This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

David Hume

Generally regarded as the most important philosopher ever to write in English, David Hume (1711-1776) -- the last of the great triumvirate of "British empiricists" -- was also noted as an historian and essayist. A master stylist in any genre, Hume's major philosophical works -- A Treatise of Human Nature (1739-1740), the Enquiries concerning Human Understanding (1748) and concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), as well as the posthumously published Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779) -- remain widely and deeply influential, despite their being denounced by many of his contemporaries as works of scepticism and atheism. While Hume's influence is evident in the moral philosophy and economic writings of his close friend Adam Smith, he also awakened Immanuel Kant from his "dogmatic slumbers" and "caused the scales to fall" from Jeremy Bentham's eyes. Charles Darwin counted Hume as a central influence, as did "Darwin's bulldog," Thomas Henry Huxley. The diverse directions in which these writers took what they gleaned from reading Hume reflect not only the richness of their sources but also the wide range of Hume's empiricism. Comtemporary philosophers recognize Hume as one of the most thoroughgoing exponents of philosophical naturalism.

1. Life and Works

Born in Edinburgh, Hume spent his childhood at Ninewells, the family's modest estate on the Whitadder River in the border lowlands near Berwick. His father died just after David's second birthday, "leaving me, with an elder brother and a sister under the care of our Mother, a woman of singular Merit, who, though young and handsome, devoted herself to the rearing and educating of her Children." (All quotations in this section from Hume's autobiographical essay, "My Own life", reprinted in HL.)

Katherine Falconer Home realized that young David was "uncommonly wake-minded" -- precocious, in her lowland dialect -- so when his brother went up to Edinburgh University, David, not yet twelve, joined him. He studied mathematics and contemporary science, and read widely in history, literature, and ancient and modern philosophy.

Hume's family thought him suited for a career in the law, but he preferred reading classical authors, especially Cicero, whose Offices became his secular substitute for The Whole Duty of Man and his family's strict Calvinism. Pursuing the goal of becoming "a Scholar & Philosopher," he followed a rigorous program of reading and reflection for three years until "there seem'd to be open'd up to me a New Scene of Thought."

The intensity of developing this philosophical vision precipitated a psychological crisis in the isolated scholar. Believing that "a more active scene of life" might improve his condition, Hume made "a very feeble trial" in the world of commerce, as a clerk for a Bristol sugar importer. The crisis passed and he remained intent on articulating his "new scene of thought." He moved to France, where he could live frugally, and settled in La Flèche, a sleepy village in Anjou best known for its Jesuit college. Here, where Descartes and Mersenne studied a century before, Hume read French and other continental authors, especially Malebranche, Dubos, and Bayle; he occasionally baited the Jesuits with iconoclastic arguments; and, between 1734 and 1737, he drafted A Treatise of Human Nature.

Hume returned to England in 1737 to ready his Treatise for the press. To curry favor with Bishop Butler, he "castrated" his manuscript, deleting his controversial discussion of miracles, along with other "nobler parts." Book I (Of the Understanding) and Book II (Of the Passions) was published anonymously in 1739. Book III (Of Morals) appeared in 1740, as well as an anonymous Abstract of the first two books of the Treatise. Although other candidates, especially Adam Smith, have occasionally been proposed as the Abstract's author, scholars now agree that it is Hume's work. The Abstract features a clear, succinct account of "one simple argument" concerning causation and the formation of belief. Hume's elegant summary presages his "recasting" of that argument in the first Enquiry.

The Treatise was no literary sensation but it didn't "fall dead-born from the press," as Hume disappointedly described its reception. Despite his surgical deletions, the Treatise attracted enough of a "murmour among the zealots" to fuel his life-long reputation as an atheist and a sceptic.

Back at Ninewells, Hume published two modestly successful volumes of Essays, Moral and Political in 1741 and 1742. When the Chair of Ethics and Pneumatical ("Mental") Philosophy at Edinburgh became vacant in 1745, Hume hoped to fill it, but his reputation provoked vocal and ultimately successful opposition. Six years later, he stood for the Chair of Logic at Glasgow, only to be turned down again. Hume never held an academic post.

In the wake of the Edinburgh debacle, Hume made the unfortunate decision to accept a position as tutor to the Marquess of Annandale, only to find that the young Marquess was insane and his estate manager dishonest. Hume managed to extricate himself from this situation, and accepted the invitation of his cousin, Lieutenant-General James St. Clair, to be his Secretary ("I wore the uniform of an officer.") on a military expedition against the French in Quebec. Contrary winds delayed St. Clair's fleet until the Ministry canceled the plan, only to spawn a new expedition that ended as an abortive raid on the coastal town of L'Orient in Brittany.

Hume also accompanied St. Clair on an extended diplomatic mission to Vienna and Turin in 1748. While he was in Italy, the Philosophical Essays concerning Human Understanding appeared. A recasting of the central ideas of Book I of the Treatise, the Philosophical Essays were read and reprinted, eventually becoming part of Hume's Essays and Treatises under the title by which they are known today, An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding. In 1751, this Enquiry was joined by a second, An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals. Hume described the second Enquiry, a substantially rewritten version of Book III of the Treatise, as "incomparably the best" of all his works. More essays, the Political Discourses, appeared in 1752, and Hume's correspondence also reveals that a draft of the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion was underway at this time.

An offer to serve as Librarian to the Edinburgh Faculty of Advocates gave Hume the opportunity to work steadily on another project, a History of England, which was published in six volumes in 1754, 1756, 1759, and 1762. His History became a best-seller, finally giving him the financial independence he had long sought.

But even as a librarian, Hume managed to arouse the ire of the "zealots." In 1754, his order for several "indecent Books unworthy of a place in a learned Library" prompted a move for his dismissal, and in 1756, an unsuccessful attempt to excommunicate him. The Library's Trustees canceled his order for the offending volumes, which Hume regarded as a personal insult. Since he needed the Library's resources for his History, Hume did not resign his post; he did turn over his salary to Thomas Blacklock, a blind poet he befriended and sponsored. When research for the History was done in 1757, Hume quickly resigned to make the position available for Adam Ferguson.

Hume's publication of Four Dissertations (1757) was also surrounded by controversy. In 1755, he was ready to publish a volume that included "Of Suicide" and "Of the Immortality of the Soul." He suppressed the controversial essays when his publisher, Andrew Millar, was threatened with legal action, due largely to the machinations of the minor theologian William Warburton. Hume added "Of Tragedy" and "Of the Standard of Taste" to round out the volume, which also included The Natural History of Religion and A Dissertation on the Passions.

In 1763, Hume accepted an invitation from Lord Hertford, the Ambassador to France, to serve as his Private Secretary. During his three years in Paris, Hume became Secretary to the Embassy and eventually its Chargè d'Affaires. He also become the rage of the Parisian salons, enjoying the conversation and company of Diderot, D'Alembert, and d'Holbach, as well as the attentions and affections of the salonnières, especially the Comtesse de Boufflers.

Hume returned to England in 1766, accompanied by Jean-Jacques Rousseau, who was then fleeing persecution in Switzerland. Their friendship ended quickly and miserably when the paranoid Rousseau became convinced that Hume was masterminding an international conspiracy against him.

After a year (1767-68) as an Under-Secretary of State, Hume returned to Edinburgh to stay. His autumnal years were spent quietly and comfortably, dining and conversing with friends, and revising his works for new editions of his Essays and Treatises, which contained his collected essays, the two Enquiries, A Dissertation on the Passions, and The Natural History of Religion. In 1775, he added an "Advertisement" to these volumes, in which he appeared to disavow the Treatise. Though he regarded this note as "a compleat Answer" to his critics, especially "Dr. Reid and that biggotted, silly fellow, Beattie," subsequent readers have wisely chosen to ignore Hume's admonition to ignore his greatest philosophical work.

Upon finding that he had intestinal cancer, Hume prepared for his death with the same peaceful cheer that characterized his life. He arranged for the posthumous publication of his most controversial work, the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion; it was seen through the press by his nephew and namesake in 1779, three years after his uncle's death.

2. The Treatise and the Enquiries

Hume's apparent disavowal of the Treatise raises a question as to how we should read his works. Should we take his "Advertisement" literally and let the Enquiries represent his considered view? Or should we take him seriously and conclude -- whatever he may have said or thought -- that the Treatise is the best statement of his position?

Both responses presuppose that there are substantial enough differences between the works to warrant our reading them as disjoint. This is highly dubious. Even in the "Advertisement," Hume says that "most of the principles, and reasonings, contained in this volume, were published" in the Treatise, and that he has "cast the whole anew in the following pieces, where some negligences in his former reasoning and more in the expression, are...corrected" (EHU, "Advertisement"). Despite his protests, this hardly sounds like the claims of one who has genuinely repudiated his earlier work.

Hume reinforced this perspective when he wrote Gilbert Elliot of Minto that "the philosophical principles are the same in shortening and simplifying the questions, I really render them much more complete" (HL, I:158). And in "My Own Life," he opined that the Treatise's lack of success "proceeded more from the manner than the matter." Hume's "recasting" of the Treatise was probably designed primarily to address this point. This brief overview of Hume's central views on method, epistemology, and ethics therefore follows the structure -- "the manner" -- of the Enquiries and emphasizes "the matter" they have in common with the Treatise.

3. Method

In his Introduction to the Treatise, Hume bemoans the sorry state of philosophy, evident even to "the rabble without doors," which has given rise to "that common prejudice against metaphysical reasonings of all kinds" (T, xiv). He hopes to correct this miserable situation by introducing "the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects," establishing "a science of human nature" that will put philosophy on a "solid foundation" of "experience and observation" (T, Introduction).

Hume's positive, naturalistic project has much in common with contemporary cognitive science. Recent readers have paid more attention to these aspects of his philosophy than his earlier critics apparently did. As a result, no contemporary Hume scholar entirely accepts the traditional view that Hume was solely a negative philosopher whose goal was to make manifest the sceptical consequences of the views of his empiricist predecessors. But there remains considerable disagreement about the role and extent of scepticism in his philosophy, and disagreement about its relation to the naturalistic elements of his system. What Hume says about his aims and method helps clarify these issues.

In An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, Hume says that he will "follow a very simple method," which will nonetheless bring about "a reformation in moral disquisitions" like that already accomplished in natural philosophy, where we have been cured of "a common source of illusion and mistake" -- our "passion for hypotheses and systems." To make parallel progress in the moral sciences, we should "reject every system...however subtle or ingenious, which is not founded on fact and observation," and "hearken to no arguments but those which are derived from experience" (EPM, 173-175).

The "hypotheses and systems" Hume rejects cover a wide range of philosophical and theological views. These theories were too entrenched, too influential, and too different from his proposed science of human nature to permit him just to present his "new scene of thought" as their replacement. He needed to show why we should reject these theories, so that he might have space to develop his own.

Hume outlines this strategy in the first section of An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding. He considers two prominent types of "false metaphysics" (EHU, 12). Though each type has as its basis an appealing human characteristic, both views extend their accounts of these characteristics beyond their basis in experience, and so beyond the bounds of cognitive content.

The first view looks at humans as active creatures, driven by desires and feelings. It paints a flattering picture of human nature, easy to understand and even easier to accept. These philosophers make us feel what they say about our feelings, and what they say is so useful and agreeable that ordinary people who encounter these views are readily inclined to accept them. This view might be called sentimentalism. It is a generic characterization of the position defended in Hume's time by Shaftesbury and Francis Hutcheson.

The other view downgrades sentiment to concentrate on rationality, which it treats as the distinctive human characteristic. This view glorifies the reasonable aspects of our natures and appeals to them in its emphasis on rarefied speculation and abstract argument. The systems of Descartes and other rationalist philosophers fit this general description. Given its emphasis on the role of the intellect, this view might be called intellectualism.

Intellectualism and sentimentalism seem to be exhaustive alternatives, ways of characterizing the ancient debate as to whether reason or passion is, or should be, the dominant force in human life. Hume saw that both approaches capture important aspects of human nature, but that neither tells the whole story. We are active and reasonable creatures. A view that mixes both styles of philosophy will be best, so long as it gets the mixture right.

But getting the mixture right, Hume realized, is no easy task. Intellectualism is too abstract, too remote from ordinary life to have any practical application. It can indulge the worst excesses of human vanity, especially when it treats matters that are beyond the limits of human understanding. It can be co-opted by popular superstitions, peddling religious fears and prejudices cloaked in profound-sounding but meaningless metaphysical jargon.

It is tempting to react to these features of intellectualism by arguing that we should abandon metaphysics altogether. But ordinary life doesn't equip us to do good metaphysics, and without some measure of accurate metaphysical description, sentimentalism can't be as precise as it should be. Delicate sentiment requires just reasoning, and an adequate account of just reasoning requires an accurate and precise metaphysics. The only way to correct sentiment and to avoid the sources of error and uncertainty rooted in intellectualism, is to do more metaphysics -- but of the right kind. We must pursue true metaphysics if we want to jettison these false and deceptive views.

Hume's insight was to see that getting the correct mixture requires a two-fold task, with negative and positive aspects. To develop a science of human nature, it is first necessary to undermine the foundations of all forms of false and misleading metaphysics. When we are rid of these sources of superstition, prejudice, and error, the stage will be clear for the kind of mental geography that constitutes true metaphysics. Accurate, just reasoning about human nature -- the descriptive project of true metaphysics -- requires us to examine the scope and limits of our cognitive capacities, so that we may at last obtain an exact picture of the powers and limitations of human understanding.

The negative phase of Hume's project scrutinizes the central arguments of the dominant philosophical and theological views of his day and exposes the lack of cognitive content in their key notions. Hume's sceptical arguments are an important part of this negative phase. Since these arguments are among the most prominent and powerful Hume has to offer, it is not surprising that they are often mistaken for his final view. But these arguments function as reductios of theories he rejects, not as parts of the positive position he offers in their place. They point up the poverty of false metaphysics to rid us of the temptation of doing metaphysics this way. Only then will we be ready for the positive phase -- true metaphysics, which will replace the old incoherent metaphysics with the careful accurate description that is the proper goal of philosophy.

4. Empiricism

This combination of negative and positive aims is a distinguishing feature of Hume's particular brand of empiricism, and the strategy he devised to achieve these aims is revelatory of his philosophical genius. For Hume, all the materials of thinking -- perceptions -- are derived either from sensation ("outward sentiment") or from reflection ("inward sentiment") (EHU, 19). He divides perceptions into two categories, distinguished by their different degrees of force and vivacity. Our "more feeble" perceptions, ideas, are ultimately derived from our livelier impressions(EHU, Section II).

Although we permute and combine ideas in imagination to form complex ideas of things we haven't experienced, our creative powers extend no farther than "the materials afforded us by the senses and experience." Complex ideas are composed of simple ideas, which are fainter copies of the simple impressions from which they are ultimately derived, to which they correspond and exactly resemble. Hume offers this "general proposition" as his "first the science of human nature" (T, 7). Usually called the "Copy Principle," Hume's distinctive brand of empiricism is often identified with his commitment to it.

Hume presents the Copy Principle as an empirical thesis. He emphasizes this point by offering, in both the Treatise and the first Enquiry, as an empirical counterexample to the principle, "one contradictory phenomenon" (T, 5-6; EHU, 20-21) -- the infamous missing shade of blue. Hume asks us to consider "a person to have enjoyed his sight for thirty years, and to have become perfectly well acquainted with colours of all kinds, excepting one particular shade of blue..."(T, 6). Then

"Let all the different shades of that colour, except that single one, be plac'd before him, descending gradually from the deepest to the lightest; ‘tis plain, that he will perceive a blank, where that shade is wanting, and will be sensible, that there is a greater distance in that place betwixt the contiguous colours, than in any other. Now I ask, whether ‘tis possible for him, from his own imagination, to supply this deficiency, and raise up to himself the idea of that particular shade, tho’ it had never been conveyed to him by his senses? I believe there are few but will be of the opinion that he can; and this may serve as a proof, that the simple ideas are not always derived from the correspondent impressions; tho’ the instance is so particular and singular, that ‘tis scarce worth our observing, and does not merit that for it alone we should alter our general maxim" (T 6). Hume's critics have objected that, in offering this counterexample, he either unwittingly destroys the generality of the Copy Principle, which he needs, given the uses to which he will put it, or else his dismissive attitude toward the counterexample reflects his disingenuous willingness to apply the Copy Principle arbitrarily, while pretending that it really possesses the generality his uses of it require.

Hume's defenders, on the other hand, maintain either that he should have granted that the imaginative construction of the missing shade really produces a complex idea, or that he should have insisted that such counterexamples are exceedingly rare, and that the contentious metaphysical ideas, the cognitive content of which he uses the Copy Principle to critique, are not possibly ideas that could be generated by the imagination in the way the missing shade is supposedly generatred.

These defenses have their attractive points, but there is a far more satisfying resolution of the issue the missing shade raises available to Hume. In Book II of the Treatise, he describes a similar remarkably similar phenomenon that occurs with certain passions:

"Ideas may be compar'd to the extension and solidity of matter, and impressions, especially reflective ones, to colours, tastes, smells and other sensible qualities. Ideas never admit of a total union, but are endow'd with a kind of impenetrability, by which they exclude each other, and are capable of forming a compound by their conjunction, not by their mixture. On the other hand, impressions and passions are susceptible of an entire union; and like colours, may be blended so perfectly together, that each of them may lose itself, and contribute only to vary that uniform impression, which arises from the whole. Some of the most curious phaenomena of the human mind are deriv'd from this property of the passions" (T 366).

In these cases of "impressions and passions," both of which are simples for Hume, two impressions or two passions are blended to form a third, which is also a simple impression or passion. It seems plausible to think, and Hume's language in this passage certainly suggests as much, that one's ideas of two shades of (say) blue could also be blended to produce a third simple idea -- an idea of the missing shade.

While Hume's empiricism is usually identified with the Copy Principle, it is actually his use of its reverse in his account of definition that is really the most distinctive element of his empiricism.

Believing that "the chief our improvement in the moral or metaphysical sciences is the obscurity of the ideas, and ambiguity of the terms" (EHU, 61), Hume argued that conventional definitions -- defining terms in terms of other terms -- replicate philosophical confusions by substituting synonyms for the original and thus never break out of a narrow "definitional circle." Determining the cognitive content of an idea or term requires something else.

Hume supplied what was required with his account of definition, which offers a simple series of tests to determine cognitive content. First, find the idea to which a term is annexed. If none can be found, then the term has no content, however prominently it may figure in philosophy or theology. If the idea is complex, break it up into the simple ideas of which it is composed. Then trace the simple ideas back to their original impressions: "These impressions are all strong and sensible. They admit not of ambiguity. They are not only placed in a full light themselves, but may throw light on their correspondent ideas, which lie in obscurity" (EHU, 62).

If the process fails at any point, the idea in question lacks cognitive content. When carried out successfully, it yields a full account -- a "just definition" -- of the troublesome idea or term; a Humean definition gives us its exact cognitive content. So, whenever we are suspicious that a "philosophical term is employed without any meaning or idea (as is too frequent), we need but enquire, from what impression is that supposed idea derived? And if it be impossible to assign any, this will serve to confirm our suspicion. By bringing ideas into so clear a light we may reasonably hope to remove all dispute, which may arise, concerning their nature and reality" (EHU, 22).

Hume's account of definition is not only the most distinctive feature of his empiricism, it is also a brilliant strategic device. He regards it as "a new microscope or species of optics, by which, in the moral sciences, the most minute, and most simple ideas may be so enlarged as to fall readily under our apprehension, and be equally known with the grossest and most sensible ideas, that can be the object of our enquiry" (EHU, 62).

5. Association

The Copy Principle accounts for the origins of our ideas. But our ideas are also regularly connected. As Hume put the point in his "Abstract" of the Treatise, "there is a secret tie or union among particular ideas, which causes the mind to conjoin them more frequently together, and makes the one, upon its appearance, introduce the other" (T, 662).

A science of human nature should account for these connections. Otherwise, we are stuck with an eidetic atomism -- a set of discrete, independent ideas, unified only in that they are the contents of a particular mind. Eidetic atomism thus fails to explain how ideas are "bound together," and its inadequacy in this regard encourages us, as Hume thought it encouraged Locke, to postulate theoretical notions -- power and substance being the most notorious -- to account for the connections we find among our ideas. Eidetic atomism is thus a prime source of the philosophical "hypotheses" Hume aims to eliminate.

The principles required for connecting our ideas aren't theoretical and rational; they are natural operations of the mind, associations we experience in "internal sensation." Hume's introduction of these "principles of association" is the other distinctive feature of his empiricism, so distinctive that in the Abstract he advertises it as his most original contribution: "If any thing can intitle the author to so glorious a name as that of an inventor, ‘tis the use he makes of the principle of the association of ideas" (T, 661-662).

Hume locates "three principles of connexion" or association: resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect. Of the three, causation is the only principle that takes us "beyond the evidence of our memory and senses." It establishes a link or connection between past and present experiences with events that we predict or explain, so that "all reasonings concerning matter of fact seem to be founded on the relation of cause and effect." But causation and the ideas closely related to it also raise serious metaphysical problems: "there are no ideas, which occur in metaphysics, more obscure and uncertain, than those of power, force, energy or necessary connexion" (EHU, 61-62).

Hume wants to "fix, if possible, the precise meaning of these terms, and thereby remove some part of that obscurity, which is so much complained of in this species of philosophy" (EHU, 62). This project provides a crucial experiment for Hume's metaphysical microscope, one designed to prove the worth of his method, to provide a paradigm for investigating problematic philosophical and theological notions, and to supply valuable material for these inquiries.

6. Causation: The Negative Phase

Hume's strategy dictates that he first show that alternative accounts of our "causal reasonings" are inadequate. This negative project directs his metaphysical microscope toward the intellectualist view that causal connections are made on the basis of the operations of the understanding. Hume proceeds by examining all of the possible ways in which our "causal reasonings" might be based on reason.

Reasoning concerns either relations of ideas or matters of fact. Hume quickly establishes that, whatever assures us that a causal relation obtains, it is not reasoning concerning relations between ideas. Effects are distinct events from their causes: we can always conceive of one such event occurring and the other not. So causal reasoning can't be a priori reasoning.

Causes and effects are discovered, not by reason but through experience, when we find that particular objects are constantly conjoined with one another. We tend to overlook this because most ordinary causal judgments are so familiar; we've made them so many times that our judgment seems immediate. But when we consider the matter, we realize that "an (absolutely) unexperienced reasoner could be no reasoner at all" (EHU, 45n). Even in applied mathematics, where we use abstract reasoning and geometrical methods to apply principles we regard as laws to particular cases in order to derive further principles as consequences of these laws, the discovery of the original law itself was due to experience and observation, not to a priori reasoning.

Even after we have experience of causal connections, our conclusions from those experiences aren't based on any reasoning or on any other process of the understanding. They are based on our past experiences of similar cases, without which we could draw no conclusions at all.

But this leaves us without any link between the past and the future. How can we justify extending our conclusions from past observation and experience to the future? The connection between a proposition that summarizes past experience and one that predicts what will occur at some future time is surely not an intuitive connection; it needs to be established by reasoning or argument. The reasoning involved must either be demonstrative, concerning relations of ideas, or probable, concerning matters of fact and existence.

There is no room for demonstrative reasoning here. We can always conceive of a change in the course of nature. However unlikely it may seem, such a supposition is intelligible and can be distinctly conceived. It therefore implies no contradiction, so it can't be proven false by a priori demonstrative reasoning.

Probable reasoning can't establish the connection, either, since it is based on the relation of cause and effect. What we understand of that relation is based on experience and any inference from experience is based on the supposition that nature is uniform -- that the future will be like the past.

The connection could be established by adding a premise stating that nature is uniform. But how could we justify such a claim? Appeal to experience will either be circular or question-begging. For any such appeal must be founded on some version of the uniformity principle itself -- the very principle we need to justify.

This argument exhausts the ways reason might establish a connection between cause and effect, and so completes the negative phase of Hume's project. The explanatory model of human nature which makes reason prominent and dominant in thought and action is indefensible. Scepticism about it is well-founded: the model must go.

Hume insists that he offers his "sceptical doubts about the operations of the understanding," not as "discouragement, but rather an attempt something more full and satisfactory" (EHU, 26). Having cleared a space for his own account, Hume is now ready to do just that.

7. Causation: The Positive Phase

Hume's negative argument showed that our causal expectations aren't formed on the basis of reason. But we do form them, and "if the mind be not engaged by must be induced by some other principle of equal weight and authority" (EHU, 41).

This principle can't be some "intricate or profound" metaphysical argument Hume overlooked. For all of us -- ordinary people, infants, even animals -- "improve by experience," forming causal expectations and refining them in the light of experience. Hume's "sceptical solution" limits our inquiries to common life, where no sophisticated metaphysical arguments are available and none are required.

When we examine experience to see how expectations are actually produced, we discover that they arise after we have experienced "the constant conjunction of two objects;" only then do we "expect the one from the appearance of the other." But when "repetition of any particular act or operation produces a propensity to renew the same act or operation...we always say, that this propensity is the effect of Custom" (EHU, 43).

So the process that produces our causal expectations is itself causal. Custom or habit "determines the suppose the future conformable to the past." But if this background of experienced constant conjunctions was all that was involved, then our "reasonings" would be merely hypothetical. Expecting that fire will warm, however, isn't just conceiving of its warming, it is believing that it will warm.
Belief requires that there also be some fact present to the senses or memory, which gives "strength and solidity to the related idea." In these circumstances, belief is as unavoidable as is the feeling of a passion; it is "a species of natural instinct," "the necessary result of placing the mind" in this situation.

Belief is "a peculiar sentiment, or lively conception produced by habit" that results from the manner in which ideas are conceived, and "in their feeling to the mind." It is "nothing but a more vivid, lively, forcible, firm, steady conception of an object, than what the imagination alone is ever able to attain" (EHU, 49). Belief is thus "more an act of the sensitive, than of the cogitative part of our natures" (T, 183), so that "all probable reasoning is nothing but a species of sensation" (T, 103). This should not be surprising, given that belief is "so essential to the subsistence of all human creatures." "It is more conformable to the ordinary wisdom of nature to secure so necessary an act of the mind, by some instinct or mechanical tendency" than to trust it "to the fallacious deductions of our reason" (EHU, 55). Hume's "sceptical solution" thus gives a descriptive alternative, appropriately "independent of all the laboured deductions of the understanding," to philosophers' attempts to account for our causal "reasonings" by appeal to reason and argument. For the other notions in the definitional circle, "either we have no idea of force or energy, and these words are altogether insignificant, or they can mean nothing but that determination of the thought, acquir'd by habit, to pass from the cause to its usual effect" (T, 657).

8. Necessary Connection and the Definition of Cause

It remains only for Hume to "confirm and illustrate" his positive account by providing a precise definition of our idea of causation. In doing so, he accounts in his own terms for the necessary connection so many philosophers have taken to be an essential component of the idea of causation.

As we should expect from the preceding discussion, when we examine a single case of two events we regard as causally related, our impressions are only of their conjunction; the single case, taken by itself, yields no notion of their connection. When we go beyond the single case to examine the background of experienced constant conjunctions of similar pairs of events, we find little to add, for "there is nothing in a number of instances, different from every single instance, which is supposed to be exactly similar" (EHU, 75). How can the mere repetition of conjunctions produce a connection?

While there is indeed nothing added to our external senses by this exercise, something does happen: "after a repetition of similar instances, the mind is carried by habit, upon the appearance of one event, to expect its usual attendant, and to believe that it will exist." We feel this transition as an impression of reflection, or internal sensation, and it is this feeling of determination that is "the sentiment or impression from which we form the idea of power or necessary connexion. Nothing farther is in the case" (EHU, 75).

Although the impression of reflection -- the internal sensation -- is the source of our idea of the connection, that experience wouldn't have occurred if we hadn't had the requisite impressions of sensation -- the external impressions -- of the current situation, together with the background of memories of our past impressions of relevant similar instances.

All the impressions involved are relevant to a complete account of the origin of the idea, even though they seem, strictly speaking, to be "drawn from objects foreign to the cause."
Hume sums up all of the relevant impressions in not one but two definitions of cause.

The relation -- or the lack of it -- between these definitions has been a matter of considerable controversy. If we follow his account of definition, however, the first definition, which defines a cause as "an object, followed by another, and where all objects similar to the first are followed by objects similar to the second" (EHU, 76), accounts for all the external impressions involved in the case. His second definition, which defines a cause as "an object followed by another, and whose appearance always conveys the thought to that other" (EHU, 77) captures the internal sensation -- the feeling of determination -- involved. Both are definitions, by Hume's account, but the "just definition" of cause he claims to provide is expressed only by the conjunction of the two: only together do the definitions capture all the relevant impressions involved.

Hume's account of causation provides a paradigm of how philosophy, as he conceives it, should be done. He goes on to apply his method to other thorny traditional problems of philosophy and theology: liberty and necessity, miracles, design. In each case, the moral is that a priori reasoning and argument gets us nowhere: "it is only experience which teaches us the nature and bounds of cause and effect, and enables us to infer the existence of one object from that of another. Such is the foundation of moral reasoning, which forms the greater part of human knowledge, and is the source of all human action and behaviour" (EHU, 164). Since we all have limited experience, our conclusions should always be tentative, modest, reserved, cautious. This conservative, fallibilist position, which Hume calls mitigated scepticism, is the proper epistemic attitude for anyone "sensible of the strange infirmities of human understanding" (EHU, 161).

9. Moral Philosophy

The cautious attitude Hume recommends is noticeably absent in moral philosophy, where "systems and hypotheses" have also "perverted our natural understanding," the most prominent being the views of the moral rationalists -- Samuel Clarke, Locke, and William Wollaston, the theories of "the selfish schools" -- Hobbes and Mandeville -- and the pernicious theological ethics of "the schools," whose promotion of the dismal "monkish virtues" frame a catalogue of virtues diametrically opposed to Hume's. Although he offers arguments against the "systems" he opposes, Hume thinks the strongest case against them is to be made descriptively: all these theories offer accounts of human nature that experience and observation prove false.

Against the moral rationalists -- the intellectualists of moral philosophy -- who hold that moral judgments are based on reason, Hume maintains that it is difficult even to make their hypothesis intelligible (T, 455-470; EPM, Appendix I). Reason, Hume argues, judges either of matters of fact or of relations. Morality never consists in any single matter of fact that could be immediately perceived, intuited, or grasped by reason alone; morality for rationalists must therefore involve the perception of relations. But inanimate objects and animals can bear the same relations to one another that humans can, though we don't draw the same moral conclusions from determining that objects or animals are in a given relation as we do when humans are in that same relation. Distinguishing these cases requires more than reason alone can provide. Even if we could determine an appropriate subject-matter for the moral rationalist, it would still be the case that, after determining that a matter of fact or a relation obtains, the understanding has no more room to operate, so the praise or blame that follows can't be the work of reason.

Reason, Hume maintains, can at most inform us of the tendencies of actions. It can recommend means for attaining a given end, but it can't recommend ultimate ends. Reason can provide no motive to action, for reason alone is insufficient to produce moral blame or approbation. We need sentiment to give a preference to the useful tendencies of actions.

Finally, the moral rationalists' account of justice fares no better. Justice can't be determined by examining a single case, since the advantage to society of a rule of justice depends on how it works in general under the circumstances in which it is introduced.

Thus the views of the moral rationalists on the role of reason in ethics, even if they can be made coherent, are false.

Hume then turns to the claims of "the selfish schools," that morality is either altogether illusory (Mandeville) or can be reduced to considerations of self-interest (Hobbes). He argues that an accurate description of the social virtues, benevolence and justice, will show that their views are false.

There has been much discussion over the differences between Hume's presentation of these arguments in the Treatise and the second Enquiry. "Sympathy" is the key term in the Treatise, while benevolence does the work in the Enquiry. But this need not reflect any substantial shift in doctrine. If we look closely, we see that benevolence plays much the same functional role in the Enquiry that sympathy plays in the Treatise. Hume sometimes describes benevolence as a manifestation of our "natural" or "social sympathy." In both texts, Hume's central point is that we experience this "feeling for humanity" in ourselves and observe it in others, so "the selfish hypothesis" is "contrary both to common feeling and to our most unprejudiced notions" (EPM, 298).

Borrowing from Butler and Hutcheson, Hume argues that, however prominent considerations of self-interest may be, we do find cases where, when self-interest is not at stake, we respond with benevolence, not indifference. We approve of benevolence in others, even when their benevolence is not, and never will be, directed toward us. We even observe benevolence in animals. Haggling over how much benevolence is found in human nature is pointless; that there is any benevolence at all refutes the selfish hypothesis.

Against Hobbes, Hume argues that our benevolent sentiments can't be reduced to self-interest. It is true that, when we desire the happiness of others, and try to make them happy, we may enjoy doing so. But benevolence is necessary for our self-enjoyment, and although we may act from the combined motives of benevolence and enjoyment, our benevolent sentiments aren't identical with our self-enjoyment.

We approve of benevolence in large part because it is useful. Benevolent acts tend to promote social welfare, and those who are benevolent are motivated to cultivate the other social virtue, justice. But while benevolence is an original principle in human nature, justice is not. Our need for rules of justice isn't universal; it arises only under conditions of relative scarcity, where property must be regulated to preserve order in society.

The need for rules of justice is also a function of a society's size. In very small societies, where the members are more of an extended family, there may be no need for rules of justice, because there is no need for regulating property -- no need, indeed, for our notion of property at all. Only when society becomes extensive enough that it is impossible for everyone in it to be part of one's "narrow circle" does the need for rules of justice arise.

The rules of justice in a given society are "the product of artifice and contrivance." They are constructed by the society to solve the problem of how to regulate property; other rules might do just as well. The real need is for some set of "general inflexible rules...adopted as best to serve public utility" (EPM, 305).

Hobbesians try to reduce justice to self-interest, because everyone recognizes that it is in their interest that there be rules regulating property. But even here, the benefits for each individual result from the whole scheme or system being in place, not from the fact that each just act benefits each individual directly. As with benevolence, Hume argues that we approve of the system itself even where our self-interest isn't at stake. We can see this not only from cases in our own society, but also when we consider societies distant in space and time.

Hume's social virtues are related. Sentiments of benevolence draw us to society, allow us to perceive its advantages, provide a source of approval for just acts, and motivate us to do just acts ourselves. We approve of both virtues because we recognize their role in promoting the happiness and prosperity of society. Their functional roles are, nonetheless, distinct. Hume compares the benefits of benevolence to "a wall, built by many hands, which still rises by every stone that is heaped upon it, and receives increase proportional to the diligence and care of each workman," while the happiness justice produces is like the results of building "a vault, where each individual stone would, of itself, fall to the ground" (EPM, 305).

"Daily observation" confirms that we recognize and approve of the utility of acts of benevolence and justice. While much of the agreeableness of the utility we find in these acts may be due to the fact that they promote our self-interest, it is also true that, in approving of useful acts, we don't restrict ourselves to those that serve our particular interests. Similarly, our private interests often differ from the public interest, but, despite our sentiments in favor of our self-interest, we often also retain our sentiment in favor of the public interest. Where these interests concur, we observe a sensible increase of the sentiment, so it must be the case that the interests of society are not entirely indifferent to us.

With that final nail in Hobbes' coffin, Hume turns to develop his account of the sources of morality. Though we often approve or disapprove of the actions of those remote from us in space and time, it is nonetheless true that, in considering the acts of (say) an Athenian statesman, the good he produced "affects us with a less lively sympathy," even though we judge their "merit to be equally great" as the similar acts of our contemporaries. In such cases our judgment "corrects the inequalities of our internal emotions and perceptions; in like manner, as it preserves us from error, in the several variations of images, presented to our external senses" (EPM, 227). Adjustment and correction is necessary in both cases if we are to think and talk consistently and coherently.

"The intercourse of sentiments" that conversation produces is the vehicle for these adjustments, for it takes us out of our own peculiar positions. We begin to employ general language which, since it is formed for general use, "must be moulded on some general views ... ." In so doing, we take up a "general" or "common point of view," detached from our self-interested perspectives, to form "some general unalterable standard, by which we may approve or disapprove of characters and manners." We begin to "speak another language" -- the language of morals, which "implies some sentiment common to all mankind, which recommends the same object to general approbation, and makes every man, or most men, agree in the same opinion or decision concerning it. It also implies some sentiment, so universal and comprehensive as to extend to all mankind, and render the actions and conduct, even of the persons the most remote, an object of applause or censure, according as they agree or disagree with that rule of right which is established. These two requisite circumstances belong alone to the sentiment of humanity here insisted on" (EPM, 272). It is the extended or extensive sentiment of humanity -- benevolence or sympathy -- that for Hume is ultimately "the foundation of morals."

But even if the social virtues move us from a perspective of self-interest to one more universal and extensive, it might appear that the individual virtues do not. But since these virtues also receive our approbation because of their usefulness, and since "these advantages are enjoyed by the person possessed of the character, it can never be self-love which renders the prospect of them agreeable to us, the spectators, and prompts our esteem and approbation" (EPM, 234).

Just as we make judgments about others, we are aware, from infancy, that others make judgments about us. We desire their approval and modify our behavior in response to their judgments. This love of fame gives rise to the habit of reflectively evaluating our own actions and character traits. We first see ourselves as others see us, but eventually we develop our own standards of evaluation, keeping "alive all the sentiments of right and wrong," which "begats, in noble natures, a certain reverence" for ourselves as well as others, "which is the surest guardian of every virtue" (EPM, 276). The general character of moral language, produced and promoted by our social sympathies, permits us to judge ourselves and others from the general point of view, the proper perspective of morality. For Hume, that is "...the most perfect morality with which we are acquainted" (EPM, 276).

Hume summarizes his account in this definition of virtue, or Personal Merit: "every quality of the mind, which is useful or agreeable to the person himself or to others, communicates a pleasure to the spectator, engages his esteem, and is admitted under the honourable denomination of virtue or merit" (EPM, 277). That is, as observers -- of ourselves as well as others -- to the extent that we regard certain acts as manifestations of certain character traits, we consider the usual tendencies of acts done from those traits, and find them useful or agreeable, to the agent or to others, and approve or disapprove of them accordingly. A striking feature of this definition is its precise parallel to the two definitions of cause that Hume gave as the conclusion of his central argument in the first Enquiry. Both definitions pick out features of events, and both record a spectator's reaction or response to those events.

10. Politics, Criticism, History, and Religion

Hume's "Advertisement" for the first two books of the Treatise promised subsequent works on morals, politics and criticism, but his Political Discourses, "Of Tragedy," and "Of the Standard of Taste" are our only hints as to what he might have said about those topics.

Hume's political essays range widely, covering not only the constitutional issues one might expect, but also venturing into what we now call economics, dealing with issues of commerce, luxury, and their implications for society. His treatments of these scattered topics exhibit a unity of purpose and method that makes the essays much more than the sum of their parts, and links them, not only with his more narrowly philosophical concerns, but also with his earlier moral and literary essays.

Adopting a causal, descriptive approach to the problems he discusses, Hume stresses that current events and concerns are best understood by tracing them historically to their origins. This approach contrasts sharply with contemporary discussions, which treated these events as the products of chance, or -- worse -- of providence. Hume substitutes a concern for the "moral causes" -- the human choices and actions -- of the events, conditions, or institutions he considers. This thoroughly secular approach is accentuated by his willingness to point out the bad effects of superstition and enthusiasm on society, government, and political and social life.

"Of the Standard of Taste" is a rich contribution to the then-emerging discipline of what we now call aesthetics. This complex essay contains a lucid statement of Hume's views on what constitutes "just criticism," but it is not just about criticism, as some readers are beginning to realize. Though Hume's account of aesthetic judgment precisely parallels his account of causal and moral judgment, the essay also contains a discussion of how a naturalistic theory might deal with questions of normativity, and so is important, not just as a significant contribution to Hume's overall view, but also for its immediate relevance for problems in contemporary empirical naturalism.

Hume's History of England, published in six volumes over as many years in the 1750s, recalls his characterization, in the first Enquiry, of history as "so many collections of experiments." Hume not surprisingly rejects the theoretical commitments of both Tory and Whig accounts of British history, and offers what he believes is an impartial account that looks at political institutions as historical developments responsive to Britons' experience of changing conditions, evaluating political decisions in the contexts in which they were made, instead of second-guessing them in the light of subsequent developments.

The Natural History of Religion is also a history in a sense, though it has been described as "philosophical" or "conjectural" history. It is an account of the origins and development of religious beliefs, with the thinly-disguised agenda of making clear not only the nonrational origins of religion, but also of exposing and describing the pathology of its current forms. Religion began in the postulation, by primitive peoples, of "invisible intelligences" to account for frightening, uncontrollable natural phenomena, such as disease and earthquakes. In its original forms, it was polytheistic, which Hume regards as relatively harmless because of its tolerance of diversity. But polytheism eventually gives way to monotheism, when the followers of one deity hold sway over the others. Monotheism is dogmatic and intolerant; worse, it gives rise to theological systems which spread absurdity and intolerance, but which use reason to corrupt philosophical thought. But since religion is not universal in the way that our nonrational beliefs in causation or physical objects are, perhaps it can eventually be dislodged from human thinking altogether.

Hume's Natural History cemented his reputation as a religious sceptic and an atheist, even before its publication. Prompted by his own prudence, as well as the pleas of his friends, he resisted publishing the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, which he had worked on since the early 1750s, though he continued revising the manuscript until his death. An expansion and dramatic revision of the argument previewed in Section XI of the first Enquiry, the Dialogues are so riddled with irony that controversy still rages as to what character, if any, speaks for Hume. But his devastating critique of the argument from design leaves no doubt that -- scholarly details about its enigmatic final section aside -- the conclusions philosophers and theologians have drawn from that argument go far beyond any evidence the argument itself provides.

A fitting conclusion to a philosophical life, the posthumously published Dialogues would alone insure the philosophical and literary immortality of their author. In this magnificent work, Hume demonstrates his mastery of the dialogue form, while producing the preeminent work in the philosophy of religion.


Hume's Works

The abbreviations and texts cited above are as follows:
[T] A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed. revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. [Page references above are to this edition.]
A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000
[EHU] Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. [Page references above are to this edition.]
An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999
[EPM] Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. [Page references above are to this edition.]
Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998
[HL] The Letters of David Hume, edited by J.Y.T. Greig, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1932. [This edition also contains Hume's autobiographical essay, "My Own Life" (HL, I:1-7).]
Other works by Hume and editions of Hume's writings are: In addition to the letters found in [HL], Hume's correspondence may be found in: Finally, the closest thing at present to a complete edition remains that of Green and Grose:

Bibliographical Studies

A useful bibliography of work on Hume is:

Works on Hume

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Berkeley, George | Hobbes, Thomas | Locke, John | miracles

Copyright © 2001
William Edward Morris
Illinois Weslayan University

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy