphysical relations into the mix? Thus it is, at last, our general values that both motivate and constrain our theory of the relation between identity and ethics, so if that relation ever ceases to be valuable, it will, strangely enough, cease to exist.


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Related Entries

Butler, Joseph | communitarianism | four-dimensionalism | identity | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Locke, John | moral responsibility | personal identity | Reid, Thomas | temporal parts


The author is deeply grateful to Nicole Smith for her valuable and thorough research assistance during the preparation of this entry.

Copyright © 2005
David Shoemaker

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