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Giles of Rome

Giles of Rome (who died in 1316 as archbishop of Bourges) was one of the most productive and influential thinkers active at the end of the 13th century, who played a major role also in the political events of his time. Giles of Rome was an extremely prolific author and left a very large corpus of writings, encompassing commentaries on Aristotle, theological treatises, questions, and sermons. In recent years, a research group led by Francesco Del Punta (Scuola Normale Superiore, Pisa, Italy) has been devoting a lot of energy to the project of publishing his Opera Omnia and deepening our knowledge of his thought. Although this group has produced extremely significant results, an assessment of Giles' whole work is still in progress. For this reason, the present entry only aims at providing insight into an ongoing process of research and will focus on recent studies on Giles.

1. Life

Born in Rome most probably in the fifth decade of the thirteenth century, Giles was the first outstanding theologian of the relatively recently founded Order of the Augustinian Hermits. Nothing more is known about his origins: the statement that he belonged to the famous Roman family of the Colonna seems to go back to Jordan of Saxony's Liber Vitasfratrum (second half of the 14th century), but is completely missing from contemporary, 13th-century sources. From Giles' will we know that he was sent to Paris to study in the convent of his Order. At the beginning he must have followed the courses either of a secular master or of a theologian belonging to a different Order, as the Augustinian friars did not have a regent master at the time. Probably he was a pupil of Aquinas' in the years 1269-1272. He commented on the Sentences at the beginning of the 1270's. In following years he probably wrote also a large number of his commentaries on Aristotle.

The year 1277 marked a turning-point in his career: Giles was involved in the condemnation of the heterodox Aristotelianism issued by the Parisian bishop Etienne Tempier, although the process against him must be distinguished from the famous decree of the 7 of March 1277, as Robert Wielockx has shown. After 1277 Giles must have abandoned Paris, but his presence is attested in Italy not earlier than 1281. Before leaving Paris he completed his De regimine principum, which is dedicated to the young Philip, the future Philip the Fair.

Between 1281 and 1284 Giles played an important role in the government of his Order, taking part in various chapters held in Italy. At the provincial chapter of Tuscania (nowadays in Lazio, Italy) in 1285 he acted as vicar of the prior general of his Order, Clement of Osimo.

In 1285, Giles'doctrine was examined again; after recanting only a part of what had been previously condemned in 1277, he was allowed to teach again; by 1287 he is referred to as a master of theology. This success enhanced Giles of Rome's authority even more in his Order, whose general chapter of Florence decreed that Giles' works (even future ones) should be considered as the official doctrine of the Order, to be defended by all Augustinian bachelors and masters. In 1292, at the General Chapter of Rome he was elected prior general of his Order.

Benedict Caetani's election to the papal see marked a further radical change in his career, as Boniface VIII appointed him archbishop of Bourges in 1295. As a matter of fact, Giles was very often absent from his see, spending extended periods of time at the papal curia. In his De renuntiatione, he defended the legitimacy of Celestine's abdication, and, consequently, of Boniface’ s election. When the contrast between Boniface VIII and Philip IV reached its most critical point, he continued to side staunchly with the pope. An important sermon defending the papal position has been recently discovered by Concetta Luna, and Giles' De ecclesiastica potestate undoubtedly ranks among the sources of Unam Sanctam.

Giles' prestige decreased after Boniface’ death, and even more with the rise of Clement V to the papal throne. Before being elected pope, Betrand de Got, as archbishop of Bourdeaux, had had serious conflicts with Giles. This unfavorable change, however, did not prevent Giles from playing a significant role in the debates of his time. Around 1305-6 he took part in a commission which examined and condemned the eucharistic doctrine of John of Paris, a former adversary of Giles' during the conflict between Philip the Fair and Boniface. In the discussions concerning the Templars which eventually led to the violent suppression of the Order, Giles sided with Philip the Fair, attacking the Templars and devoting a whole tract, Contra exemptos, to the thesis that their exemption from episcopal jurisdiction was the cause of their abuses. During the Council of Vienne Giles was asked to draw a list of errors extracted from the works of Peter John Olivi: three of them were officially condemned by the Council. On December 22, 1316 he died at the papal Curia at Avignon (For further details see Del Punta-Donati-Luna 1993).

2. Logic and Rhetoric

After René Antoine Gauthier identified in the master Guillaume Arnauld the real author of the Lectura supra logicam veterem attributed to Giles of Rome (Tabarroni 1988), interest in logical works focused mainly on his Commentary on the Sophistici Elenchi. In his treatment of the fallacia figurae dictionis Giles proves to be a brilliant and original representative of “modistic logic”, who bases his solutions mainly on the semantics of intentiones (Tabarroni 1991). Alessandro Conti (1992) investigated Giles' Commentary on Posterior Analytics as an example of his theory of truth, which brings to completion Aquinas' shift from Augustine's influence to the Aristotelian approach . Giles of Rome also authored the most important Commentary on the Rhetoric of the Latin medieval tradition, which earned him the honorific title of expositor of this book and influenced all later medieval commentaries. Costantino Marmo studied Giles' approach to the different translations to which he had access and showed how he developed Aquinas' theory of passions in commenting on the relevant portions of Aristotle's text (Marmo 1991), trying to solve some problems left open by Aquinas. It has been suggested that Giles considers rhetoric to be a sort of “logic” of ethics and politics: this brilliant interpretation still awaits, however, full development and articulation (Staico 1992). Janet Coleman (2000) also maintains that Aristotle's rhetorical method determines the substance of Giles' De regimine principum.

3. Metaphysics

Traditionally, Giles was described as a “faithful” disciple of Aquinas'. As a matter of fact, his “philosophical project” tends to discuss critically Aquinas' position in order to improve the solutions he offered, without, however, trying to discard them radically. This holds true, e. g., for one of the most famous topics of his discussion with Henry of Ghent, the distinction between “essence” and “existence”. In this case, Giles radicalizes Aquinas' doctrine of the real distinction, asserting that existence must be conceived as a “res addita” to essence. Although the final result of his theory was considered closer to Avicenna's solution than to that of Aquinas, Giles nevertheless develops it starting from Aquinas' own position (Wippel 1981). The connection of this issue with the discussion with Henry of Ghent about the concept of “creation” was deeply investigated by Giorgio Pini (1992), who could show how Giles, while defending Aquinas and thereby the possibility of using some Aristotelian principles in an orthodox account of creation, goes beyond the positions of the Dominican master, e. g. asserting the identity of “esse” and “creatio”.

As to the debate about the unicity of substantial form, Giles' position evolves during time. If we leave aside the Errores philosophorum, since the authenticity of this work has been contested with serious arguments (Bruni 1935, Koch 1944, Donati 1990b, Luna 1990), we can notice that Giles changes his position from the Contra gradus et pluralitatem formarum (between the end of 1277 and the beginning of 1278), where he denies plurality of forms for every compound, to later works, where he takes a more cautious stance in particular concerning man. The principle of individuation is identified, as in Aquinas, with “materia signata quantitate”, that is, matter designated by its dimensions. According to Giles, who criticizes Richard of Mediavilla on this point, matter is pure potentiality and therefore cannot be distinguished into different kinds. For this reason, he cannot accept Aquinas' doctrine that the incorruptibility of celestial bodies derives from the peculiar nature of their matter (Donati 1986). In Giles' opinion celestial bodies are not incorruptible because their matter is different from the matter of sublunar bodies, but rather because their quantitas materiae cannot change its determinate dimensions. This is but one application of Giles' famous doctrine of “indeterminate dimensions”. Modifying Averroes' doctrine in this respect, Giles argues that a portion of matter, in order to be able to receive a form, needs to possess already a sort of quantity. Such quantity, however, should not be identified with the determinate dimensions a body possesses, but is rather a quantitas which remains the same during processes such as rarefaction and condensation. Giles' notion of quantitas materiae , which is not only generically extension or three-dimensionality, but seems to represent an unchangeable given “amount” of matter pertaining to a body, has been considered comparable, some difficulties notwithstanding, to the modern notion of mass (Donati 1988).

After the condemnation of 1277, a significant change can be noticed in Giles' position also in his solution of the problem of the eternity of the world. At the beginning of his career he admitted the theoretical possibility of the eternity of the world, although rejecting Aristotle's arguments proving the actual eternity of the world. Later he shifted to a more “ Augustinian” stance, rejecting the hypothesis of a creation “ab aeterno” and admitting that it is possible to prove the temporality of creation, although he finds that no conclusive argument has been advanced so far. Giles was much more steadfast in his opposition to another major tenet of “Averroistic” doctrine, that is the unicity of the possible intellect. He maintained that the possibility of actual knowledge on the part of the individual depends necessarily on the fact that each body is informed by its own intellective soul, which is its form. For the same reasons Giles also rejected the unicity of the agent intellect, a doctrine he attributed to Avicenna (Del Punta-Donati-Luna 1993).

4. Natural Philosophy

Recent studies concerning Giles' natural philosophy focused mainly on his treatment of some pivotal concepts of Aristotle's Physics. Cecilia Trifogli opened new perspectives in this field, devoting her attention to the notions of place and motion (especially in the void, see Trifogli 1992), underlining that “Giles’ emphasis on the role of place in the description of motion seems to lead to a quantitative and relational notion of place. Giles, however, does not completely substitute the Aristotelian notion of place for that of place as distance. Place as distance is only one of the two notions of place which appear in his commentary. The other, which is related to material place, assumes an intrinsic connection between place and the located body that cannot be founded on distance alone” (Trifogli 1990a, 350). Trifogli also investigated Giles' notions of time and infinity, emphasizing that his whole approach to natural philosophy is distinguished by a tendency towards a metaphysical interpretation of Aristotelian concepts, as opposed to a physical and quantitative one (Trifogli 1990b, 1991). For example, Giles conceives of time not as a quantity pertaining to every kind of motion, but rather as a mode in which motion exists. His concept of time rests in fact essentially on a broad notion of succession, which allows him on one hand to retain the unity of the concept of time, but, on the other hand, to acknowledge the existence of different temporal forms (Trifogli 1990b). This attitude emerges also from the analysis of Giles' controversy on angelic time with Henry of Ghent (Porro 1988, Porro 1991, but see also Faes de Mottoni 1983). Both authors thought that the time in which angels exist, unlike sublunar time, is a discrete succession of instants. Giles and Henry disagreed, however, on the relationship existing between angelic and sublunar time. In particular, Henry rejected Giles' thesis that more instants of angelic time can correspond to one and the same instant of sublunar time. This difference of opinion rested in part on diverging concepts of angelic motion, which can be istantaneous according to Henry, but not according to Giles.

5. Between Philosophy and Medicine

Between 1285 and 1290, Giles took a stance in the much debated question of the respective roles of male and female parents in conception. The Galenist view, going back to Hippocrates, was that both male and female contributed sperm, so that the offspring could have characteristics from both parents. On the contrary, Aristotle had held that only the male alone contributed sperm containing an active and formal principle to conception, while the female provided only the matter of the fetus. Giles was well acquainted with these different positions and with the efforts to reconcile the diverging approaches of medici and philosophi, which could be traced back to Avicenna. Leaning on Averroes' Colliget, however, Giles rejected any attempt to attribute a formal role to the female sperm, even if it is conceived as subordinate to the male one. On the contrary he maintained that it can contribute only in a passive way to conception, while what was called “female sperm”, i.e., the vaginal secretion, has a subservient, helpful but by no means necessary function. It helps the male sperm to inseminate female matter, but does not add anything essential to the new being. In this way, Giles intended to stress the superiority of the philosophical, theoretical approach to such problems with respect to the traditions of medical learning, even when they seemed to be supported by empirical evidence (Hewson 1975; Martorelli Vico 1988). Empirical evidence such as the resemblance of the offspring to the mother was e.g., explained away as an example of stronger resistance of female matter to the action of form (Martorelli Vico 2002). After conception the human embryo begins a development which goes through different stages. Comparing these stages to the embryos of various animals Giles, like Thomas Aquinas, supported an interpretation of the fetal development which would be exploited many centuries later by the so-called “recapitulation theory” (Hewson 1975, 99). Giles maintained, however, that “the organic fetal body is not to be called a pig, a bear, or a monkey, but something immediately disposed to becoming man” (Hewson 1975, 100). This position apparently implies that human life does not fully begin at the moment of conception. Although such a thesis can be brought to bear on the moral judgment concerning abortion, Giles does not seem interested in tackling from this point of view an issue which would become central for what nowadays is called bioethics.

6. Ethics and Political Theory

In the debate on the respective roles of intellect and will in the determination of human action Giles is known to have taken and intermediate position, a sort of compromise between the theory of Henry of Ghent and that of Geoffrey of Fontaines. Giles maintains, in fact, that will is a passive potency and can not “move” itself, but always needs an object, a “bonum apprehensum”. This starting point however, does not rule out its freedom, because will, once “moved” by its object, can determine itself and other potencies with regard to action. This view of Giles' is consistent with his interpretation of the relationship existing between knowledge and will in the sinner. Committing a sin implies an ignorance of the real good, but this ignorance is not the primary cause of the wrong behavior, because it is an effect of the will, which, affected by malicia, corrupts the judgment of the reason (Macken 1977).

Giles of Rome exerted considerable influence also in other fields of ethics, such as the theory of virtues. The most developed expression of his position is not to be found in a Commentary on Aristotle, but rather in his De regimine principum, the most successful “mirror of princes” of medieval political thought, which is still conserved in more than 300 manuscripts in its original Latin version, to which many translations in European vernaculars must be added. Written most probably between 1277 and 1280 the De regimine is acknowledged to be one of the most successful attempts at mediating Aristotle's practical philosophy, and in particular his “ethical and political language” to the Latin West. Giles was the first to structure a mirror of princes in three books along the lines of a scheme -- ethica-oeconomica-politica -- which played an important role in the reception of Aristotle's moral and political philosophy in the Middle Ages (Lambertini 1988). The author takes great care to give the impression that he is mainly relying on Aristotle's text, providing numerous quotations from the Nichomachean Ethics, from the Politics and from the Rethoric. Scholars should not overlook, however, that his reception of Aristotle is not as direct as it can seem and that Giles is deeply influenced by a tradition in the interpretation of Aristotle's practical philosophy. In this tradition Aquinas plays a very important role for Giles, so that, while Aristotle is the authority who is quoted on almost every occasion, it is the unnamed Aquinas who, with his Sententia libri Politicorum, De regno, Summa Theologiae, exerts a really decisive influence on De regimine. While discussing particular topics, Giles skillfully adapts Aristotle to his own purposes. This emerges with clarity in the first book, devoted to ethics, where Giles' classification of virtues is heavily dependent on the Summa Theologiae and, therefore, on Aquinas' reinterpretation of the Aristotelian heritage. For example, Giles here defines prudentia as a virtus media, sharing the nature of moral as well as of intellectual ones, a doctrine which can by no means be traced back to the Stagirite (Lambertini 1991, 1992, 1995, 2000).

The most famous example of this selective attitude towards Aristotle's works, however, belongs rather to the field of political theory. In the third book of De regimine Giles wants to prove that Monarchy is the absolutely best form of government. The first arguments he puts forward in favor of monarchy are not taken from Aristotle's Politics, but from Aquinas' De regno. Then some arguments against monarchy which could be read in the Politics are presented as objections that Aristotle puts forth for subsequent refutation. At the end, Giles states squarely that Aristotle supports monarchy as the absolutely best form of monarchy and corroborates his assertion with an argument, which, in the Politics, actually goes in the opposite direction (Lambertini 1990). One could provide several other examples to show that the De regimine succeeded in presenting itself as a simplified exposition and explanation of Aristotle's thought in practical philosophy, but at the same time transmitted to Giles' readers a strongly biased interpretation of the Stagirite. The fact that the De regimine was often used as a tool to have easier access to Aristotle's political theory deeply influenced, therefore, the way the Latin West read and understood Aristotle's Politics in the Late Middle Ages. Recent codicological studies on the diffusion of De regimine’ manuscripts do in fact show that many possessors of the manuscripts most probably used them for study (See Opera Omnia I.1/11, Catalogo dei manoscritti, De regimine; Briggs 1999).

While in the De regimine Giles carefully avoids any reference to the thorny problem of the relationship between secular and ecclesiastical power, his later writings which are relevant for political theory deal first and foremost with ecclesiological problems. This holds true for his treatise De renuntiatione papae (1297-1298) where Giles defends the lawfulness of Celestine's abdication against the arguments put forward by the Colonna cardinals in their first appeal against Boniface VIII. From the point of view of the history of political thought it is relevant that Giles argues that papal power, although of divine origin, is conferred on a particular individual by a human act, namely, by the election of the cardinals. Here Giles is countering the Colonna arguments that papal dignity cannot cease to reside in a pope until he dies, because the pontificate depends on God's will, and stresses the fact that divine intention in this case becomes effective through the mediation of human agents, that is, through the consent of the electors and of the elected. A jurisdiction which is given by the consent of men, however, can also be removed by their consent through a reverse procedure. This does not amount to saying that the pope can be deposed (except in case of heresy), because, according to Giles, the pope is above the law and has no earthly authority above him. He can however, depose himself, that is, abdicate. Just as for his election the consent of his electors and of the elected was necessary, so also for the removal of the pope from office his consent is decisive (Eastman 1989, 1990, 1992). In this way Giles could dismiss arguments against the validity of Celestine's abdication without admitting the possibility that the pope can be deposed, e. g., by the Council, as Boniface's adversaries maintained.

Much better known than De renuntiatione is Giles' De ecclesiastica potestate, a treatise also composed in defense of Boniface VIII. Most probably in 1302, Giles systematically expounded in this work the views on the relationship between regnum and sacerdotium he had already put forward in a recently re-discovered sermon held at the papal curia (Luna 1992). The main tenet of his fully fledged argumentation is that the pope, supreme authority of the Church but also of the whole of mankind, is the only legitimate origin of every power on earth, be it exercised -- as jurisdiction -- on persons, or -- as property -- on things. In his plenitude of power, the pope possesses an absolute supremacy both in the ecclesiastical and in the temporal sphere, and delegates the exercise of the temporal “sword” to lay sovereigns only in order to fulfill most properly his higher religious duties. Any authority that does not recognize its dependence on the papal power is but usurpation. In Giles' view, there is no space even for a partially autonomous temporal order. Coherently, Giles maintains that no property rights are valid if they are not legitimated by papal authority. Interestingly enough, such a claim is also supported by his account of the origin of property, according to which property is not a natural institution, but only the consequence of human agreements, which lack any legitimacy unless they are recognized by the supreme religious power (Miethke 2000).


Primary Sources

The most complete list of Giles' works can be found in Del Punta--Donati--Luna 1993 together with the most reliable attempt at dating them (see also Donati 1990b as far as commentaries on Aristotle are concerned). The same article by Del Punta, Donati and Luna also contains the best available bibliography, which can be complemented with Lezcano 1995, 32-50.It is impossible to reproduce all that information in the present entry. Standard older editions were reprinted in Frankfurt 1967-1970. Among the texts edited in our century I would mention the following:

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Henry of Ghent

Copyright © 2004
Roberto Lambertini

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