This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. 
version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of PhilosophyA  B  C  D  E  F  G  H  I  J  K  L  M  N  O  P  Q  R  S  T  U  V  W  X  Y  Z

last substantive content change

1. To draw a straight line from any point to any point.But the fifth one sounds more like a statement of fact. Euclid's text can be rendered in English as follows: “If a straight line [c] falling on two straight lines [a and b] make the interior angles on the same side less than two right angles, the two straight lines [a and b], if produced indefinitely, meet on that side on which are the angles less than the two right angles” (terms in brackets added for clarity). This sounds farfetched. Still, it can be readily paraphrased as a recipe for constructing triangles, (See Figure 1.) Every triangle is formed by three coplanar straight lines that meet, by pairs, at three points. Given three straight lines a, b and c, such that c meets a at P and b at Q, then eight angles are formed by these lines at P and Q; two of the angles at P lie on the same side of a as b and two of the angles at Q lie on the same side of b as a; these four angles are called interior angles; two of these  one at P and one at Q  lie on one side of c, and the other two lie on the other. Euclid bids his readers to grant that P and Q will meet on that side of c on which the interior angles add up to less than two right angles. If this request is granted, lines a, b and c will form a triangle with its third vertex R on the said side of c, unless each of the two pairs of interior angles we have distinguished adds up to exactly two right angles. This request is known as “Euclid's Postulate”. If the request is rejectedsay, because we believe that the world is finite and there is no room in it to accomodate vertex C if the interior angles in question add up to very little less than two right anglesthen much of Euclid's system of geometry will not go through.
...
3. To draw a circle with any center and any radius.
Figure 1In the darker ages that followed, Euclid's sense of mathematical freedom was lost and philosophers and mathematicians expected geometry to rest on selfevident grounds. Now, if a is perpendicular and b is almost perpendicular to PQ, a and b approach each other very slowly on one side of PQ and it is not selfevident that they must eventually meet somewhere on that side. After all, the hyperbole indefinitely approaches its asymptotes and yet, demonstrably, never meets them. Through the centuries, several authors demandedand attempteda proof of Euclid's Postulate. John Wallis (b. 1616, d. 1703) derived it from the assumption that there are polygons of different sizes that have the same shape. But then this assumption needs proof in turn. Girolamo Saccheri (b. 1667, d. 1733) tried reductio. He inferred a long series of propositions from the negation of Euclid's Postulate, until he reached one which he pronounced "repugnant to the nature of the straight line". But Saccheri's understanding of this "nature" was nourished by Euclidean geometry and his conclusion begged the question.
In the 1820's, Nikolai I. Lobachevsky (b. 1793, d. 1856) and Janos Bolyai (b. 1802, d. 1860) independently tackled this question in a radically new way. Lobachevsky built on the negation of Euclid's Postulate an alternative system of geometry, which he dubbed “imaginary” and tried inconclusively to verify by astronomical observation and measurements. Bolyai excised the postulate from Euclid's system; what remains is the "absolute geometry", which can be further specified by adding to it either Euclid's Postulate or its negation. From the 1790's Carl Friedrich Gauss (b. 1777, d. 1855) had been working on the subject in the same direction, but he refrained from publishing for fear of scandal. Since Lobachevsky was the first to publish, the system of geometry based on the said "absolute geometry" plus the negation of Euclid's Postulate is properly called Lobachevskian geometry.
The construction introduced above to explain Euclid's Postulate can also be used for elucidating its negation. Draw the straight line a through point P at right angles with the segment PQ. If Euclid's Postulate is denied, there are countless straight lines through Q, coplanar with a, that make acute angles with PQ but never meet a. Consider the set of real numbers which are the magnitudes of these acute angles. Let the greatest lower bound of this set be µ. Evidently, µ > 0. There are exactly two straight lines through Q, coplanar with a, that make an angle of size µ with PQ. (See Figure 2.) Call them b_{1} and b_{2}. Neither b_{1} nor b_{2} meets a, but a meets every line through Q that is coplanar with a and makes with PQ an angle less than µ. Gauss, Lobachevsky and Bolyaiunbeknownst to each othercoincided in calling b_{1} and b_{2} the parallels to a through Q. µ is called the angle of parallellism for segment PQ. Its size depends on the length of PQ, and decreases as the latter increases.
Figure 2Suppose that the angle of parallellism for PQ is one half a right angle. In this case, b_{1} and b_{2} make a right angle at Q and we thus have two mutually perpendicular straight lines on the same plane as a, which fail to meet a.
Lobachevsky's geometry abounds in surprising theorems (many of which had already been found by Saccheri). Here are a few: The three interior angles of a triangle add up to less than two right angles. The difference or "defect" is proportional to the triangle's area. Hence, in Lobachevskian geometry, similar triangles are congruent. Moreover, if a triangle is divided into smaller triangles, the defect of the whole equals the sum of the defects of the parts. Since the defect cannot be greater than two right angles, the area of triangles has a finite maximum. If a quadrilateral, by construction, has three right angles, the fourth angle is necessarily acute. Thus, in Lobachevskian geometry there are no rectangles.
There is a simple formal correspondence between the equations of Lobachevskian trigonometry and those of standard spherical trigonometry. Based on it, Lobachevsky argued that any contradiction arising in his geometry would inevitably be matched by a contradiction in Euclidean geometry. This appears to be the earliest example of a purported proof of relative consistency, by which a theory is shown to be consistent unless another one  whose consistency is taken for granted  turns out to be inconsistent.
Lobachevskian geometry received little attention before the late 1860's. When philosophers finally took notice of it, their opinions were divided. Some regarded it as a formal exercise in logical deduction, with no physical or philosophical significance, which employed ordinary wordssuch as ‘straight’ and ‘plane’with a covertly changed meaning. Others welcomed it as sufficient proof that, contrary to the influential thesis of Kant, Euclidean geometry does not convey any prerequisites of human experience and that the geometrical structure of physical space is open to experimental inquiry. Still others agreed that NonEuclidean geometries were legitimate alternatives, but pointed out that the design and interpretation of physical experiments generally presupposes a definite geometry and that this role has been preempted by Euclid's system.
No matter what philosophers might say, for mathematicians Lobachevskian geometry would probably have been no more than an odd curiosity, if a niche had not been found for it within both projective and differential geometry, the two main currents of nineteenthcentury geometrical research (§§ 2 and 5).
Projective properties are those preserved by projections. Take, for example, two planes and H and a point P outside them. Let be any figure on . Draw straight lines from P through each point of . The figure formed by the points where these lines meet H is the projection of on H from P. Generally this figure will differ from in size and shape. But the projection of any number of straight lines on meeting each other at certain points generally consists of an equal number of straight lines on H meeting respectively at the projection of those points. What happens, however, if the straight line joining P with a some point Q of never meets H, because PQ happens to lie on a plane parallel to H? (See Figure 3.)
Figure 3To obviate such irksome exceptions, projective geometry added to each straight line in space an ideal point, shared by every line parallel to it. Continuity requires then that all ideal points lie on a single ideal plane, which meets each family of parallel planes along a different ideal line. Fundamentalists may shudder at this seemingly wanton multiplication of entities. However, it had been practised in arithmetic for centuries, as the initial stock of natural numbers 1, 2, 3, ... , was supplemented with zero, the negative integers, the nonintegral rationals, the irrationals, and the socalled imaginary numbers.
The points of a straight line stand in mutual relations of neighborhood and order. To see how the ideal point fits into these relations let H rotate continually about the straight line m where it intersects . (See Figure 4.) When H is parallel to PQsay, at time tthe projection of Q on H from P is the ideal point of the straight line through P and Q. Right before t the said projection is an ordinary point of H, very far from m. Right after t the projection is again an ordinary point of H, very far from m, but at the opposite end of the plane. Studying the continuous displacement of the projection during a short time interval surrounding t, one concludes that if A and B are any two points of H that stand, respectively, on either side of m, the ideal point of the straight line through A and B must be placed between A and B. Thus, in projective geometry, the points of a straight line are ordered cyclically, i.e., like the points of a circle. As a result of this, the neighborhood relations among points in projective space and on projective planes differ drastically from those familiar from standard geometry, and are highly counterintuitive. It is fair to say that projective geometry signified a much deeper and farreaching revolution in human thought than did the mere denial of Euclid's Postulate.
Figure 4In the new setting, the projective properties of figures can be defined unexceptionably. A oneone mapping ƒ of projective space onto itself is a collineation if it sends any three collinear points A, B, and C, to three points (A), (B), and (C), which are collinear too. Projective properties (and relations) are those which are preserved by collineations. Here are a few examples of projective properties. Of three or more points: to lie on the same straight line; to lie on the same plane. Of three or more straight lines: to meet at the same point; to lie on the same plane. Of three or more planes: to intersect along the same straight line; to share the same point. Of curves: to be a conic. Of surfaces: to be a quadric.
Given a manifold and a group of transformations of the manifold, to study the manifold configurations with respect to those features which are not altered by the transformations of the group. (Klein 1893, p. 67)In nineteenthcentury mathematics, ‘manifold’ often designated what we now call a set, but Klein apparently had something more specific in mind:
If n variables x_{1}, ... , x_{n} are given, the ... value systems we obtain if we let the variables x independently take the real values from  to + constitute what we shall call ... a manifold of n dimensions. Each particular value system (x_{1}, ... ,x_{n}) is called an element of the manifold. (Klein 1873, p. 116)If S is a manifold in either sense, by a transformation of S we mean a oneone mapping of S onto itself. It is clear that
(i) If T_{1} and T_{2} are transformations of S, the composite mapping T_{2} T_{1}, which consists of T_{1} followed by T_{2}, is also a transformation of S;By virtue of conditions (i)(iv), the transformations of S form a group G_{S} in the precise sense that this term has in algebra. G_{S} includes subgroups, i.e., subsets which contain I and satisfy conditions (i) and (iv). If H is a subgroup of G_{S} and is a feature of S, or of its elements or parts, which is not affected by the transformations of , we say that is Hinvariant. The only G_{S}invariant is the cardinality of S (i.e., the number of elements in the manifold). On the other hand, the group {I}, consisting of the identity alone, trivially preserves every conceivable feature. Between these two extremes there can be many different subgroups with all sorts of interesting invariants, depending on the respective group structure. If S is not an arbitrary (structureless) set, but a numerical manifold as described by Klein, it inherits structure from the real number field, which contributes to characterize the different subgroups of G_{S} and their invariants. Thus, the group of continuous transformations preserves the topological properties (neighborhood relations), and the group of linear transformations preserves the projective properties.(ii) the composition of transformations is associative, so that, if T_{1}, T_{2} and T_{3} are transformations of S, (T_{3} T_{2}) T_{1} = T_{3} (T_{2} T_{1});
(iii) the identity mapping I that sends each point of S to itself is a transformation of S such that, for any transformation T, T I = I T = T;
(iv) for every transformation T there is a transformation T^{1}, the inverse of T, such that T^{1} T = I (T^{1} sends each point of S back to where it was brought from by T).
Can metric properties be fixed in this way? Traditionally one defines the distance between two points (x_{1}, ... ,x_{n}) and (y_{1}, ... ,y_{n}) of a numerical manifold as the positive square root of (x_{1}  y_{1})^{2} + ... + (x_{n}  y_{n})^{2}. The group of isometries consists of the transformations that preserve this function. However, this is no more than a convention, adopted to ensure that the geometry is Euclidean. Using projective geometry, Klein thought of something better. No realvalued function of point pairs, defined on all projective space, can be an invariant of the projective group, but there is a function of collinear point quadruples, called the crossratio, which is such an invariant. Drawing on work by Arthur Cayley (b. 1821, d. 1895), Klein (1871, 1873) employed the crossratio for defining projectively invariant distance functions on specific regions of projective space. Surprisingly, two of the three distance functions defined by Klein agree respectively, on their respective regions, with the distance functions of Euclid and Lobachevsky, while the third one determines another variety of nonEuclidean geometry which Klein dubbed ‘elliptic’. (In elliptic geometry every straight line meets every other, and the three internal angles of a triangle always add up to more than two right angles. Klein's names for the geometries of Euclid and Lobachevsky were ‘parabolic’ and ‘hyperbolic’, respectively.)
This is how Klein's approach works for Lobachevskian geometry on the plane. Let be a real conica conic comprising only real pointson the projective plane. Let G_{} be the set of all collineations that map onto itself. G_{} is a subgroup of the projective group. Consider now the crossratio of point quadruples <P_{1},P_{2},P_{3},P_{4}> such that P_{3} and P_{4} belong to , while P_{1} and P_{2} range over the interior Int() of . (P Int() if and only if P is a real point and no real tangent to passes through P.) P_{3} and P_{4} are the points where the straight line through P_{1} and P_{2} meets , so the said crossratio may be regarded as a function of the point pair <P_{1},P_{2}>, say, f_{}(P_{1},P_{2}). The function f_{} is clearly G_{}invariant. Put d_{}(P_{1},P_{2}) = c log f_{}(P_{1},P_{2}), where c is an arbitrary realvalued constant, different from 0, and log x denotes the principal value of the natural logarithm of x. Klein was able to show that d_{} behaves precisely like a Lobachevskian distance function on Int(). In other words, every theorem of Lobachevskian geometry holds for suitable figures formed from points of Int(), if the distance between any two of these points is given by the function d_{}. Consider, for instance, four points P_{1},P_{2},P_{3}, and P_{4} in Int(), such that d_{}(P_{1},P_{2}) = d_{}(P_{2},P_{3}) = d_{}(P_{3},P_{4}) = d_{}(P_{4},P_{1}). They are the vertices of a Lobachevskian equilateral quadrilateral Q, which can have at most three right angles, in which case the fourth interior angle of Q must be acute. (Where ‘right angle’ means, as usual, an angle equal to its adjacent angle, and two angles in Int() are said to be equal if one is the image of the other by a transformation of group G_{}).
If stands for a different sort of conic, not an ordinary real one, the function d_{} obtained by the above procedure behaves on suitably defined regions of the projective plane like a Euclidian distance function or like the distance function of elliptic geometry (this depends on the nature of the conic ). Thus, depending on whether belongs to one or the other of three kinds of conic, the group of collineations that map onto itself is structurally identical with one of the three groups of Lobachevskian, Euclidean, or elliptic isometries. Similar results hold for the threedimensional case, with a quadric surface.
Klein's result led Bertrand Russell (b. 1873, d. 1970) to assert, in his neoKantian book on the foundations of geometry (1897), that the general "form of externality" is disclosed to us a priori in projective geometry, but its metric structurewhich can only be Lobachevskian, Euclidean or ellipticmust be determined a posteriori by experiment. Henri Poincaré (b. 1854, d. 1912) took a more radical stance: If geometry is nothing but the study of a group,
one may say that the truth of the geometry of Euclid is not incompatible with the truth of the geometry of Lobachevsky, for the existence of a group is not incompatible with that of another group. (Poincaré 1887, p. 290)The application to physics is immediate: "Among all possible groups we have chosen one in particular, in order to refer to it all physical phenomena, just as we choose three coordinate axes in order to refer to them a geometrical figure" (ibid., p. 291). The choice of this particular group is motivated by its mathematical simplicity, but also by the fact that "there exist in nature some remarkable bodies which are called solids, and experience tells us that the different possible movements of these bodies are related to one another much in the same way as the different operations of the chosen group" (ibid.).
Klein's grouptheoretical view of geometry enjoyed much favor among mathematicians and philosophers. It achieved a major success when Minkowski (1909) showed that the gist of Einstein's special theory of relativity was the (spacetime) geometry of the Lorentz group. But Klein's Erlangen program failed to cover the differential geometry of Riemann (§5), which Einstein (1915, 1916) placed at the core of his general theory of relativity.
Pasch viewed geometry as a natural science, whose successful utilization by other sciences and in practical life rests "exclusively on the fact that geometrical concepts originally agreed exactly with empirical objects" (Pasch 1882, p. iii). Geometry distinguishes itself from other natural sciences because it obtains only very few concepts and laws directly from experience, and aims at obtaining from them the laws of more complex phenomena by purely deductive means. The empirical foundation of geometry was encapsulated by Pasch in a core of basic concepts and basic statements or axioms. The basic concepts refer to the shape and size of bodies and their positions relative to one another. They are not defined, for no definition could replace the "exhibition of appropriate natural objects," which is the only road to understanding such simple, irreducible notions (ibid., p. 16). All other geometric concepts must be ultimately defined in terms of the basic ones. The basic concepts are connected to one another by the axioms, which "state what has been observed in certain very simple diagrams" (p. 43). All other geometric statements must be proved from the axioms by the strictest deductive methods. Everything that is needed to prove them must be recorded, without exception, in the axioms. These must therefore embody the whole empirical material elaborated by geometry, so that "after they are established it is no longer necessary to resort to sense perceptions" (p. 17). "Every conclusion which occurs in a proof must find its confirmation in the diagram, but it is not justified by the diagram, but by a definite earlier statement (or definition)" (p. 43). Pasch understood clearly the implications of his method. He writes (p. 98):
If geometry is to be truly deductive, the process of inference must be independent in all its parts from the meaning of the geometric concepts, just as it must be independent from the diagrams. All that need be considered are the relations between the geometric concepts, recorded in the statements and definitions. In the course of deduction it is both permitted and useful to bear in mind the meaning of the geometric concepts that occur in it, but it is not at all necessary. Indeed, when it actually beomes necessary, this shows that there is a gap in the proof, andif the gap cannot be eliminated by modifying the argumentthat the premises are too weak to support it.Pasch's Lectures on Modern Geometry dealt with projective geometry. The first axiomatization of Euclidean geometry that was up to Pasch's standardsFoundations of Geometry by David Hilbert (b. 1862, d. 1943)appeared in 1899 and exercised enormous influence on twentieth century mathematics and philosophy. Hilbert invites the reader to consider three arbitrary collections of objects, which he calls ‘points’, ‘straight lines’ and ‘planes’, and five undefined relations between (i) a point and a straight line, (ii) a straight line and a plane, (iii) three points, (iv) two pairs of points (‘segments’) and (v) two equivalence classes of point triples (‘angles’). The conditions prescribed in Hilbert's 20 axiomsincluding the Axiom of Completeness added in the second editionare sufficient to characterize the said objects and relations up to isomorphism. Isomorphismi.e., structural equivalencecan hold, however, between different, intuitively disparate, systems of objects. Hilbert availed himself of this feature of axiomatic theories for studying the independence of some axioms from the rest. To prove it he proposed actual instances (models) of the structure determined by all axioms but one, plus the negation of the omitted one. Frege complained that the geometric axioms retained in these exercises could be applied to Hilbert's farfetched models only by tampering with the natural meaning of words (cf. Alice's conversation with Humpty Dumpty). Hilbert replied on 29 December 1899:
Every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary mutual relations, and the basic elements can be conceived in any way you wish. If I take for my points any system of things, for example, the system love, law, chimneysweep, ... and I just assume all my axioms as relations between these things, my theoremsfor example, the theorem of Pythagorasalso hold of these things. ... This feature of theories can never be a shortcoming and is in any case inevitable.All this follows, of course, from the very nature of axiomatics, as explained in the passage quoted from Pasch. Indeed, such truthpreserving semantic permutations were no news in geometry after Gergonne (17711859) drew attention in 1825 to the following principle of duality: Any true statement of projective plane geometry gives rise to another, equally true, dual statement obtained by substituting ‘point’ for ‘line’, ‘collinear’ for ‘concurrent’, ‘meet’ for ‘join’, and vice versa, wherever these words occur in the former. (In projective space geometry, duality holds for points and planes.) The same result is secured, of course, by exchanging not the words, but their meanings.
Riemann extends to n dimensions the methods employed by Gauss (1828) in his study of the intrinsic geometry of curved surfaces embedded in Euclidean space (called "intrinsic" because it describes the metric properties that the surfaces display by themselves, independently of the way they lie in space). Looking back at Gauss's work one gets a better intuitive feel for Riemann's concepts (see Torretti 1978, pp. 6882). However, for the sake of conciseness and perspicuity, it is advisable to look forward and to avail oneself of certain concepts introduced by later mathematicians as they tried to make sense of Riemann's proposal. Consider the following modern formulation of Riemann's theory, in this Supplement.
In his study of curved surfaces, Gauss introduced a realvalued function, the Gaussian curvature, which measures a surface's local deviation from flatness in terms of the surface's intrinsic geometry. Riemann extended this concept of curvature to Riemannian nmanifolds. By using his extended concept of curvature, he was able to characterize with great elegance the metric manifolds in which all figures can freely move around without changing their size and shape. They are the Riemannian manifolds of constant curvature. This idea can be nicely combined with Klein's classification of metric geometries. Regarded as Riemannian 3manifolds, Euclidean space has constant zero curvature, Lobachevskian space has constant negative curvature, and elliptic space has constant positive curvature. Pursuant to the Erlangen Program, each of these geometries of constant curvature is characterized by its own group of isometries. But Klein's conception is too narrow to embrace all Riemannian geometries, which include spaces of variable curvature. Indeed, in the general case, the group of isometries of a Riemannian nmanifold is the trivial group consisting of the identity alone, whose structure conveys no information at all about the respective geometry.
Roberto Torretti cordua@vtr.net 
A  B  C  D  E  F  G  H  I  J  K  L  M  N  O  P  Q  R  S  T  U  V  W  X  Y  Z