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Supplement to Nineteenth Century Geometry
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A Modern Formulation of Riemann's Theory

The multidimensional continua that Riemann was concerned with are essentially instances of what is now known as a real n-dimensional smooth manifold. For brevity, call them ‘n-manifolds’. (For example, a sphere, a Möbius strip and the surface of a Henry Moore sculpture may be regarded as 2-manifolds; the spacetimes models of current cosmology are 4-manifolds.) Conditions (a) -- (c) provide a full characterization of n-manifolds.
(a) An n-manifold M is a set of points that can be pieced together from partially overlapping patches, such that every point of M lies in at least one patch.

(b) M is endowed with a neighborhood structure (a topology) such that, if U is a patch of M, there is a continuous one-one mapping f of U onto some region of Rn, with continuous inverse f-1. (Rn denotes here the collection of all real number n-tuples, with the standard topology generated by the open balls.) f is a coordinate system or chart of M; the k-th number in the n-tuple assigned by a chart f to a point P in f's patch is called the k-th coordinate of P by f; the k-th coordinate function of chart f is the real-valued function that assigns to each point of the patch its k-th coordinate by f.

(c) There is a collection A of charts of M, which contains at least one chart defined on each patch of M and is such that, if g and h belong to A, the composite mappings h g-1 and g h-1 --- known as coordinate transformations --- are differentiable to every order wherever they are well defined. (Denote the real number n-tuple <a1, ... , an> by a. The mapping h g-1 is well defined at a if a is the valued assigned by g to some point P of M to which h also assigns a value. Suppose that the latter value h(P) = <b1, ... ,bn> = b; then, b = h g-1(a). Since h g-1 maps a region of Rn into Rn, it makes sense to say that h g-1 is differentiable.) Such a collection A is called an atlas.[*]

It is the pair <M, A> that, strictly speaking, is an n-manifold, in the sense defined above. If <M1,A1> and <M2,A2> are an n-manifold and an m-manifold, respectively, it makes good sense to say that a mapping f of M1 into M2 is differentiable at a point P of M1 if, for a chart h defined at P and a chart g defined at f(P), the composite mapping g  f  h-1 is differentiable at h(P). (Condition (c) implies that the fulfillment of this requirement does not depend on the choice of h and g.) f is differentiable if it is differentiable at every point of M1.

Let <M,A> be an n-manifold. To each point P of M one associates a vector space, which is known as the tangent space at P and is denoted by TPM. The idea is based on the intuitive notion of a plane tangent to a surface at a given point. It can be constructed as follows. Let be a one-one differentiable mapping of a real open interval I into M. We can think of the successive values of as forming the path of a point that moves through M during a time interval represented by I. We call a curve in M (parametrized by u  I). Put (t0) = P for a fixed number t0 in I. Consider the collection F(P) of all differentiable real-valued functions defined on some neighborhood of P. With the ordinary operations of function addition and multiplication by a constant, F(P) has the structure of a vector space. Each function f in F(P) varies smoothly with u, along the path of , in some neighborhood of P. Its rate of variation at P = (t0) is properly expressed by the derivative d(f)/du at u = t0. As f ranges over F(P), the value of d(f)/du at u = t0 is apt to vary in R. So we have here a mapping of F(P) into R, which we denote by (u). It is in fact a linear function and therefore a vector in the dual space F*(P) of real-valued linear functions on F(P). Call it the tangent to at P. The tangents at P to all the curves whose paths go through P span an n-dimensional subspace of F*(P). This subspace is, by definition, the tangent space TPM. The tangent spaces at all points of an n-manifold M can be bundled together in a natural way into a 2n-manifold TM. The projection mapping of TM onto M assigns to each tangent vector v in TPM the point (v) at which v is tangent to M. The structure <TM,M,> is the tangent bundle over M. A vector field on M is a section of TM, i.e., a differentiable mapping f of M into TM such that f sends each point P of M to itself; such a mapping obviously assigns to P a vector in TPM.

Any vector space V is automatically associated with other vector spaces, such as the dual space V* of linear functions on V, and the diverse spaces of multilinear functions on V, on V*, and on any possible combination of V and V*. This holds, of course, for each tangent space of an n-manifold M. The dual of TPM is known as the cotangent space at P. There is a natural way of bundling together the cotangent spaces of M into a 2n-manifold, the cotangent bundle. Generally speaking, all the vector spaces of a definite type associated with the tangent and cotangent spaces of M can be naturally bundled together into a k-manifolds (for suitable integers k, depending on the nature of the bundled items). A section of any of these bundles is a tensor field on M (of rank r, if the bundled objects are r-linear functions).

A Riemannian metric g on the n-manifold <M,A> is a tensor field of rank 2 on M. Thus, g assigns to each P in M a bilinear function gP on TPM. For any P in M and any vectors v, w, in TPM, gP must meet these requirements:

(i) gP(v,w) = gP(w,v)       (symmetry)

(ii) gP(v,w) = 0 for all vectors w in TPM if and only if v is the 0-vector       (non-degeneracy)

(iii) gP(v,v) > 0 unless v is the 0-vector       (positive definiteness).

It is worth noting that the so-called Lorentzian metrics defined by relativity theory on its spacetime models meet requirements (i) and (ii), but not (iii), and are therefore usually said to be semi-Riemannian.

The length (v) of a vector v in TPM is defined by |(v)|2 = gP(v,v). Let be a curve in M. Let (u) be the tangent to at the point (u). The length of 's path from (a) to (b) is measured by the integral

Thus, in Riemannian geometry, the length of the tangent vector (u) bears witness to the advance of curve g as it passes through the point (u). The definition of the length of a curve leads at once to the notion of a geodesic (or straightest) curve, which is characterized by the fact that its length is extremal; in other words, a geodesic is either the greatest or the shortest among all the curves that trace out neighboring paths between the same two points.

In his study of curved surfaces, Gauss introduced a real-valued function, the Gaussian curvature, which measures a surface's local deviation from flatness in terms of the surface's intrinsic geometry. Riemann extended this concept of curvature to Riemannian n-manifolds. He observed that each geodesic through a point in such a manifold is fully determined by its tangent vector at that point. Consider a point P in a Riemannian n-manifold <M,A,g> and two linearly independent vectors v and w in TPM. The geodesics determined by all linear combinations of v and w form a 2-manifold about P, with a definite Gaussian curvature KP(v,w) at P. The real number KP(v,w) measures the curvature of M at P in the ‘surface direction’ (Riemann 1854, p. 145) fixed by v and w. Riemann (1861) thought up a global mapping, depending on the metric g, that yields the said values KP(v,w) on appropriate arguments P, v and w. Nowadays this object is conceived as a tensor field of rank 4, which assigns to each point P in a Riemannian n-manifold <M,A,g> a 4-linear function on the tangent space TPM. It is therefore known as the Riemann tensor. Given the above definition of KP(v,w) it is clear that, if n = 2, the Riemann tensor reduces to the Gaussian curvature function.

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Copyright © 2003
Roberto Torretti

Supplement to Nineteenth Century Geometry
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy