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‘Evolution’ in contemporary discussions denotes the theory of the change of organic species over time. Prior to the second half of the nineteenth century, the term was used primarily, if not exclusively, in an embryological sense, to designate the development of the individual embryo. Since the writings of Herbert Spencer, and particularly since the publication of Darwin's Origin of Species in 1859, the term has been used to designate historical alterations of species. This meaning of the term also covers two primary forms of species evolution: (a) progressive linear historical changes of species from simple to complex forms, such as can be found in Jean-Baptiste Lamarck's theory of evolution (1809); (b) branching transformation from common ancestors as formulated by Darwin in 1859. Since Darwin's work, evolution has been typically linked with the theory of natural selection as the primary explanation of the causes by which such species change has occurred over historical time. This coupling of evolution and natural selection theory, and the claimed competence of natural selection theory to explain both micro and macro evolution has, however, formed one of the most commonly debated issues in the history of evolutionary biology since Darwin. Since this article will survey the broad history of these theories, the term ‘transformism’ will generally be used to designate the theory of species change prior to the shift in meaning of the term ‘evolution’ that occurs in the 1860s.

While Darwin's theory of evolution is also the subject of the entry on Darwinism, the present entry will develop the topic through a combined historical and conceptual analysis under the following headings:

1. Transformism Before Darwin

The emergence of scientific transformism in the nineteenth century, associated traditionally with the names of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck (1744–1829), Charles Darwin (1812–1882), and to a lesser degree, Alfred Russel Wallace (1823–1913), was the product of a complex historical development of theories about the nature of organic life, the classification of forms, the relation of time to the world order, and the relation of the natural world to theories of origin. These inquiries were initiated by a series of natural philosophers in the middle of the seventeenth century. As a scientific research program, investigations of the transformation of species can be traced in an institutional setting to the speculations and researches of Enlightenment naturalists nearly a century before the publication of Darwin's Origin in 1859, particularly those associated with the King's garden and natural history collection in Paris. The important role played by institutional structures along with the development of theoretical reflections allowed issues to be given a precise focus of research they otherwise would not have possessed. This explains, at least in part, why evolutionary biology emerged in the nineteenth century rather than in direct response to the transformations in natural philosophy of the seventeenth.

In many respects, the general idea of species transformism is an old concept. The reflections of Empedocles (ca. 495–35 B.C.E.) and the views of the Greek Atomists among the Presocratic nature philosophers formed a historical resource for later speculations. These pre-Socratic speculations combined naturalistic myths of origins with the workings of chance-like processes that supplied a naturalistic account of existing forms of life.

However, these accounts were also opposed on several levels by the subsequent mainstream Greek philosophical tradition. The writings of Plato (427–327 B.C.E.) included his long creation myth, Timaeus, the one Platonic dialogue available continuously in the Latin Western tradition. This presented a locus classicus for the notion of an externally-imposed origin of living beings through the action of a Craftsman (demiurgos) who created the cosmos and all living beings in accord with eternal archetypes or forms, realizing through this both aesthetic and rational ends. Plato's account initiated the long tradition of reflection that later interacted with the Jewish, Christian, and later Islamic Biblical concepts of creation. These formed the foundation for the conclusion that organic beings were the product of external creative design. One common meaning of “teleology” as encountered in discussions of evolution since Darwin—that of externally imposed design by an intelligent agency (demiurge, nature, God)—dates from Plato's account.

In Aristotle's (384—322 B.C.E.) seminal biological writings, the external teleology of a designer-creator was replaced by an internal telelogical purposiveness associated with the immanent action of an internal cause—in living beings the soul (psuche)— which functioned as the formal, final and efficient cause of life (De Anima 2:IV. 415b 10–30). Aristotle also denied the concept of an historical origin of the world, affirming instead the eternity of the world order. The metaphysical requirement that the soul-as-form (eidos) be permanent and enduring through the process of the generation of “like by like” also excluded the possibility that natural species could change over time in their essential properties, even though local adaptation in “accidental” properties was fully possible. Since individual beings were dynamic composites of a material substrate and an immaterial and eternal form (eidos), the accidental differentiation of the form in individuals did not affect the metaphysical endurance of the species. In living beings, the soul-as-form is serially passed on through time in the act of generation to create an eternal continuity of the form. This supplied a metaphysical foundation for the notion of species permanence without reliance on an external creative agency (De Anima II: 415b 1–10). Challenges have, however, been raised to the claim that Aristotle was a strong “essentialist” in his biology (Lennox 1987).

One interpretive issue in the exegesis of Aristotle's conception of species concerns the degree to which he was committed to asserting more than the eternity of the three main “genera” —plants, animals and humans—rather than each individual kind (De generatione animalium II. 731b 32–732a5). As Aristotle's views were developed in the West following the textual recoveries of the late Middle Ages, however, it was assumed that Aristotle's commitment was to an essential fixity of each definable form. Furthermore, to reconcile Aristotle with the theological doctrine of creation, this required denial of the eternity of species. As we shall explore below, however, the species concept itself was only “hardened” in the early modern period with the rise of the mechanical philosophy and preformationist embryology.

1.1 Early Modern Foundations

The immediate “pre-history” of evolutionary theory can be conveniently dated from the first efforts of natural philosophers of the seventeenth century to develop a naturalistic history of the earth (Bowler 2003, chp. 2; Oldroyd 1996; Greene 1959). Although the recovery in the fifteenth century of Titus Lucretius's (89–55 B.C.E.) Epicurean poem, De rerum natura, introduced ancient atomist reflections on origins into early modern discussion, the systematic reflections on relevant issues date specifically from the synthesis of natural philosophy and metaphysics put forth by René Descartes in his Principia philosophiae (1st ed. 1644). This developed and summarized issues developed in fuller detail in the Le Monde (The World, or Treatise on Light) published posthumously in 1664, with an improved edition appearing in 1677.

It is significant for the subsequent history of this question that these Cartesian speculations were introduced in the form of a counter-factual hypothesis that explicitly sought to avoid conflict with accepted religious doctrines of origin (Descartes 1647, 1983, 181). In this hypothetical account Descartes derived the earth from a cooled star “formerly…like the Sun” (ibid.). By its gradual solidification in a great celestial vortex, the Earth took form. Subsequent drying and cracking formed the ocean basins, the continents and the mountain ranges.

An outstanding issue in Descartes' account was his failure to incorporate the origins of living beings into this naturalistic story of creation by natural laws. Although manuscripts display the degree to which Descartes attempted on several occasions to work out some linkage between his general natural philosophy and the embryological formation of living beings, the published Principles, as well as the posthumously published Treatise on Man (1662, 1664) and the The World, Descartes repeatedly skipped over the issue of a naturalistic account of both the individual embryo and the species, and dealt with the issues of the living state by positing a hypothetical statue-machine created directly by divine action, and possessed immediately of all functions and structures (Descartes 1647, 1983, 275–76, 1664, 1972, 1–5).

These Cartesian speculations conveyed to Descartes' successors at least two issues. First, by presenting this historical account as a counterfactual hypothesis, a means of understanding the history of nature that was adapted to the limitations of the human mind, rather than as a literally true account, Descartes provided the option of a purely fictionalist reading of historical science that persisted into the nineteenth century. Second, the integration of living beings into the new natural philosophy of mechanistic naturalism was left unresolved. If anything, it accentuated the problem of providing a naturalistic explanation of the origins of organic life.

At least two traditions can be traced out in the wake of Descartes's reflections. Beginning with the De solido intra solidum naturaliter contento dissertationis prodromus of 1669 by the Danish Cartesian Nicholas Steno (1638–86), efforts commenced to draw the origins of living beings into the Cartesian cosmology, in this case primarily by granting that fossils were the remains of once existing organisms on an earth that had formed historically. There was, however, no effort made to account for the origins of these beings on Cartesian principles.

A second interpretation created a series of reflections that came to be known generically as “theories of the earth” in subsequent literature. This tradition commenced with the Telluris theoria sacra, published in 1681 (English edition 1684–90) by the English clergyman, Thomas Burnet (1635–1715). Burnet sought to reconcile a Cartesian-derived historical account of the origins of the Earth with the creation account of the Mosaic tradition. In Burnet's account, the Earth began from an original chaos fashioned by divine action into the existing Earth through a series of changes that involved the gradual separation of the continents, the reversal of the poles, and the Mosaic flood. To explain the origin of living beings, Burnet relied on a theory of spontaneous generation that relied upon the “spontaneous fruitfulness of the ground” in the primeval Edenic world, rather than on the direct creation of forms (Burnet 1691, 1965, 141). By connecting this account to the Biblical story of Genesis I, Burnet broke with Cartesian counterfactualism, offering the first time a fully realist interpretation of a Cartesian-style developmental history of nature that also included the origins of living forms.

The issues involved in the subsequent “theory of the earth” tradition, as they were amplified by such natural philosophers as John Ray (1627–1705), John Woodward (1665–1728), and William Whiston (1667–1752) (Greene 1959), failed to achieve a consensus position on the question of the origins of organisms. This issue was also complicated by the intimate connection drawn between the origin of forms in time with the theories of the embryological origin of individual organisms through normal generation. Both involved a notion of the alteration of form over time. For a long tradition these issues were intimately associated in a particular way. In the traditions deriving from Aristotle's natural philosophy, sexual generation and the subsequent embryological development of the individual from primordial matter took place under the action of the soul (psuche) that was typically derived from the male parent. This theory also formed the explanation of how the species achieved eternity in time (De Anima II: 415b 1–10). With the introduction of the theory of divine creation in Jewish, Christian and Islamic thought, a distinction had to be made between the first origin of species in historical time, and the normal generation of the individual. The origin of species was attributed to divine action, but not necessarily that of the individual organism. This separation of issues was strong in theological accounts accepting aspects of Aristotelianism (Thomas Aquinas), but was less clear in traditions indebted to Augustinian theology. Of considerable importance in the seventeenth century discussions was Augustine's theory of the original creation of the seeds (rationes seminales) of each species at an original moment in time that simply unfolded or developed later in historical time (Augustine 1982, chp. 23, 175–76; Roger 1997a, 264–66). In other words, Augustine provided arguments for claiming that both the species and the individual were products of direct divine creation.

In its seventeenth-century context, the issue of origins was also tied closely with the debates over the possibility of spontaneous generation of forms (Roger 1997a, chp. 2). Burnet, for example, seemed to imply that species could simply originate from unformed matter in the earth. The experimental refutations of current theories of spontaneous generation by such life scientists as Francesco Redi (1626–1667), weakened, but did not destroy the belief in spontaneous generation. Evidence for spontaneous generation could always be explained through Augustine's theory of the pre-existent rationes seminales.

Mechanistic accounts that attempted to explain either species or individual origins through an appeal to matter and natural laws, however, ran into severe conceptual and empirical difficulties. The empirical researches of William Harvey (1578–1657), published in his Observations on the Generation of Animals in 1651, claimed to refute on empirical grounds the theory of the male and female semen utilized in all early mechanistic theories offered by such individuals as Nathaniel Highmore (1613–85) (Gasking 1968). The ridicule that greeted Descartes' own posthumously-published account in 1677 of the formation of the fetus by mechanical action on a male and female semen suggested that his comprehensive mechanical philosophy could not deal with this question. “Mechanistic” epigenesis, as these theories might be termed, were rejected wholesale in the seventeenth century. As we shall see below, however, such theories were to be revived in a modified form in the middle of the eighteenth century in a form that was closely tied to the origins of species transformism.

As a consequence of the failure of “mechanistic” epigenesis, post-Cartesian mechanists, particularly on the Continent, who were concerned to bring organisms within the purview of the mechanical philosophy, opted instead for some version of a preformation theory of origins, or more accurately, a “pre-existence” theory of generation. First set forth by Jan Swammerdam (1637–80) in the late 1660s, and then given an influential philosophical statement by Nicholas Malebranche (1638–1715) in his Récherche de la vérité of 1674, some form of pre-existence theory became paradigmatic in the Kuhnian sense in the life sciences of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, particularly among those embracing the “mechanical” philosophy in some form. These pre-existence theories all denied the origins of forms in historical time. Questions of organic origin were removed to divine action at the first creation of the world (Roger 1997a, chp. 6).

At least three variants of the theory of preexistence can be distinguished. Two of these, assuming the pre-existence of forms in miniature, either encased in the ovaries of the female (Ovism), the original version, or after the discovery of spermatozoa in 1677, in the testes of the male (Vermism), generally became the main versions one finds expressed in the official medical and professional gynecological literature of the 1670–1740 period. A third alternative, having few followers in the seventeenth and early eighteenth century, but one that became particularly popular by the 1770s, was the theory of pre-formed “germs,” given its first clear statement by Claude Perrault (1608–80). This theory, closely resembling in some respects St. Augustine's theory of creation by means of rationes seminales mentioned above, held that the first primordia of organisms were formed at the original creation as seeds dispersed in the soil, from which they were taken in with food. Under the proper conditions and within the correct organisms, these “germs” became implanted in the ovaries from which they then developed in response to fertilization. In all three accounts, the act of fertilization provided the occasion, and not the cause, of the development of organisms in time (ibid.).

Some form of the preexistence theory was embraced in almost all mechanistic theories of life that emerged from the seventeenth century, and it is also to be found among many authors accepting the Newtonian revisions of the mechanical philosophy. This theory was seen to solve many problems. First, it explained the intimate interrelation of structure and function that seemed to require the existence of parts of the organism in an integrated system. The heart could not beat without ennervation, and the nerves could not exist without the heart. Consequently the entire organism must pre-exist, so the argument went. The existence of such integrated systems seemed difficult to explain by the sequential development of parts, as implied in Aristotelian and other “epigenetic” theories of development.

Second, this account was congenial to theological developments in the seventeenth century, particularly on the Continent, manifest by the growth of Calvinism and Jansenism, both of which drew upon certain readings of Augustine that emphasized God's omnipotence and the passivity of nature (Roger 1997a, chp. 6). Third, the pre-existence theory, at least in the versions that embraced the “germ” theory, allowed for the appearance of life in time, as seemed to be suggested by the existence of fossil forms, while at the same time it did not imply any change of species or development of one species from another. Finally, some kind of preformation of the embryo could be reconciled with the best microscopic observations of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, as these were reported by such renown experts on this instrument as Anton van Leeuwenhoek (1632–1723), Jan Swammerdam (1637–80 ), Marcello Malpighi (1628–94), and Henry Baker (1690–1774). The theory of the preformed germs could be used could also be appealed to as an explanation of the persistent empirical evidence for the spontaneous generation of at least some groups of organisms.

A direct consequence of this theory of embryological origin bears on the question of species transformism. Pre-existence theory effectively removed the organism from the effects of local circumstance and environmental conditions and placed the origin of species, as well as that of the individual, at a moment in the original creation. A quote from a contemporary source makes this point very explicit:

And indeed all the Laws of Motion which are as yet discovered, can give but a very lame account of the forming of a Plant or Animal. We see how wretchedly Des Cartes came off when he began to apply them to this subject; they are form'd by Laws yet unknown to Mankind, and it seems most probable that the Stamina of all the Plants and Animals that have ever been, or ever shall be in the World, have been formed ab Origine Mundi [from the foundation of the world] by the Almighty Creator within the first of each respective kind. (Garden 1691, 476–77)

The immediate consequence of this theory was a new rigidity given to the concept of species that it had not possessed in the Aristotelian tradition, for example. Pre-existence theory reinforced a sharp distinction between “essential” and “accidental” properties to a degree not implied by the prior tradition. This theory even made it difficult to explain obvious empirical phenomena, such as monstrosity, the regeneration of lost parts, the resemblances of offspring to both parents, evidence for geographical variation, racial differences, or even the existence of hybrid forms such as the mule. It seemed necessary to attribute these anomalies to divine action at an original creation. These difficulties in the theory resulted in a variety of criticisms that were eventually to lead to the downfall of preexistence theory in its original form, although the theory was to have a long subsequent history through a modification of the “germ” theory (Roger 1997a, chp. 7; Roe, 1981;Gasking 1967).

The dominance of some form of preexistence theory of generation between roughly 1670 and the 1740s provides some explanation for the lack of efforts among natural philosophers to develop transformist theories of species origins in the same period. Although there were exceptions to this claim—the Epicurean cosmology developed by Benôit de Maillet (1656–1738) in the manuscript Telliamed that circulated in French circles for ten years before its publication in 1748 offered bold speculations on how sea creatures developed into land forms over time—the period before the middle of the eighteenth century was dominated by a theory of organic generation that effectively precluded the naturalistic development of species. The development of scientific transformism was therefore intimately tied to new theories of generation.

The first beginnings of these inquiries can be dated to the 1740s. In 1744 the Swedish naturalist, Carl von Linné (Linnaeus) (1707–1778) presented in his address Oratio de Telluris habitabilis incremento (Oration on the Increase of the Habitated World), a historical theory of the origin of species by the original hybridization of a few original forms that had been created by divine action on a primeval equatorial island. These forms subsequently hybridized and then migrated to different locations as land emerged to give rise to the existing species (Eriksson, 1983, 93–97). This Linnean thesis of the origin of new species in time by the hybridization of original forms was to have a long history, extending to the work of Gregor Mendel. The hybridization theory does not, however, imply a genuine historical change of species in the sense of later transformism and in some respects it was to form a source of opposition to genuine transformism, as will be seen in the latter part of this article.

The emergence of the first systematic speculations on the changes of species in response to external changes of conditions were directly tied to the critiques of the pre-existence theory of generation and the replacement of this theory with a reformulated version of “mechanistic” epigenetic embryology described above. First given currency by the French natural philosopher Pierre de Maupertuis (1698–1759) in a popular series of treatises published between 1744 and 1751, Maupertuis returned to the theory of the origin of the embryo from the Galenic-Hippocratic theory of the “two seeds” that had also been endorsed in the discredited theories of Descartes. To deal with the previously insuperable problems of explaining how atomistic seeds could be formed by mechanical action into the complexity of the embryo without the intervention of an external organizing principle, Maupertuis formulated a series of theories originally relying upon Newtonian attraction between corresponding particles, and finally on a theory that claimed the particles themselves to be endowed with an internal principle that led them to arrange themselves to form specific parts of the fetus. With Maupertuis, we see emerge a new version of mechanistic epigensis tied to a theory of vital matter (Terrall 2002, chp. 7; Hoffheimer 1982).

The relevance of this theoretical change in embryological theory for the transformation of species lies first in the claim that the embryo actually comes to be in historical time, and second in the claim that small changes in the material particles could then be passed on to the offspring. The continuity of the species through generation also had within it a principle of novelty. The line of thinking opened up by Maupertuis' speculations was then developed and elaborated within an institutional setting by his associate and fellow enthusiast for Newton and Leibniz, Georges-Louis LeClerc, comte de Buffon (1708–88).

1.2 Buffon's Revolution In Natural History

As the head of the King's Garden and Natural History Cabinet in Paris for the last half-century of the Bourbon monarchy (1739–88), Buffon was institutionally situated to occupy the position of the major theoretician of the natural-historical sciences of his era, unequalled even by his contemporary Linnaeus. Furthermore, through his analyses of the issue of animal and plant generation, his reformulation of the problems surrounding the “theory of the earth,” and his methodological revolution in the epistemology of the natural-historical sciences, Buffon was able to set up a series of theoretical questions that could be developed further by his successors. In this way he was the key figure in the pre-Darwinian period to open up the issues of transformism.

Buffon's major work, the Histoire naturelle, générale et particulière, avec la Description du Cabinet du Roi (1749–89), with the first series (1749–67) written in collaboration with the comparative anatomist Marie-Louis Daubenton (1716–1800), dealt not only with the material suggested by its title, but also with issues in the foundational epistemology and methodology of the natural-historical sciences. Throughout the Natural History Buffon offered to a wide readership a new vision of inquiry into plants, animals and the “theory of the earth” that re-oriented investigations after this point. Originally intended to deal with the entire range of animals, plants and minerals, in actual realization his Natural History dealt only with the natural history of the primary quadrupeds in the first fourteen volumes (1749–67). The natural history of the birds was treated in a second series of nine volumes (1770–83). A series of seven volumes of supplements offered additional reflections on issues related to the quadrupeds and historical cosmology. An additional five volumes (1783–88) dealt with issues of minerology and chemistry. Continuations of these inquiries after his death by his understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825) extended Buffon's general approach into the reptiles (1788–89), fishes (1798–1803) and cetaceans (1804). The “age of Buffon” became a defining era in natural history and established the King's garden and its Revolutionary successor, the Muséum nationale d'histoire naturelle, as the foremost institutional center of natural-historical inquiry through the nineteenth century (Spary 2000, chp. 1; Corsi 1988, 2001).

On the plane of natural philosophy and scientific methodology, Buffon has been seen as innovative in the unusual way in which he sought to validate the inquiry into natural history in relation to a naturalized epistemology that was novel for its time (Roger 1997a, chp. 9; Roger 1997b, chp. 6). In this new methodology, Buffon claimed epistemic warrant for achieving a form of empirical certitude—what he termed “physical truth” [verité physique]— through inquiries into the concrete relations of beings in their material relations, and he opposed this “physical” truth to the “abstractions” of mathematical physics that had previously claimed to be the route to certitude. Developed in a long “Discourse on Method” that opened his Natural History, Buffon contrasted the “physical” truth obtained in the “concrete” sciences, such as he intended to lay out in the Natural History, to the mere “mathematical” certainty available in the “abstract” sciences like mathematics. Developing on his own conception of probability calculus, Buffon argued that a science which is based upon repeated observation can achieve a scientific realism that surpasses that available from a mathematical analysis of nature (Grene and Depew 2004; Roger 1997b, chp. 6; Sloan 1987; Buffon 1749 in Lyon and Sloan, 1981, esp. 122–27).

With these epistemic claims, Buffon argued that one could move out from a starting point in an empirical theory of knowledge centered on the human being to an expanding knowledge of things that could be known with “physical” certitude. Futhermore, such knowledge could be obtained without the need for a divine guarantee, as had been required by orthodox Cartesianism. This “physical” truth could extend from the understanding of the complex issue of organic generation, to the knowledge of species, to the history of the earth, and finally to an understanding of the relationships of beings in time.

These epistemological reforms in the natural-historical sciences take precedence, this article claims, over all the specific theories and empirical inquiries which Buffon offered in the Natural History. They supplied the foundations for a distinctive “style” of doing natural history that disconnected it from its long association with providential “design-contrivance” natural theology. Buffon's approach also formulated inquiries into the habits, anatomy, ecology, and history of living beings in a way that gave philosophical autonomy both from the assumptions of the “mechanical” philosophy and also from the dominance of mathematical physics in natural science. His “realist” epistemology also broke with the counter-factual tradition of exposition. Even though all these points were made in fragmentary form, and often without the full development they required to be satisfactory from a general philosophical point of view, they resulted in a presentation of issues that profoundly affected the subsequent tradition.

Buffon's long autocratic leadership at the Paris Jardin du Roi and its attendent Cabinet of specimens collected at Paris transformed the Jardin into a center of research into comparative anatomy, chemistry, botany, and the description of the animate world (Spary 2000). By providing an institutional setting for these inquiries, the speculations and theoretical reflections of many eighteeth-century natural historians could be subjected to organized critique and specialized examination in a form not available elsewhere in the natural-historical sciences of the period. Buffon's theoretical vision provided a concrete framework against which those immediately associated with the Jardin could develop further reflections on such issues as the nature and duration of species, the significance of comparative anatomical studies, the historical relationships of forms, and on the systematic relations of living beings to one another.

1.3 Buffon on Species and Degeneration Theory

The concrete manifestation of these philosophical principles can be followed first into Buffon's analysis of embryological generation in the second volume of his Natural History. It extends from there into his unusual analysis of the meaning of “species” in natural history. In both instances, the notion of epistemic certainty gained from a “constant recurrence” of events seems to have played a fundamental role in his reflections. Following the lead of his friend Maupertuis, Buffon revived the classical theory of the two seeds and the origin of the embryo from the mixture of these. Following and amplifying Maupertuis' early (if not final) theory, he explained the organization of the particles of these two seeds into a structured whole through microforces analogous to Newtonian attractive forces that formed an organizing force-field, an “internal mold,” that assimilated matter in the proper order for embryological development. Viewed in longer historical perspective, Buffon's theory of the internal mold in some important respects resembles Aristotle's notion of a substantial form. It serves as an immanent principle of organization that acts in company with matter to form the unified organism. The internal mold also guaranteed the perpetuity of like by like over time. Unlike Aristotle's substantial form, however, Buffon's internal mould is passive and without an internal finality in its action. It is not itself, unlike Aristotle's “soul” (psuche), a principle of vitalization.

For this reason, Buffon was conceptually required to attribute some new powers to matter. Like Maupertuis before him, Buffon did not assume that an inert and common matter was sufficient for a plausible formulation of a theory of mechanical epigenesis. Vital properties therefore had to be attributed to a specific kind of matter confined to living beings, comprising organic molecules, that possessed inherent vital properties. This introduction of the concept of “vital” matter by Buffon, even with these restrictions on its actions, represents an important development in the history of the life sciences of this period. It broke with the uniformity of matter assumed by the Newtonian, Gassendist, and Cartesian traditions, and in a limited way it positioned Buffon at the opening of the “vitalist” revolution that was to open the door to genuine species transformism, even though Buffon himself never moved into this new domain (Reill 2005, chp. 1).

In his original formulations, Buffon described these internal molds and molecules as originating from divine creation. As the Natural History progressed, however, Buffon increasingly viewed the organic molecules as forming out of original “brute” matter, and the internal molds themselves were seen to arise spontaneously, obtaining their specificity of action purely from the differential forces of attraction between different shapes of organic particles (Buffon 1765 in Piveteau 1954, 38–41).

It is in the context of his analysis of the domestic quadrupeds, commencing with the fourth volume of the Natural History (1753) that Buffon first raised the issue of species transformism, only to reject it. Writing in the article on the Ass in 1753, Buffon drew attention to the close similarity revealed by his collaborator Daubenton's anatomical descriptions between the internal anatomy of the horse and that of the ass. This seemed to manifest an underlying unity of plan of all the quadrupeds to such a degree that Buffon raised the possibility that all might have been derived from single stem (souche) which “in the succession of time, has produced, by perfection and degeneration, all the other animals” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). In a move that has confused commentators every since, Buffon then rejected this possibility.

The explanation of Buffon's 1753 rejection of transformism has taken many forms (Bowler 2003, chp. 3), but this article adopts the view that both his initial rejection of transformism, and his subsequent developments toward the concept of historical species change are a result of the conception of organic species that emerged from his reflections on the problem of generation in company with his novel epistemology (Sloan 1987). As is the case with Aristotle's concept of the substantial form, which gave metaphysical foundation for the essential identity of offspring and parent through sexual generation, Buffon's internal mold functioned in a similar way. The species is maintained in time and given its ontological reality by the passing on in time of the mold from parent to offspring. But this implied, for Buffon, a significant redefinition of the concept of an organic species that has affected the tradition of natural history and biology since the 1750s (Sloan in Auxier and Hahn, 2002; Gayon, 1996). Explicitly denying the long-accepted meaning of ‘species’ as a universal or, in modern parlance, a class concept, forming a set of individuals based on similarities in defining properties, Buffon defined a species in natural history solely as the historical succession of ancestor and descendant linked by material connection through generation. The species is to rest on the material succession of forms producing like from like: “…it is neither the number nor the collection of similar individuals which forms the species; it is the constant succession and uninterrupted renewal of these individuals which constitutes it” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). The empirical sign of this essential unity of the species over time is fertile interbreeding, a criterion that takes precedence over similarities of anatomy or habits of life. The horse and ass must be two different species because they cannot interbreed and produce fertile offspring. The dogs, on the other hand, must, in spite of great morphological differences between breeds, constitute one species because of their fertile interbreeding.

In setting forth this new meaning of ‘species’ in natural history, distinguishing it from the traditional connotation as a logical universal as this concept continued to be understood by such contemporaries as Linnaeus, Buffon was doing more than distinguishing the “category” from the “taxon” as these terms have come to be understood in contemporary philosophy of biology. In an important sense, Buffon introduced an opposition between these two meanings, granting “reality” to the species conceived as a material succession spread out in time, and allowing only “abstractness” or “artificiality” to the species conceived as a class concept or universal in the logical sense. This introduced a fundamental confusion into the denotation of ‘species’ in subsequent discussions in the biological literature that has persisted to the present, underlying a major component of the so-called “species problem” (Wilson 1999; Wheeler and Meier, 1999; Ereshefsky, 1992; Sober and Wilson 1994; Dupré 1993;. The distinction underlies contemporary disputes that oppose “species as sets” to “species as spatio-temporal individuals” (Sloan in Auxier and Hahn, 2002).

The subsequent developments in Buffon's thought toward what an older tradition of scholarship mistakenly interpreted to be evolutionism, involved the gradual broadening of his natural-historical species to include wider and wider degrees of material relationship. This broadening Buffon expressed in the language of a “degeneration” of forms in time in response to environmental conditions. The encounter with a wide body of new data from the colonies and exploratory voyages returned to Paris during the course of the writing of the Natural History impressed Buffon with the degree to which species seemed to be affected by external circumstances to the degree that from a single source numerous “degenerations” or in an early use of the term, “races” could develop. Developed in main detail in his long article, “On the Degeneration of Animals” of 1766, Buffon lumped the quadrupeds of both the Old and New worlds into a limited number of primary “families” and “genera” which had degenerated in time in response to migration from common points of origin to new locales.To explain these changes, Buffon appealed to slight changes due to environmental conditions that could affect the organic molecules, and in turn affect the internal molds.

Buffon subsequently made some steps toward combining the thesis of the historical degeneration of species with his theory of historical cosmology in On the Epochs of Nature, published as a supplement to the Natural History in 1779. In this treatise he reworked his earlier speculations on the “theory of the earth,” first set out in 1749, adding to this a historical chronology of the age of the earth determined experimentally in the 1770s through experiments with cooling spheres of metal. In this great synthesis, Buffon combined a history of the Earth with a historical sequence of the emergence of living forms (Buffon 1779, 1988). Expanding the time scale considerably beyond the accepted “Mosaic” chronology of less than 10,000 years from the beginning of the world to the present, to an estimate of approximately 75,000 years in the published version and over two million years in his draft manuscripts, Buffon offered a naturalistic solution to the two inherited Cartesian dilemmas. First, his schema was offered as a realistic account. The Cartesian language of counterfactualism has disappeared. Second, he integrated the history of living forms into this naturalistic history of the world. Further naturalizing his theory of the internal molds and organic molecules, both were now seen to arise by natural laws from the natural attraction of different shapes of matter and from the changes in matter brought about on the cooling earth. Animals first originated by the spontaneous clumping together of these organic molecules (Buffon 1988, époque 5).

The Epochs also offered schema of a historical sequence of forms, beginning with marine life and plants and eventually resulting in present forms. Even the origin of human beings was left somewhat unclear in this story, with mankind appearing without explanation not in a biblical paradise, but in the northern latitudes surrounded by ferocious animals, earthquakes and floods, and in a primitive social condition that required collaboration for survival. Buffon's liberal use of a form of spontaneous generation that allowed for the origin of even major animal groups from the clumping together of organic molecules as the earth cooled, rendered the actual derivation of forms from previous forms unnecessary. In several respects, the development of genuine transformist theories by Buffon's successors required a much more restricted use of the possibility of spontaneous generation.

Buffon's Epochs appears to have had an uneven impact on subsequent speculations outside of France (Roger in Buffon 1789, 1988, cxxiv). The work was never translated into English and seems to have played an insignificant role on Anglophone discussions, in contrast, for example, with the major impact of the works of Linnaeus, which received a wide British exposition and translation. Its boldly speculative character was also at odds with the more professionalized inquiries into geology and natural history being undertaken by a younger generation of naturalists who may have adopted Buffon's naturalism, but not his grand style.

On the other hand, the Epochs was quickly translated into German and it seems to have played an important role in the development of German historicism (Reill 1992 in Gayon et al, 1992). Although linkages are unclear, the importance of Buffon's work for the development of progressive, rather than degenerative, theories of historical transformism sketched out by Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) in his Ideen zur Philosophie der Geschichte der Menschheit (1784–91) is suggested by several lines of evidence. Through Herder's impact on the subsequent development of German Naturphilosophie and Romanticism, a general historical “development” of species from simple beginnings to more complex forms in company with a development of the history of the world was introduced broadly into German reflections of the early nineteenth century (Richards 2002, chps. 2, 3, 8). For Kant, the Epochs formed the foremost example of a genetic history of nature (Naturgeschichte) as opposed to a Linnean description of nature (Naturbeschreibung.) This set up within the German tradition an opposition between two alternative projects in natural history that persisted into the nineteenth century (Sloan 1979).

1.4 French Transformism After Buffon

Although several individuals at the Paris Muséum national d'histoire naturelle—the restructured post-Revolutionary successor to the Jardin du Roi—pursued aspects of Buffon's project in the decades following his death, a list that included his former collaborator Marie-Louis Daubenton and his immediate understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825) (Corsi, 1988, 2001, chp. 1), subsequent reflections drew most inspiration from the theoretical developments by Buffon's one-time understudy and the occupant of the new chair of invertebrates (Vers) from 1794–1829, Jean Baptiste Chevalier de Lamarck (1744–1829).

Lamarck developed the theory of species change over time to the point that it was recognized as the first modern theory of species transformism. Formulated within an institutional context dedicated to scientific work, Lamarck's theories also had the necessary material conditions for elaboration as a socially-embedded theory. Presented in lectures and writings within this environment, his theories could be tested, debated, and developed by others against the background of collections, museum displays, and lectures taking place at the Paris Muséum.

Lamarck's theory of species evolution emerged in his Muséum lectures on the “animals without backbones,” lectures that commenced in 1794. When appointed to his Muséum chair, Lamarck began a massive reorganization of the Muséum collections of the animals subsequently to be know as the “invertebrates.” Adopting from his earlier method of arrangement of the plant groups in his work on French botany (1778) that had ordered groups serially from most complex to most simple, Lamarck adopted a similar method for the invertebrate groups. These taxonomic rearrangements took place before Lamarck made any public declaration of his views on species transformism, but this rearrangement provided him with an empirical base from which these theories were then developed (Burkhardt 1977).

Because there have been many interpretations (and misinterpretations) of Lamarck's views since 1809, the primary features of Lamarck's theory need to be carefully detailed. In most fundamental terms, his theory of species change was tied to his reversal of the taxonomic ordering of forms originally presented in his early arrangements as simple linear series that began with the most complex forms and terminated in the least organized. By 1800, he had decided that this ordering was artificial, and that the “natural” arrangement was from simple to complex. The evolutionary theory he developed involved the claim that this new order of arrangement was also the sequence in which forms had been historically generated one from another over time.

These themes were first presented in the Muséum lectures of 1800, and then worked out in more detail in his Récherches sur l'organisation des corps organisés (1802), with the full development in the Philosophie zoologique (1809, 1994). Some further significant elaborations of his ideas were then developed in his many articles for the second edition of Joseph Virey's Nouveau dictionnaire d'Histoire naturelle (1817–19) (Roger and Laurent 1991), and in the long introductory discourse to his major work of taxonomic revision of the invertebrates, the Histoire naturelle des animaux sans vertèbres (1815). The following claims formed the core of his theory:

  1. The origin of living beings is initially through spontaneous generation. This action is confined, however, to the origins of the most structurally-simple forms of life—infusoria. All subsequent forms necessarily have developed in some way in time from the elementary beginning in the simplest microscopic forms (infusoria) that are presumably generated spontaneously.
  2. The dynamism for this “ascent,” rather than “degeneration,” of life over time is supplied by the causal agency of dynamic material agencies—caloric and electricity. These material agencies produce the spontaneous generation of the infusorians and also provide the impetus by which these give rise to forms of higher complexity, the radiarians, and so on up the series. Moving beyond the distinction of “inert” and “living” matter of his mentor Buffon, Lamarck's theories generally can be considered truly “vitalist” in inspiration in that they attribute a genuine dynamism to living matter and grant it the ability to create new forms and structures by its inherent powers. Lamarck's appeal to the causal role of Newtonian aetherial fluids, however, grounded his theory on a concept of active matter rather than on special vital forces, and in this respect it can be termed a theory of vital materialism.
  3. The principle axis of Lamarckian transformism was that of a linear series, realized in time, moving from simpler forms up a scale of organization to more complex forms that fell along an axis of fourteen primary groups, terminating in the mammals. This paralleled the “natural” order of classification in a series. Position on the series was defined primarily in terms of the structural and functional elaboration of the nervous system.
  4. The best-known feature of Lamarckianism in the subsequent tradition—the theory of transformism via the inheritance of acquired characters—functioned as a subordinate, diversifying process through which major animal groups were adapted to local circumstances. Such adaptation was not, however, the primary cause of transformation from group to group up the series. Consequently, in contrast to Darwin's later theory, the primary evolution of life was not through local adaptation.
  5. Lamarck was willing, however, to allow major transformations between species to occur through the action of use and disuse of structures and functions. For example, the transformation of primates into humans had presumably occurred by means of this adaptive process.

The reception of Lamarck's views remains a topic of active scholarly exploration (Laurent 1997, section 4; Corsi, 2000). Within the confines of the Muséum, parallel, if not immediately continuous, developments of critical issues were made by his younger colleague, the comparative anatomist Etienne Geoffroy St. Hilaire (1772–1844). Less concerned with the issue of species transformism than with the implications of comparative anatomy, St. Hilaire pursued the implications of the anatomical “unity of type” revealed by the deeper anatomy of forms. Pursuing this issue in his Muséum lectures and in several papers (Guyader 2004), St. Hilaire proceeded to work out the implications of the anatomical similarities of vertebrates as one went deeper into their anatomical structure. Based on two main principles, the “principle of connection” and the “law of balance,” St. Hilaire drew attention to the implications of comparative anatomy for the unity of the animal kingdom. Although St. Hilaire was initially more concerned with issues of comparative anatomy and embryology rather than with the question of historical species change, in the mid 1820s he developed a more historical position on the relation of the unity of type to issues of the fossil record and the development of life (Guyader 2004, chp. 4).

By 1823, Geoffroy had extended his theory of the “unity of type” to the claim that even the invertebrates shared a common plan with the vertebrates, and by 1825 he had embraced a limited version of transformism. This led him into direct opposition to the claims of his one-time friend and colleague, Georges Cuvier (1769–1832), whose own researches in comparative anatomy and paleontology had led him to conclude that animals were formed on a series of four body plans (embranchments) that may display some unity of type within the embranchments, but that there was no possibility of such unity between these plans.

The “great debate” that broke out in French life science and quickly ramified into a popular public controversy in the late 1820s between Geoffroy and Cuvier (Appel 1987), forms one of the historic encounters between differing conceptions of biology and the relation of organisms to history and the possibility of species change. This debate also served to focus issues within French life science in a way that significantly affected the later French reception of Darwin. This debate eventually was to involve issues of paleontology, comparative anatomy, transformism of species, and the relation of form to function (Guyader 2004).

Cuvier's arguments and the authority he carried in French comparative anatomy eventually resulted in an official victory of his positions within the Paris Académie des sciences. Nonetheless, the tradition of Geoffroy remained a strong current within the Muséum, continued by such individuals as Antoine Etienne Serres (1786–1868), whose arguments for a historical sequence of forms, revealed through embryological study, was canonized in morphological circles as the Meckel-Serres law of recapitulation (Gould 1977, chp. 3). Outside official Academic French science, Geoffroy's theories had broad appeal to those who saw the relevance of developmental embryology for issues of group relationship, an issue that preformationist Cuvier had ignored. The renewed interest in this issue at the present has been generated by the concern of some evolutionary biologists to reforge the links between developmental embryology and evolutionary theory (Guyader 2004; Hall 1992).

1.5 Transformism in Britain 1830–1859

Until recent decades, a long historiographical tradition emphasized the developments in British natural history, geology, and natural theology as the primary background for understanding the subsequent developments in evolutionary theory leading up to Darwin. The new awareness of the importance of issues raised within British medical discussions, and the impact of French and German discussions on the British context has only recently been emphasized (Richards 2002; Sloan 2003a;Desmond 1989).

Darwin's early mentor, Robert Edmund Grant (1793–1874) provided a crucial link between these Continental discussions and Darwin's early formation. First in contact with Darwin during his studies in medicine at the University of Edinburgh (1825–27), Grant then became the holder of the first chair in comparative anatomy at the new University College, London. Grant brought the attention of a British and Scottish audience to the issues being debated between Geoffroy, Cuvier and Lamarck. The elaboration of these issues in British discussions in the 1830s and 40s, particularly involving Grant and his disciples, and those influenced by Richard Owen (1804–92), forms a background for understanding at least some of Darwin's development (Desmond 1989, Sloan 1992, Sloan 1997).

Associated with the great Hunterian Museum of comparative anatomy in London from 1827 until 1856 in positions that ranged from assistant to the curator, to that of the holder of the prestigious Hunterian lecturship in comparative anatomy from 1837–56, Owen acquired first-hand acquaintance with the Paris Muséum debates between Cuvier, Geoffroy and Lamarck during a trip to Paris in 1831. He resolved after this date to find a solution to the conflict between Cuvier and Geoffroy. This eventually led to his positing the theory of the archetypal vertebrate in an important set of publications in 1847 and 1848. Employing aspects of William Whewell's philosophy of science, Owen developed the theory of the unity of type in relation to Cuvierian form and function through the positing of an ideal archetypal form that worked both as a transcendental idealization similar to a Platonic form, and also as an immanent law working in matter, conceived almost as a Newtonian law, governing the development of forms in time (Sloan 2003a, Rupke 1993). Through this theory, Owen claimed he could coherently explain both the deep resemblance of forms in their internal anatomy, emphasized by Geoffroy St. Hilaire, and also the difference of forms in their external functions, displaying the close fitting of structure and function to the “conditions of existence,” the point emphasized by Cuvier. To distinguish these two meanings of relationship, Owen introduced into the literature a crucial distinction between resemblances of “homology” meaning the presence of the same parts in every variety of form and function—Geoffroyean relationship—from “analogy,” the similarities of parts in their functional adaptations—Cuvierian relationship. Furthermore, as this theory was developed in relation to his work on the fossil record, the theory of the archetype as an immanent law working in time led Owen to embrace a concept of branching and diversifying relation of forms to this ideal archetypal form in time, rather than a linear progressionism endorsed in different ways by both Lamarck and Geoffroy (Ospovat 1976). Although Owen's model cannot be considered genuine transformism—species do not change historically one into another—it can be seen that by his integration of comparative anatomy, paleontology, and even embryology, Owen set out sophisticated models of relationship that could later be reinterpreted from the viewpoint of Darwinian theory.

2. Darwinian Evolution

Since Darwin's theory of evolution is the subject of the entry on Darwinism, the present entry will focus on the following points in relation to Darwin's theory not developed in the other entry:

2.1 Recent Scholarship on the Origins of Darwin's Theory

Charles Darwin's version of transformism has been the subject of massive historical and philosophical scholarship almost unparalleled in any other area of the history of science (Hodge and Radick, 2003, Gayon 1998, Tort 1996, Depew and Weber 1995, Kohn 1985a, Ghiselin 1969). In part this continued scholarly interest stems from the fact that unlike most foundational texts in the history of science, Darwin's own writings continue to be sources of creative reflection in the actual work of evolutionary biology (Gayon 2003 in Hodge and Radick 2003, chp. 10).

This historical phenomenon itself presents difficulties. Particularly within anglophone philosophy of biology, the emphasis on the lines of the development of Darwin's evolutionary that have led to the consensus position achieved in the synthetic theory of evolution of the 1930s has tended to obscure the complex history of Darwin's actual theoretical reflections and the complexities that the history of Darwinian theory presents. The interpretations of Darwin from the perspective of contemporary evolutionary biology are themselves the product of a complex historical development that either represent the elaborations of themes found only in part in the writings of the historic Darwin, or as rational reconstructions that cannot in fact be attributed to Darwin's writings. Darwinism itself can be seen as an evolving set of theories that have altered in relation to the changes in social and intellectual contexts (Depew and Weber, 1995).

These internal complexities in Darwin's heritage have shaped Darwinism into more than one tradition. French biology, for example, still pays greater respect to Lamarck than is true in English literature and seeks to de-emphasize the contrasts between the presumably failed theories of Lamarck and those of Darwin (Laurent 1997). The long heritage of Kantianism, Schelling's philosophy of nature, and the influence of German Idealism has left its mark on German interpretations of Darwin that persist to the present (Hösle and Innes, 2005, in press). One example of these differences is the preference within German life science for developmental genetics and embryology over Morgan's chromosomal genetics and the population dynamics which derived from it (Harwood 1993). The heritage of Ernst Haeckel and German morphological interpretations of Darwin have also played an important role in the genesis of challenges to the consensus “synthetic theory,” issues that were first made prominent in recent anglophone discussions through the work of Stephen Jay Gould (Gould 1977). The long-standing concern with developmental biology arising from the German tradition is also behind current challenges to the completeness of the synthetic theory of evolution mounted under the banner of “evo-devo” (Gilbert, Opitz and Raff 1996), although others have wished to make a less polemical appeal for a new linkage of evolutionary theory and developmental biology (Hall 1992).

Darwin's theory was different in kind than its main predecessors in important ways. Viewed against the longer historical scenario developed in the present entry, Darwin's theory is not a theory of ultimate origins of life by naturalistic laws, and therefore differs in its theoretical scope from those of his main predecessors, Buffon and Lamarck, and more immediately from the grand evolutionary cosmology put forth anonymously in 1844 by the Scottish publisher Robert Chambers (1802–71) in his immensely popular Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation, a work which in many respects prepared Victorian society in England, and pre-Civil War America, for Darwin's more restricted theory (Secord 2000).

A long tradition of scholarship has interpreted Darwin's theory to have originated from his experience with plant and animal biogeography, particularly as encountered on oceanic islands during the Beagle voyage (1831–36). Emphasis has also been put upon his conversion to the uniformitarian geology of Charles Lyell and to Lyell's thesis of gradual change over time (Hodge 2003 in Hodge and Radick, 2003, Hodge 1982). Methodologically, there has also been an emphasis on the importance of the hypothetico-deductive method absorbed from the reading of John Herschel's Introduction to the Study of Natural Philosophy (1831) and from his later encounter with the constructive methodology of William Whewell in the formation of Darwin's theory (Ruse 1975). Complementing this predominant historiography has been the social-constructivist analyses which have emphasized Darwin's affiliations to British Political Economy and his early embrace of design-contrivance British natural theology (Young, 1985, chps. 2,4,5).

A revisionist historiography, on the other hand, has de-emphasized some of the novelty of Darwin's views; there has been within these accounts a greater emphasis on the degree to which Darwin was not a “Darwinian.” Questions have been raised regarding the validity of the standard biographical picture of the early Darwin, and new emphasis has been placed on Darwin's relations to the Romantic movement, to British medical developments, and to his early formation in Scottish science (Richards 2002; Sloan, 2001; Desmond 1989).

The revisions in the understanding of the origins of Darwinian theory are indebted to the wealth of manuscripts and correspondence that have become available since the 1960s (Burkhardt et al, 1995; Barrett et al, 1987; Hodge, 1990). As a result of research on these materials, Darwin has been the subject of several lengthy biographical re-examinations (Browne 1995, 2002; Desmond and Moore 1991; Bowlby 1990). These studies have drawn attention to previously ignored aspects of Darwin's biography. The importance of his Edinburgh period from 1825–27, discounted in importance by Darwin himself in his late Autobiography, has been seen as critical for his subsequent development (Hodge 1985 in Kohn 1985a, Sloan 1985 in Kohn 1985a). It was at Edinburgh that he first encountered the writings of Lamarck and Geoffroy St. Hilaire through his mentor Robert Edmund Grant. This period also initiated an abiding interest in invertebrate zoology that would later emerge in full in his important work on the barnacles (Love 2002).

Similarly, appreciation of the content of his work in physiological botany and in entomology during his studies in Cambridge from 1827–31 under the guidance of his mentor John Stevens Henslow (1795–1861), and his work in geology with Adam Sedgwick (1795–1873) has considerably deepened the understanding of his preparation for the theoretical work that transpired during the voyage of the HMS Beagle (Sloan 2003b in Hodge and Radick 2003; Sloan 1986). Under Henslow's guidance, Darwin was introduced to the writings of both John Herschel and Alexander von Humboldt. Humboldt's writings on botanical geography, geology, landscape, anthropology, and the philosophy of nature, to the degree they were known to Darwin in these years, seem to have played an important, if still uncertain, role during the Beagle years. Some scholars now interpret Darwin's initial reflections on transformism to have developed initially from reflections stimulated by Humboldt's version of German philosophy of nature as much as from the traditional sources usually assumed in Lyell, Herschel and British natural theology (Richards 2002, chp. 14; Sloan 2001; Sloan 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005, in press). Rather than seeing Darwin's theory developing from any one root, however, current scholarship emphasizes a multiplicity of origins that include the traditional British traditions as well as Continental sources.

2.2 Darwin on Nature and Teleology

Since other aspects of Darwin's theory and its development are treated elsewhere, this discussion will restrict its focus to an analysis of two issues with considerable bearing on the philosophical issues that have extended from Darwin's work and that are still under discussion in contemporary philosophy of biology. One concerns the meaning of natural selection in his writings, and the other bears on the question of teleology in relation to his theory of species evolution.

As is well-known, Darwin's theory first took concrete written form in reflections in a series of notebooks composed by Darwin after the return of the Beagle between March of 1837 and September of 1839 ( Barrett et al. 1987). Beginning with the notebook reflections of the third or “D” Notebook, composed between July and October of 1838, Darwin first worked out the rudiments of what was to become his theory of natural selection (Hodge 2003 in Hodge and Radick, 2003). To summarize a complex issue, these notebook reflections show Darwin proceeding through a series of stages in which he first formulated a general theory of the transformism of species. He then attempted to work out a causal theory of life that would explain the tendency of life to complexify and diversify (Sloan 1986). This was then replaced by a shift in focus to the control of population assumed to be expanding in a geometrical fashion. This allowed him to develop the implications of population increase for the transformation of species. In his universalization of Thomas Malthus's (1766–1834) “principle of population,” Darwin introduced a kind of “inertial” principle into his theory. Like Newton's first law that posits the inertial state of a body in motion to persist in motion in a straight line, requiring a causal explanation for any deviations from this, the principle of population provided for Darwin an initial dynamic state of affairs that was not itself explained within the theory—there is no attempt to account for why living beings tend to reproduce geometrically. Rather, the principle of population functions axiomatically, defining a set of initial conditions from which any deviance from this ideal state demands explanation. This theoretical shift enabled Darwin to bracket his earlier efforts to develop a causal theory of life, and focus instead on the means by which the dynamic force of population was controlled, and determine how this control on population worked out in company with the phenomenon of slight individual variation and changing conditions of life to produce a gradual change of form and function.

2.3 Textual History of the Natural Selection Concept

The stages of the development of Darwin's theory of natural selection between the close of the Notebook period and the publication of the Origin—approximately twenty years—involved a series of reflections that form successive strata in the final version of his theory of the evolution of species. Understanding the historical sequence of these developments has significant bearing on the subsequent interpretation of Darwin's relevance for more general philosophical questions, such as the teleology of nature and the meaning of natural selection.

The earliest set of themes in the manuscript development of natural selection theory can be characterized as the positing of a strong analogy between human art and the workings of nature. This postulated parallels between selection by human agency in the formation of domestic forms and the active selection by an almost conscious agency, a “being more sagacious than man (not an omniscient creator)” (Darwin 1842 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 91). This agency selects out those features most beneficial to organisms in relation to conditions of life, analogous in its action to the selection by man on domestic forms in the production of different breeds. Interwoven with these references to an almost Platonic demiurge are appeals to the selecting power of an active “Nature”:

Nature's variation far less, but such selection far more rigid and scrutinizing[.…] Nature lets [an] animal live, till on actual proof it is found less able to do the required work to serve the desired end, man judges solely by his eye, and knows not whether nerves, muscles, arteries, are developed in proportion to the change of external form. (Ibid., 93)

These themes were continued in the long draft of his theory written in 1844. Again he referred to the selective action of a wise imaginary being whose selection was made with greater foresight and wisdom than human selection. This agency worked as a secondary cause in a larger plan of a creator that governed the universe such that “the process of selection could go on adapting, nicely and wonderfully, organisms, if in ever so small a degree plastic, to diverse ends. I believe such secondary means do exist” (Darwin 1844 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 103).

The return to reflections on the theory of natural selection was made by Darwin in 1856 after a twelve-year period in which he had published his Geological Observations on the Volcanic Islands (1844), the second edition of his Journal of Researches (1845), the Geological Observations on South America (1846), the four volumes on fossil and living barnacles (1851, 54, 55), and the Geological Observations on Coral Reefs (1851). In addition, he had published several smaller papers on invertebrate zoology, geology, and experiments on the resistance of seeds to salt water.

These inquiries positioned Darwin to deal with the question of species change against an extensive empirical background. The composition of his “Big Species Book,” commenced in 1856, known more generally as the “Natural Selection” manuscript, formed the immediate background to the published Origin. This text provides insights into many issues in Darwin's thinking. It was also prepared with an eye to the scholarly community and unlike the later “abstract” that was issued as the Origin of Species, it contained tables of data, references to scholarly literature, and other apparatus expected of a non-popular work. Scholars have noted the introduction in this manuscript of the “principle of divergence,” the thesis that organisms under the action of natural selection will tend to radiate and diversify (Kohn 1985b in Kohn 1985a). Although this might be seen as an implication of Darwin's theory since the 1830s, nonetheless Darwin's explicit definition of this as “principle” in the “Natural Selection” manuscript, granting it a new theoretical role in the way variation related to “natural” selection, constituted a new level of attention to this issue.

Still evident in the drafting of “Natural Selection” is Darwin's implicit appeal to some kind of teleological ordering of the process. The action of the “wise being” of the earlier manuscripts however has now been given over entirely to the action of a selective “nature,” now referred to in the traditional feminine gender. This Nature,

cares not for mere external appearance; she may be said to scrutinise with a severe eye, every nerve, vessel & muscle; every habit, instinct, shade of constitution,—the whole machinery of the organisation. There will be here no caprice, no favouring: the good will be preserved & the bad rigidly destroyed.… Can we wonder then, that nature's productions bear the stamp of a far higher perfection than man's product by artificial selection. With nature the most gradual, steady, unerring, deep-sighted selection,—perfect adaption [sic] to the conditions of existence.… (Darwin 1856, 1974 in Stauffer 1974, 224–25)

The language of this passage, directly underlying the statements used to describe the action of “natural selection” in the first edition of the published Origin, indicates the complexity in the exegesis of Darwin's meaning of “natural selection” when viewed in light of its historical genesis. The parallels of art and nature, the intentionality implied in the term “selection,” and the substantive conception of “nature” as working toward certain ends, all render Darwin's views on teleological purpose more complex than they are typically interpreted from the standpoint of contemporary Darwinian theory.

The hurried preparation and publication of the Origin between the summer of 1858 and November of 1859 was prompted by the receipt on June 18 of 1858 of the letter from Alfred Russel Wallace that outlined his remarkably similar views on the possibility of continuous species change under the action of a selection upon natural variation. This had important implications for the form in which Darwin's views were presented to the public. Rapidly condensing the detailed arguments of the “Natural Selection” manuscript into shorter chapters, Darwin also universalized several claims that he had only developed with reference to specific groups of organisms or with application to more limited situations in “Natural Selection.” This resulted in a presentation of his theory at the level of a broad generalization. The absence of tables of data, detailed footnotes, and references to the secondary literature in the published “abstract” that became the Origin resulted in predictable criticisms. Some members of the scientific elite, such as Richard Owen, attacked the work for the lack of evidence and for unwarranted speculation. At the same time, this same generalizing character of the work and its unification of a broad series of inquiries into taxonomy, paleontology, embryology, biogeography, and comparative anatomy around the claim of descent from primordial forms, drew together an enormous range of biological inquiry under one comprehensive theory. On the popular level, the lack of detail and the literary style of the work allowed the Origin to be read by a wider reading public that previously devoured the many editions of Robert Chambers' Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation and the two editions of Darwin's popular Journal of Researches.

2.4 The Central Argument of the Origin

The argument of the Origin is primarily contained in the first four chapters of the text. The bulk of the remaining original ten chapters involve either elaborations of his accounts of variation (chp. 5), instincts (7), paleontology and biogeography (11–12), answers to obvious objections to the main argument (6, 9–10), or positive illustrations of how the theory encompasses the broad domains of taxonomy, geographical distribution, comparative anatomy, and embryology (12–13). Although Darwin's arguments can be reconstructed in a deductive form (Sober 1984), the historical presentation of the theory was in the form of a constructive, rather than deductive, argument. As a constructive argument, it proceeded by presenting a series of limited issues for acceptance, none of which required of the reader a considerable leap of theoretical assent, and most of which had already been available in some form in the literature of the period. These ingredients are then assembled together in chapter four in a remarkable synthesis that then extends the claims by generalization to cover the full range of life both in time and in space. With Darwin's carefully-designed rhetorical strategy of presentation, only by chapter four would the reader know the full character of what was being claimed.

Opening with a pair of chapters that draw upon the art-nature analogy developed in the manuscripts, Darwin entered the argument with the explanation of the origin of domestic animals, and by inference, plants. These are presumed to have arisen through the action of human selection on the slight variations existing between individuals within the same species. A simple reading of this action as the result of conscious and intentional selection was at the same time downplayed through the importance given by Darwin to the concept of “unconscious” selection—the selection practiced even by aboriginal peoples who simply seek to maintain the integrity of a breed by preserving the best forms. The domestic breeding analogy is not, however, incidental to the work. It repeatedly functions for Darwin as the principal empirical example to which he could appeal for an illustration of the the working of natural selection in nature.

From this model of human selection working on small natural variations to produce the domestic forms, Darwin then developed in the second chapter the implications of “natural” variation, delaying until chapter four the concept of natural selection. The focus of the second chapter extends the discussion of variation to develop the difficulties created for classification by natural variation. The existence of such variation creates problems in distinguishing between taxa at the level of species and varieties. Darwin was fully aware of these practical taxonomic difficulties through his eight-year taxonomic revision on the Subclass Cirrhipedia (barnacles).

Although Darwin was not the first to recognize the difficulty of making sharp taxonomic discriminations at this level because of the phenomenon of variation, at his hands this practical problem that confronts the working taxonomist is subtly transformed into a metaphysical ambiguity. Prior tradition had been heavily affected by Buffon's novel conception of biological species. As we have analyzed previously, Buffon made a sharp distinction between “natural” species defined by such properties as fertile interbreeding, and “artificial” species and varieties defined by morphological traits and measurements upon these. Remarkable about Darwin's argument is the way in which he uses the problem of variation to break down this distinction of “natural” and “artificial” groups. Species are defined by Darwin in morphological, not interbreeding, terms, and are considered to be only what “competent naturalists” define them to be (Darwin 1859, 1964, 47). Furthermore, the ambiguity of distinction between species and varieties is not only a synchronic problem, reflecting some kind of contemporaneous blurring of the boundaries between taxa at these levels. Rather, the ambiguities are transformed into an issue of temporal relationship. Varieties are only “incipient” species (ibid., 52). This subtly transformed the issue of local variation and adaptation to circumstances into a primary ingredient of historical evolutionary change.

Before assembling the ingredients of these first two chapters of the text, Darwin then introduced the “Malthusian” parameter of the geometrical increase of population, which he extend from a principle alleged by Malthus to govern human population in relation to food supply into a general principle governing all of organic life, including the organisms comprising food supply itself. Through this universalization, the control on population becomes only in the extreme limits based directly on the traditional Malthusian limitations of food and space. Controls are instead exerted in through a complex network of relationships of species acting one on another in predator-prey, parasite-host, and food-web relations. This profound revision of Malthus rendered Darwin's theory deeply “ecological” as this term would later be employed. The presence of mice can be determined by the numbers of bumble bees, or the abundance of Scotch Firs by the number of cattle, to cite two examples employed by Darwin (ibid., 72–74). This recognition of complex species-species interactions as the primary means of control also prevents a reading of the Origin as a simple extension to nature of the claims of British political economy and the competition imbedded in Victorian industrialization.

With the ingredients of the first three chapters in place, Darwin was then in the position to assemble these together in his climatic chapter on natural selection. In this long discussion Darwin first set out the ingredients of his central theoretical concept of natural selection. For his contemporaries and for the subsequent tradition, Darwin's concept of “natural” selection was not unambiguously clear for reasons we have outlined above, and these unclarities were to be the source of several lines of disagreement and controversy. Particularly at issue in the exegesis of Darwin's text was whether he considered natural selection to be an efficient cause, a final cause, a result of other causes, or a simple description of the working of several independent factors. The contemporary neo-selectionist interpretation of natural selection as a causal force providing a “mechanism” behind evolutionary change (Sober 1984, chp. 1), is but a later rational reconstruction of one of these themes from the wide range of possible textual readings.

In the initial definition of natural selection presented in the first edition of Darwin's text, it is characterized as “preservation of favourable variations and the rejection of injurious variations” (Darwin 1859, 1964, 81). As Darwin elaborates on this concept in the first edition, he continued to describe natural selection in language suggesting that it was both an efficient and even a final cause of life, continuing the art-nature parallel seen in the manuscripts. For example:

As man can produce and certainly has produced a great result by his methodical and unconscious means of selection, what may not nature effect? Man can act only on external and visible characters: nature cares nothing for appearances, except in so far as they may be useful to any being. She can act on every internal organ, on every shade of constitutional difference, on the whole machinery of life. Man selects only for his own good; Nature only for that of the being which she tends. Every selected character is fully exercised by her; and the being is placed under well-suited conditions of life. (Darwin 1859, 1964, p. 82)

The substantial manuscript history behind such passages, summarized above, prevents the simple discounting of these statements as merely rhetorical imagery. The parallel between the selectivity of man and nature formed the original model upon which the concept was constructed. Criticisms that quickly developed, however, led Darwin to revise the argument in editions beginning with the third edition of 1861. From this point he explicitly downplayed the intentional and teleological language of the first two editions, denying that his appeals to the selective role of “nature” was anything more than a literary metaphor, and he moved decisively in the direction of defining natural selection as the description of a result of the action of natural laws on organic life rather than as an efficient cause (Sloan 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005, in press). The adoption in the fifth edition of 1869 of Herbert Spencer's term “survival of the fittest” as a synonym for “natural selection” further emphasized this shift of meaning between the early texts and drafts and the final statements of the 1860s and 70s. It is these later developments of Darwin's theory that underlie later mechanistic and non-teleological understandings of natural selection for reasons that will be developed later in this article.

The synthesis of issues in chapter four of the Origin included discussion of the conditions under which natural selection most optimally worked, the role of isolation, the causes of the extinction of species, and the principle of divergence. Illustrating the results of this process by the one remarkable diagram to appear in all the editions of the Origin, Darwin utilized the image of a branching bush. In this diagram the combination of gradual change from common ancestral points, the broad extinction of most lines of descent, and the general tendency of populations to diverge and fragment under the pressure of population increase were effectively summarized.

Tree Diagram

Remarkable about this diagram is the relativity of its coordinates. It is first presented as applying only to the divergences taking place at the varietal level, with varieties represented by the small lower-case letters within species A–L of a “wide ranging genus,” with the horizontal time coodinates measured in terms of a limited number of generations. However, the attentive reader could now see that Darwin's destructive analysis of the distinction between “natural” and “artificial” species and the relativity of the species-variety distinction, worked out in chapter two, allowed this diagram to represent all organic relationships, from those at the non-controversial level of diverging varieties within fixed species, to those of the relations of species within different genera. Letters A–L could also represent taxa at the level of Genera, Families or Orders. The diagram can be applied to relationships between all levels of the Linnaean hierarchy with the horizontal coordinates representing vast expanses of time. In a very few pages of argument, the diagram was generalized to represent the most extensive group relations, encompassing the whole of geological time.

When compared to the prior history of evolutionary theorizing we have sketched in this discussion, Darwin's theory is also more restrained. It does not, for example, deal with the question of the first origins of life on the planet, nor does it try to encompass a larger cosmology. The arguments of the natural selection chapter itself suggested the origination of living beings from a few original forms, or even, by logical as well as visual extension of the diagram, from one single form. Only in the final summary of the Origin did Darwin speak of “several powers, having been originally breathed into a few forms or into one” (Darwin 1859, 490). In response to criticisms, he quickly added to this statement in the second edition of 1860 the phrase “by the Creator” that remained in all subsequent editions. This, along with quotes from the frontispiece that suggested his endorsement of the tradition of British natural theology, allowed the text to be read by many as compatible with a theistic account of creation by natural laws.

The sweep of the theoretical generalization that closed the natural selection chapter, restated even more generally in the final summary of the book, required Darwin to deal with several obvious objections in the initial public presentation of the theory. Much of the text of the original Origin is therefore an effort to anticipate these objections and offer a solution to expected difficulties.

As Darwin outlined these main lines of objection, they included the apparent absence of numerous slight gradations between species, both in the present and in the fossil record, of the kind that would seem to be predictable from the gradualist workings of the theory (chps. 6, 9). The existence of organs and structures of extreme complexity, such as the vertebrate eye, structures that had since the writings of Galen in Hellenistic antiquity served as a mainstay in the argument for external teleological design, needed some plausible explanation (chp. 6). The evolution of the elaborate instincts of animals and the puzzling problem of the evolution of social instincts that resulted in the development of sterile neuter castes in the social insects proved to be a particularly difficult issue for Darwin in the manuscript phase of his work and needed some account (chp. 7). The long-standing issue, raised to prominence by Buffon a century before, concerning the distinction between natural species defined by interfertility, and artificial species defined by morphological differences, also required a full chapter of analysis (chp. 8). To each of these lines of objection Darwin offered his contemporaries a plausible, if not a compelling, reply. Further details were worked by the insertion of numerous textual insertions over the five revisions of the Origin between 1860 and 1872, including the addition of a new chapter dealing with “miscellaneous” objections to the sixth edition of the Origin. Additional arguments were supplied in separate treatises, such as the two-volume Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868), a work which in some respects can be considered the Origin with footnotes and data added. In chapter ten of the Origin Darwin developed his position on the still-debated issue of whether the fossil record displayed a gradual progression of forms from simple to complex, or if it supported the claim for the existence of all major groups throughout the record. The thesis of geological progressionism had been denied by none other than Darwin's great geological mentor, Charles Lyell in the Principles of Geology (1830–33), although it had been strongly defended by such contemporaries as William Buckland, and in a complex branching form by Richard Owen (Bowler 1974; Desmond 1984). Darwin opted for a progressionist interpretation of the record.

For reasons related both to the condensed and summary form of public presentation, and also to the sweep of the theory, the primary argument of the Origin could not gain its force from the data presented by the book. The strength of the theory rested primarily upon what his Cambridge mentor, the Rev. William Whewell (1794–1866), had termed the “consilience of inductions” (Whewell 1840, xxxix). Only a year previous to the publication of the Origin, Whewell had again restated this principle, claiming that it was a sign of true scientific theories that they drew together under a few principles or laws disparate classes of facts. Furthermore, “the cases in which inductions from classes of facts altogether different have thus jumped together, belong only to the best established theories which the history of science contains.” (Whewell 1858, 77–96).

Although Darwin makes no direct citation to these discussions of Whewell in the Origin, the latter chapters of the Origin develop a similar argument from consilience, demonstrating the ability of Darwin's theory to draw together a wide variety of issues in taxonomy, comparative anatomy, paleontology, biogeography, and embryology under the simple principles worked out in the first four chapters (chps 11–13). This explanatory power also provided Darwin with a means of defeating certain objections, such as those drawn from the existence of organs of great complication and function. Dealing with the question of the vertebrate eye in chapter six, for example, Darwin offered a few speculations on how such a structure could have developed by the gradual selection upon the rudimentary eyes of invertebrates. But the primary solution offered was his appeal to the ability of his theory to draw together numerous lines of inquiry such that one will “admit that a structure even as perfect as the eye of an eagle might be formed by natural selection, although in this case he does not know any of the transitional grades.” (Darwin 1859, 1964, 188).

The theory rested its case on its claim to be able to unify numerous fields of inquiry and on its potential theoretical fertility. With the acceptance of his theory, “a grand untrodden field of inquiry will be opened” in biology and natural history. The long-standing issues of species origin, if not the ultimate origins of life, as well as the causes of their extinction, had been brought within the domain of naturalistic explanation. It is in this context that he makes the sole reference in the text to the “origin of man and his history” (ibid., 488).

2.5 The Popular Reception of Darwinism

The broad sweep of Darwin's claims, the brevity of the empirical evidence actually supplied in the text, and the implications of his theory for several more general philosophical and theological issues, immediately opened up a controversy over Darwinian evolution that has waxed and waned over the past 146 years. On the level of popular science, Darwin's theory fell into a complex social situation that took on different features in different national traditions. In the Anglophone world, the great popularity of the anonymous Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation of 1844, which had reached 11 editions and sold 23,350 copies by December of 1860 (Secord in Chambers 1844, 1994, xxvii), with several more editions to appear by the end of the century, certainly prepared the groundwork for the general notion of evolutionary origins of species by natural law. The Vestiges's grand schema of a teleological development of life from the earliest beginnings of the solar system to the emergence of humanity under the action of a great “law of development,” further popularized for Victorian readers by Alfred Lord Tennyson's epic In Memoriam (1850), provided a context in which some could read Darwin as supplying additional support to the belief in an optimistic historical development of life that promised ultimate historical redemption.

Consequently, the popular image of a great public outcry against Darwin has been shown by careful historical analyses to be generally mythical, or at least in need of careful discrimination by social group, national tradition, and religious affiliation (Ellegard 1959). Detailing the various national receptions of Darwin forms a minor scholarly industry in its own right, with recent work extending this to non-western nations (Numbers 1998; Pancaldi, 1991; Todes 1989; Bowler 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Corsi and Weindling 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Scudo and Acanfora 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Pusey 1983; Glick 1972; Hull 1973).

The publication of the Descent of Man in 1871 does, however, give evidence of marking a watershed in the popular reception of Darwin. Retaining his views on human evolution quietly in the background while the defense of his general theory had been conducted by advocates as diverse as Thomas Henry Huxley (1825–95) in England, Asa Gray (1810–88) in the United States, and Ernst Heinrich Haeckel (1834–1919) in Germany, Darwin's own views on human evolution remained unclear. The Descent, however, seemed to many of his readers, even those previously sympathetic to the Origin, to throw Darwin's weight behind materialist and anti-religious forces. Although the question of human evolution had already been dealt with in part by Thomas Huxley in the Man's Place in Nature of 1863 and by Charles Lyell in the same year in his Geological Evidences of the Antiquity of Man, by Alfred Russel Wallace in articles in 1864 and 1870, and by Ernst Haeckel in his Natürliche Schöpfungsgeschichte of 1868, these authors had either not ventured to deal with the full range of questions presented by the inclusion of human beings in the evolutionary process (Huxley), or they had emphasized the moral and mental discontinuity between humans and animals (Lyell, Wallace). Only Haeckel had drawn out a more general reductive conception of humanity from evolutionary theory and he had not carefully tied his speculations to the workings of Darwin's actual theory.

The predominant theme of the Descent was an elaboration upon the workings of the secondary process of sexual selection in the animal kingdom. Sexual selection—the selection of females by males or vice versa for breeding purposes—had played a minor role in the original argument of the Origin. Darwin now developed this argument in elaborate detail. A large portion of the first volume was devoted to the working of natural and sexual selection as an explanation of the origin of human beings by natural means. The Descent presented, as one commentator has put it, “a closer resemblance to Darwin's early naturalistic vision than anything else he ever published” (Durant 1985 in Kohn 1985a, 294). Darwin's treatment of the “human question” integrated his theory of natural selection with a naturalistic analysis of the origins of ethics, society, the origin of races, the origins of “mental powers,” the development of sexual differences, and even indirectly, the origin of religion. This gave the work a character unequalled in its scope by the prior applications of his theory to humanity. The publication of the Descent hardened the opposition of many religiously-based communities to evolutionary theory, although here again, distinctions must be made between different communities (Ellegard 1959, chp. 14). Such opposition was not simply due to its explicit denial of the literal scriptural account of the origins of humankind, an issue which played differently within different religious communions (Moore 1981). More fundamentally, this opposition was due to the denial of distinctions, other than those of degree, between human properties and those of animals, and to the evident denial of some kind of divine guidance to the processes leading to human evolution.

In the crucial domain of ethics, Darwin was neither a Utilitarian nor a Deontologist, as these terms have come to be used in contemporary ethical discourse, but instead reworked the moral sense tradition of the Scottish moralists Adam Smith, David Hume and James Macintosh (Richards 1999 in Maienschein and Ruse, 1999, Richards 2003 in Hodge and Radick, 2003). In Darwin's evolutionary schema, however, the moral sense was derived historically from animal instinct rather than constituting a property of an autonomous human domain, as it had functioned in moral sense theories previously. Furthermore, his account was seen by many to undermine the universality of the moral sense theory by making it the product of an evolutionary adaptation to circumstances. For many, Darwin's theory led to a pure relativization and naturalization of ethics (Farber 1994, chp. 5). It was, in the view of its philosophical critics, to reduce ethics to biology, and not even for some strong advocates of evolution, such as Thomas Huxley and Alfred Russel Wallace, was Darwin's account adequate (ibid, chp. 4). Much of subsequent moral philosophy, building upon the canonical acceptance of the “is-ought” distinction that was given its most influential expression by G. E. Moore in his Principia Ethica of 1905—itself an attack on Spencer's version of evolutionary ethics—emerged from the debate over evolutionary ethics that followed Darwin.

Outside Britain, the general reception of Darwin's theories was conditioned, if not determined, by the differing intellectual and social contexts into which his theory was inserted. In France, the prior debates over the theories of Lamarck and Geoffroy St. Hilaire of the 1830s that had been decided, at least officially within Parisian academic science, in favor of Cuvier formed a background that easily placed Darwin into the tradition of rejected science. The complex intellectual framework provided by the positive philosophy of Auguste Comte (1798–1857) also worked both for and against Darwin. On one hand, Comte's emphasis on the historical progress of science over superstition allowed Darwin to be summoned in support of a theory of the progress of science over religion, and the Origin was so utilized in the preface to the first French translation made by feminist Clemence Royer (Harvey 1987). On the other hand, the Comtean three stages view of history, with its claim of the historical transcendence of speculative and metaphysical periods of science by a final period of experimental science governed by determinate laws, placed Darwin for some within a superceded tradition of speculative nature philosophy, linked to “a Goethe, an Oken, a Carus, a Geoffroy Saint-Hilaire,” whose grand speculations were alien to the new scientific spirit of rigorous experimentalism (Bernard 1865, 1957, 91–92).

In the Germanies, Darwin's work entered a complex social, intellectual and political situation in the wake of the failed efforts to establish liberal democracy in 1848, and by 1870 it was involved in the so-called Kulturkampf that pitted Bismarck's government of the new Germany against Catholicism. The philosophical traditions of German Naturphilosophie, Romanticism, and the Idealism of Hegel and Fichte also formed a fertile ground into which Darwin's developmental view of nature and theory of the transformation of species was congenial (Corsi and Weindling 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Kelly 1981). If the association with the tradition of Naturphilosophie placed Darwin at odds with the some advocates of the rigorous experimental empiricism and critical scientific methodology developed by such prominent scientific intellectuals as Hermann von Helmholtz, the enthusiastic advocacy of Darwinism in Germany by inheritors of the Romantic tradition, such as Jena professor of zoology Ernst Haeckel, gave his theories wide currency in the polarized political and religious disputes of Bismarckian Germany. Through Haeckel's popular polemical writings, such as the Natural History of Creation (1868) and Anthropogeny (1874), Haeckel put forth the claims of materialist monism in the name of Darwin and used it as a stick with which to beat traditional religion. Much of the historic conflict between religious communities and evolutionary biology can be traced back to Haeckel's polemical writings which went through numerous editions and translations in the last decades of the nineteenth and the early decades of the twentieth century.

2.6 The Professional Reception of Darwinism

One cannot always distinguish between “popular” and “professional” receptions of Darwin, as the case of Ernst Haeckel vividly displays. Haeckel also developed Darwinism as a scientific research program through his development of the study of morphology and comparative embryology in the light of Darwin's general theory (Nyhart, 1995, Richards 1992, chp. 6). Nevertheless, it is generally possible to distinguish the receptions by those intimately familiar with the empirical evidence and the technical scientific issues under debate in the 1860s in geology, comparative anatomy, embryology and classification theory from the readings of a wider public. Darwin's reception among these scientific elites presents a complex picture that will be explored only selectively in the present entry. Many prominent members of Darwin's intellectual circle—Adam Sedgwick, William Whewell, Richard Owen, Thomas Huxley—had been highly critical of Chambers' Vestiges in the 1840s for its popular character and its scientific incompetence. Darwin himself feared a similar reception, and he recognized that his ability to convince the community of scientific specialists was a substantial challenge. With this group he was only partially successful.

Historical studies have revealed that only rarely did members of the scientific elites accept and develop Darwin's theories exactly as they were presented in his texts. Statistical studies on the reception by the scientific community in England in the first decade after the publication of the Origin have shown a complicated picture in which there was neither a wide-spread conversion of the scientific community to Darwin's views, nor was there a clear generational stratification between younger converts and older resisters, counter to Darwin's own predictions (Hull et al., 1978). These studies also reveal a distinct willingness within the scientific community to separate acceptance of the broader claims of species descent with modification from common ancestors from the explanation of this descent by the action of natural selection. If we utilize some of the categories of a Lakatosian “research program” analysis of scientific theories in their historical extension, distinguishing between a “hard core” of central assumptions,” a “protective belt” of auxiliary hypotheses that protect this central core from refutations, and a “positive heuristic” of applied research applications (Lakatos 1974 in Lakatos and Musgrave, 1974), it is difficult to claim that anything more than the belief in descent from common ancestry was maintained by the scientific community at the “hard core” level in the closing decades of the nineteenth century. The “eclipse” of natural selection theory, if not of the theory of transformism, in the period between 1870–1930 (Bowler 1983) meant that much of the historic impact of Darwin involved a revision of some of his basic principles.

Of central importance to this complex reception was the issue of normal individual variation and its causes. From the first public presentation of his theory, Darwin had relied on the novel claim that small individual variations—the kind of differences considered by an earlier tradition as merely “accidental”—formed the raw material upon which, by unlimited addition through the action of natural selection, major changes could be produced sufficient to explain the differences in all the various forms of life over time. The causes of this variation were, however, left unspecified, and variation was presented simply as governed by “unknown laws.” In keeping with his commitment to the gradualism of Lyellian geology, Darwin also rejected the role of major “sports” or discontinuous changes in this process.

As critics centered in on the claim that such micro-differences between individuals could be accumulated over time without natural limits, Darwin began a series of modifications and revisions of the theory. In the fourth edition of 1866, for example, Darwin inserted the claim that the continuous gradualism represented by the branching diagram, was misleading, and that variation does not necessarily go on continuously. “It is far more probable that each form remains for long periods unaltered, and then again undergoes modification.” (Darwin 1866, as in Darwin 6th ed., 1872, 1934, p. 89). This “punctuated equilibrium” model of change-stasis-change, to use a more recent language, presumably allowed variation to stabilize around a mean value from which, after a period of stabilization, additional change could then resume.

The difficulties in this solution, highlighted in a lengthy and telling critique in 1867 of Darwin's theory by the Scottish engineer Henry Fleeming Jenkin (1833–85), revealed some of the problems facing Darwin's theory of blending inheritance. Using an argument previously raised in the 1830s by Charles Lyell against Lamarck, Jenkin cited empirical evidence drawn from domestic breeding that suggested a distinct limitation on the degree of variation possible (Jenkin 1867 in Hull, 1973). Using a loosely mathematical argument, Jenkin argued that the effects of intercrossing would continuously swamp deviations in properties from the mean values and result in a tendency of a population to return to the normal values over time. Continuous additive deviation was presumed refuted.

Coupled with this argument, Jenkin argued from the physical calculations of the possible age of the earth developed by his mentor the Glasgow physicist William Thompson (Lord Kelvin) (1824–1907). Thompson's estimates had greatly reduced the time available for evolutionary history, previously based on Lyell's uniformitarian geology (Burchfield, 1975). Jenkin's multi-pronged argument gave Darwin considerable difficulties and served to set the stage for more detailed empirical inquiries into variation.

Darwin's “provisional hypothesis” of pangenesis, presented the year after the appearance of the Jenkin review in his Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868), had been formulated independently of the Jenkin review (Olby 1962). This offered a causal theory of variation and inheritance through a return to a theory resembling Buffon's theory of the organic molecules of the previous century. Invisible material “gemmules” were presumed to exist within the cells, and on theory were subject to external alteration by environment and circumstance. These were then shed continually into the blood stream (the “transport” hypothesis) and assembled by “mutual affinity into buds or into the sexual elements” (Darwin 1868, 1875, vol. 2, p. 370). In this form they were then transmitted —the details were not explicated—by sexual generation to the next generation to form the new organism out of “units of which each individual is composed” (ibid.). In Darwin's view, this hypothesis united together numerous issues into a coherent and causal theory of inheritance and explained the basis of variation. It also explained how use-disuse inheritance, which Darwin never abandoned, could work.

This theory seems to be behind an important distinction he inserted into the fifth edition of the Origin of 1869 in a textual reply to Fleeming Jenkin. In this textual revision, Darwin distinguished “certain rather strongly marked variations, which no one would rank as mere individual differences” from ordinary variation (Darwin 1869, as in Darwin 6th ed., 1872, 1934, p. 71). It is now on this tendency to “strongly marked” variation that Darwin placed primary evolutionary significance, since this was more likely to be transmitted to the offspring. In this form it presumably could be maintained in a population against the tendency to swamping by intercrossing.

Darwin's struggles over this issue defined a set of problems that British life scientists in particular were to deal with into the 1930s. They also placed Darwinism in a defensive posture that forced his supporters, at least in those concerned with the relation of inheritance and evolution, into major revisions in the Darwinian research program (Gayon 1998; Vorzimmer 1970).

3. Post-Darwinian Evolution

Evolutionary discussions after the publication of the six editions of the Origin and the later works took many shapes, and raised several different lines of inquiry including neo-Lamarckianism and orthogenetic theory (Bowler 1983). In what follows, focus will be given to one aspect of these debates taking place over the issue of variation and the development of biostatistical methods.

3.1 The Biometrical Debates

Failures of experiments by Darwin's cousin Francis Galton (1822–1911) to find experimental proof for the pangenesis theory by experiments on rabbits (1871) led Galton into a long inquiry into the statistics of inheritance. This resulted in the development of some of the main principles and techniques of modern statistical analysis as Galton worked out the first mathematical theory of inheritance. Initially these developments reinforced the theory of discontinuous evolution in a form that was not easily dislodged. Galton's law, first presented in his Natural Inheritance of 1889, and again in modified form in 1897, expressed inheritance through a mathematical theory of regression of a population to a mean value over time. Under the assumption that inheritance was quantitative in character and that each parent contributed equally to the offspring, Galton's “statistical law of heredity that appears to be universally applicable to bisexual descent” as he was to claim in its final formulation (Galton 1897, 401) took the form of the equation M+D= 1/2(M+D1) +1/4 (M+D2) +1/8 (M+D 3), or generally by the series M+(1/2D1+1/4D2+1/8D3…) where D is the average deviation from the measured mean, M, and the coefficients 1/2 (parental), 1/4 (grandparental), 1/8 (great grandparental) etc. denote respective contributions from prior generations. With this equation, phenomena of both alternating and strongly persistent patterns of inheritance could presumably be explained by calculating the different strengths of ancestry (Galton 1897).

Independently reinforcing Galton's mathematical defense of discontinuous inheritance were the empirical and theoretical studies of Cambridge zoologist William Bateson (1861–1926). In a major 1894 study (Materials for the Study of Variation) on the broad question of variation in a wide body of natural populations, Bateson examined the empirical evidence for continuous and discontinuous variation in natural populations, and concluded that there were fundamental discontinuities separating natural species. Darwin's reliance on small and continuous variation as the main ingredient upon which natural selection worked was to be rejected: “the Discontinuity of which Species is an expression has its origin not in the environment, nor in any phenomenon of Adaptation, but in the intrinsic nature of organisms themselves, manifested in the original Discontinuity of Variation” (Bateson 1894, 1992, 567). Bateson offered no causal theory to explain such discontinuous variation, but the detailed evidence supplied in his work served to define the research problems with a new rigor.

Independently, a causal theory of discontinuous variation was being worked out at approximately the same time by the University of Amsterdam botanist Hugo De Vries (1848–1935). Embracing in a revised form Darwin's theory of inheritance based on material gemmules, which he renamed “pangens,” but confining these to the interior of the cell (denial of the “transport” hypothesis), De Vries developed a causal theory of inheritance in which each unit character was associated with a single material pangen (De Vries 1889, 1910, 11). Viewed from the perspective of this theory, De Vries concluded that the organism was simply a mosaic of characters, each determined by unit pangens. Experiments to explore the consequences of his theory led De Vries in the 1890s to develop a theory of inheritance that eventually led him to the formulation of empirical laws of discontinuous inheritance. He then simply reformulated these after his important “rediscovery” in 1900 of Mendel's paper of 1866 on plant hybridization (Darden 1976).

Prior to the introduction of Mendel's long-neglected paper of 1866 into this discussion in 1900, other developments in British life science with respect to the variation question were leading in a different direction. Galton's concern to develop a mathematical theory for the analysis of variation and the transmission of inheritance was inspirational on the work of Bateson's one-time Cambridge mentor, Walter Frank Raphael Weldon (1860–1906), professor of zoology at University College London (1891–99) and later professor at Oxford University (1900–06). Inspired by Galton's mathematical approach to the analysis of populations put forth in Natural Inheritance (1889), Weldon was dedicated to extending these methods to natural populations in the wild. Initially Weldon was in agreement with Galton's conclusion that the effects of natural selection were generally insignificant (Weldon 1890). Following upon the deep friendship and collaboration that developed after 1890 between Weldon and fellow University College professor (applied engineering mathematics) Karl Pearson (1857–1936), however, this situation changed. Pearson had independently been drawn to Galton's statistical methods by his study of Natural Inheritance. Through his friendship with Weldon, the mathematical analysis of variation in relation to evolution took on a new dimension and led to a major theoretical clash with the discontinuist theory of Bateson and DeVries.

Pearson's deep philosophical commitment to a neo-positivist empiricist epistemology, inspired in many respects by Viennese physicist and philosopher Ernst Mach (1838–1916), also added an epistemological level to this disagreement. Pearson rejected, on epistemic grounds, the search for hidden causes and theoretical entities in science generally, and this was applied to the explanation of inheritance by non-observable entities (Gayon, 2005; Sloan 2000; Pearson 1892).

Applying these epistemological premises to the issue of variation and its causes, Pearson and Weldon together turned to an empirical study on natural variation as a means to explore the orthodox Darwinian theory of natural selection and assumed evolutionary change could take place through selection upon the slight individual variations between individuals. Weldon's extensive comparative field work on variation in populations of the common shore crab Carcinus moenas in Plymouth England and Naples Italy resulted in a series of landmark studies between 1893 and 1898, utilizing Pearson's statistical methods to develop a new way of analyzing the inheritance of variation that made no a priori commitment to the causal agency of germ plasms, “stirps,” or pangens (Weldon 1893; 1895). This phenomenalist mathematical analysis seemed to reveal the gradual diversion of populations under specifiable selective pressures, as expected by traditional Darwinian gradualism. In a dense mathematical discussion of Galton's law of ancestral inheritance, Pearson then reformulated Galton's law in the following form:

K0 = 1/2 (σo / σ1K1) + 1/4 (σo / σ2K2) + 1/8 (σo / σ3K3) + 1/16 (σo / σ4K4)+ …

where K0 is the predicted deviation of offspring from the mean of the offspring generation, K1 is the deviation of the offspring's mid-parent, K2 that of its mid-grandparent, etc., and σis simply the empirically measured standard deviation of variation around the mean of the population (Pearson 1898). Since the parameters are purely empirical, and Pearson made no commitment to an underlying causal ontology, there is no implied limitation on long-term evolutionary change through selection acting directly upon on slight individual morphological variations.

The bitter disputes that broke out between the camp of Weldon, Pearson and their disciples, and that of the discontinuists, armed after 1900 with Mendel's experimental results as well as the data collected by Bateson and De Vries from their own experiments, forms one of the minor dramas of the history of recent life science (Gayon, 1998; Magnello 1998; Mackenzie 1981; Norton, 1973; Provine 1971; Froggatt and Nevin, 1971). On one hand the sophisticated techniques of mathematical and statistical analysis of evolutionary change developed by Pearson and his students that filled the pages of the new journal Biometrika were unmatched by the simple algebra and statistics of their opponents. Indeed, the opposition was typically unable to deal with these complex mathematical arguments. But the new experimental science, named “genetics” by Bateson, that was to be based on the application of Mendelian laws to the experimental breeding of plant and animal populations under laboratory conditions, won the international allegiance of a wider body of adherents. The publication in 1901–03 of the Mutation Theory (English edition 1909–10) by De Vries provided an additional body of experimental evidence in support of the claim that species originate suddenly by a process of “mutation,” presumably through some transformation in the genetic material. In a major revision of Darwin's claims, De Vries claimed that species must be considered to be fixed entities, and that new species are “derived from other species by means of sudden small changes” (DeVries 1907, 9).

3.2 Origins of the Synthetic Theory

Following the re-introduction of Mendel's famous 1866 paper into the discussions in 1900, Weldon and Pearson responded to Mendelism and to the apparent support it gave to discontinuous evolution, by arguments that proceeded to show that Mendelian inheritance was only a special case of inheritance governed by Pearson's modifications of Galton's law (Sloan 2000). The complicated efforts by Pearson to demonstrate this point mathematically, however, fell on deaf ears (Pearson 1904), and by 1906 and the untimely death of Weldon, Batesonian genetics had achieved a dominant position in the life sciences internationally, even gaining converts from the biometrical school.

The triumph of Bateson and the new genetic science reinforced saltationist evolution. Only by De Vriesian “mutation” was genuine novelty introduced into a natural population. All other novelty was simply combinatorial, meaning that with the number of determining genes large enough, there were presumably sufficient combinatorial classes possible to account for the shape of the normal curve of variation around the mean values for any given trait. Natural selection could only work on this available variation, and produce only micro-changes in populations, sufficient to account for the data offered in favor of gradualism by Weldon and Pearson, but incapable of creating genuine new species. Support for this conclusion from the mathematical side was also gained from G. H. Hardy's demonstration in 1908 that in a stable population undergoing hypothetically random mating, the proportion of dominant and recessive traits in a population would remain stable, with no tendency for one or the other to predominate (Hardy 1908).

Although detailed quantitative studies on the degree of general endorsement of saltationist evolutionary theory in the 1910–1930 period are still needed, it seems evident from personal recollections, standard textbooks, and expositions of evolutionary theory in the period between 1900–1930 that the “eclipse” of Darwin's natural selection theory was general, with some kind of discontinuous explanation the preferred account of evolution, both among experimental biologists, and by a wider group of paleontologists and morphologists (Bowler 1983).

Although an effort to find some reconciliation between the discontinuist claims of Mendelism and De Vriesian mutation theory and the biometrical claims of continuism were attempted as early as 1902 by Pearson's former student and applied statistician George Undy Yule (1871–1951), Ronald Alymer Fisher's (1890–1962) work provided the fundamental impetus for a theoretical shift in the conceptualization of evolutionary theory. Equal to Pearson in his grasp of mathematics and statistics, but convinced of the truth of the Mendelian theory, Fisher began a revision of the framework of evolutionary biology with a series of seminal papers that commenced in 1918 and culminated in his magisterial The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection of 1930.

Fisher's analysis was important for two fundamental reasons. First, he was able to give a satisfactory mathematical analysis of Mendelian inheritance in a form that also reconciled it with the continuist claims that had animated the program of the biometrical Darwinism of Pearson and the biometrical school. Second, he made indirectly some fundamental shifts in the underlying ontology of evolutionary theory in a form that has affected philosophical as well as scientific discussions since his work.

Dissatisfied with Pearson's discounting of Mendelianism as only a special case of blending inheritance, and unlike Pearson, willing to accept an underlying causal relation of variation to material “Mendelian factors,” Fisher subjected Pearson's claims to a careful statistical treatment. In his landmark paper of 1918, Fisher proceeded to show that the empirical coefficients in the equations governing dominance were in fact better explained through the assumption of the operations of discrete Mendelian factors than by the assumptions of quantitative blending inheritance (Fisher 1918).

In his subsequent analyses of these issues, Fisher also imported into these discussions several principles drawn from contemporary physics to modify the underlying ontology of evolutionary theory. As scholars have shown, Fisher's theoretical insights in this period were deeply indebted to the principles of statistical mechanics as formulated by Ludwig Boltzmann and others (Depew and Weber, 1995, chp. 10). These connections were developed explicitly in his paper of 1922 in which he modeled his analysis of the operation of “genes”—by 1922 Fisher had adopted William Johanssen's terminology for Mendelian “factors”—in populations on the analogy of the action of atoms in a gas, whose law-like regularity at the phenomenal level could be explained at the atomic level by the mass-action effects of randomly-moving atoms. Through this analogy between atoms in gases and genes in populations, empirical organisms in nature were replaced for theoretical purposes by an idealized mathematical treatment of selection upon genes in ideal mathematical populations. Natural selection no longer was conceptualized as an agency acting on variations in observable morphological characters, as assumed in the prior tradition and maintained in the bio-mathematical analyses of Weldon and Pearson. It was instead conceptualized as a change in the mathematical proportions of an invisible theoretical entity—the gene—in ideal populations (Fisher 1922).

Drawing on physics more than biology for this concept, Fisher also gave the concept of “chance” and indeterminism a new meaning in evolutionary theory. Prior Darwinian theory, with the exception of the formulations by Pearson, whose embrace of a “statistical world view” opened up the issue of a-causality generally, held to traditional scientific determinism. The “causes” of variation might be unknown, but they were not themselves stochastic. Hence mutation theorists could even argue, in agreement with versions of neo-Lamarckianism still popular at the time, that mutation was caused by the processes of adaptation. Mutation theory could also be used to defend orthogenesis—the thesis favored by many paleontologists of the early twentieth century that assumed mutations could be canalized to create an inertial drive of a population to undergo morphological adaptations independent of the needs or adaptive fitness of the organism (Bowler 1983, chp. 7).

For Fisher, however, “chance” implied the causal indeterminism of statistical mechanics. To this he added after 1927 the indeterminist interpretation of quantum mechanics of Bohr and the Copenhagen school (Fisher 1934, 197). This causal indeterminancy implied that a deterministic relation between mutation and evolutionary change could be discounted. Most mutations—a concept he still accepted— were presumed invisible phenotypically, and most were likely harmful or even lethal in their action. At the same time, the random mutation of genes formed the primary source of novelty introduced into the population system. Fisher's task was then to show how this accidental mutation could be acted upon by natural selection to produce directional evolutionary populational changes.

In his detailed development of this theory in the 1930 text, Fisher supplied a formal derivation of his theoretical principles, modeled upon principles of thermodynamics and statistical mechanics, which governed this new “genetical” theory of natural selection. Foremost was his “Fundamental Theorem of Natural Selection”:

The rate of increase in fitness of any organism at any time is equal to its additive genetic variance in fitness at that time. (Depew and Weber 1995, 251)

This principle, claiming to bear “resemblances to the Second Law of Thermodynamics,” gave a quantitative measure of the “fitness” of a population.

Fisher's theoretical idealizations of the principles of natural selection applied to population genetics on one level solved the problem of the relation of the discontinuous character of genetics to the continuist and gradualist claims of orthodox Darwinism. This opened up the route to the “New Synthesis” of the 1930s, associated with the names of Fisher, Sewall Wright (1889–1988), J. B. S. Haldane (1892–1964), and Julian Huxley (1887–1975) (Mayr and Provine 1998).

On a philosophical level, the shift toward population genetics and the assumptions of randomized mutations initiated by Fisher had other implications. For Fisher personally, the acceptance of a non-deterministic interpretation of the origins of evolutionary novelty reinforced his own philosophical commitments to free will (Fisher 1934). As his theory of natural selection has played out in the recent history of Darwinian evolution, however, these assumptions of underlying stochastic process has played a considerable role in the argument that evolutionary theory implies a non-teleological philosophy of nature that places “blind chance,” rather than design, at the basis of perceived natural order. Those wishing to extend evolutionary science into a natural philosophy have used this argument to attack theistic interpretations of the world (Dawkins 1986, 1996).

For others, the Fisherian substitution of a conception of organisms as coordinated wholes—the long tradition from Aristotle through Kant, Cuvier and modern morphologists—by the notion of organisms as “bags of atomic genes,” has been at issue in contemporary disputes. In the eyes of philosophical critics of Fisherian-inspired interpretations of evolution, the substitution of organisms by genes in populations implies a false reductionism that incorrectly abolishes conceptions of organization, form, and purposeful behavior from evolutionary biology (Grene 1958, Grene and Depew 2004, chps. 7, 9).

Fisher's appeal to contemporary physical theory to supply the ontology of his genetical theory of natural selection was not the only way in which the new physics played into the assumptions of evolutionary biology in the 1930s. The work on quantum radiation and mutation, initiated by the important studies of H. J. Muller and developed in detail in the famous “Three-Man Paper” of Timoféeff-Ressovsky, K. G. Zimmer, and Max Delbrück (1935) reinforced the notion that mutation was a discontinuist phenomenon, likely caused by the hitting of individual structural genes by discrete packets of energy. Adopting this interpretation of quantum mechanics rather than emphasizing the indeterminism championed by Bohr and embraced by Fisher, a surprising defense of traditional De Vriesian mutation theory in the name of the new quantum mechanics was offered by none other than quantum physicist Erwin Schrödinger (1887–1961) in his influential popular lectures, What is Life? (Schrödinger 1944, 1992). Although by the date of the publication of Schrödinger's lectures the biological community had generally shifted its allegiance away from traditional mutation theory to the continuist conclusions of the new population genetics, the issues presented by biophysics and molecular biology have served to influence the development of recent evolutionary theory in its exploration of alternative models of evolution to those of the new synthesis (Depew and Weber 1995, chps. 16–17). Aspects of these developments are covered in other articles and in recent attempts to make a general synthesis of evolutionary theory in both its historical and scientific complexity (Gould 2002).

4. Summary and Conclusion

The long sweep of historical development summarized in the present entry indicates the complexity of evolutionary theory as a historical phenomenon, and the many issues that have surrounded its development up to its contemporary state. This survey has emphasized that the historical and philosophical story of evolutionary biology is not to be seen as a simple linear development leading to a present consensus. If space permitted, even more attention would be given to the specifying factors created by different intellectual and national traditions and social structures in shaping contemporary evolutionary theory into a complex set of theories that are themselves undergoing evolutionary change. The more general philosophical issues associated with evolutionary theory—teleology, ethics, the relation of evolutionary naturalism to the claims of religious traditions, the relation of humans to the rest of the animate kingdom—receive no single solution from evolutionary science. If, as has been argued, contemporary neo-selectionist evolutionary theory has a remarkable continuity with select features of the works of Darwin, the complexity of the Darwinian heritage defies a simple interpretation of the significance of his theories.

The professionalization of the philosophy of biology has, to be sure, considerably narrowed the concerns of many working philosophers to a limited set of questions generally discussed within the confines of the accepted neo-selectionist theory, including the analysis of such questions as units of selection, group vs individual selection, sociobiological theory, the selective value of altruism, and the mathematical analysis of natural selection and attendant concepts such as that of fitness. At the same time, efforts to deal with evolutionary theory from a perspective of a longer tradition of philosophy continue (Grene and Depew 2004).


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