This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Nineteenth Century Geometry
Citation Information


* The informal characterization of n-manifolds in the supplement is not altogether accurate and may cover some far-fetched monsters that we do not wish to cover with this concept. For readers who have a smattering of topology the following characterization is preferable.

(a) Let M be a set of points. Pick a collection of partially overlapping subsets of M, or patches, such that every point of M lies in at least one patch.

(b) If U is a patch of M, there is a one-one mapping f of U onto an open space of Rn, whose inverse we denote by f-1. (Rn denotes here the collection of all real number n-tuples, with the standard topology generated by the open balls.) f is a coordinate system or chart of M; the k-th number in the n-tuple assigned by a chart f to a point P in f's domain is called the k-th coordinate of P by f; the k-th coordinate function of chart f is the real-valued function that assigns to each point of the patch its k-th coordinate by f.

(c) There is a collection A of charts of M which contains at least one chart defined on each patch of M and is such that, if g and h belong to A, the composite mappings h  g-1 and g  h-1 --- known as coordinate transformations --- are differentiable to every order wherever they are well defined. (Denote the real number n-tuple (a1, ... , an) by a. h  g-1 is well defined at a if a is the valued assigned by g to some point P of M to which h also assigns a value. Suppose that the latter value h(P) = (b1,...., bn) = b; then, b = h  g-1(a). Since h  g-1 maps a region of Rn into Rn, it makes sense to say that h  g-1 is differentiable.) Such a collection A is called an atlas for M.

(d) A given atlas A for M can be extended in one and only one way to a maximal atlas Amax as follows: add to A every one-one mapping g of a subset of M onto an open set of Rn which, combined with any chart h of A, satisfies the condition of differentiability stated under (c).

(e) M is given the weakest Hausdorff topology that makes every chart g in Amax into a homeomorphism. (A topological space is said to be Hausdorff if any two points in it have open neighborhoods that do not overlap.)

The pair (M,A) is an n-manifold.

Copyright © 2003
Roberto Torretti

Notes to Nineteenth Century Geometry
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy