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Supplement to Analysis

Citation Information

- 1. Introduction to Supplement
- 2. Descartes and Analytic Geometry
- 3. British Empiricism
- 4. Leibniz
- 5. Kant

This supplement sketches how a reductive form of analysis emerged in Descartes's development of analytic geometry, and elaborates on the way in which decompositional conceptions of analysis came to the fore in the early modern period, as outlined in §4 of the main document.

In a famous passage in his replies to Mersenne's objections to the
*Meditations*, in discussing the distinction between analysis
and synthesis, Descartes remarks that “it is analysis which is
the best and truest method of instruction, and it was this method
alone which I employed in my *Meditations*” (*PW*,
II, 111). According to Descartes, it is analysis rather than
synthesis that is of the greater value, since it shows “how the
thing in question was discovered”, and he accuses the ancient
geometers of keeping the techniques of analysis to themselves
“like a sacred mystery” (*ibid*.; cf. *PW*,
I, 17). Euclid's *Elements* is indeed set out in
‘synthetic’ form, but it is unfair to suggest that someone
who worked through the text would not gain practice in analysis,
although admittedly there are no rules of analysis explicitly
articulated.

However, it was Descartes's own development of ‘analytic’
geometry—as opposed to what, correspondingly, then became known
as the ‘synthetic’ geometry of Euclid—that made him
aware of the importance of analysis, and which opened up a whole new
dimension to analytic methodology. Significantly, Descartes's
*Geometry* was first published together with the
*Discourse* and advertised as an essay in the method laid out
in the *Discourse*. The *Geometry* opens boldly:
“Any problem in geometry can easily be reduced to such terms
that a knowledge of the lengths of certain straight lines is
sufficient for its construction.” (*G*, 2.) Descartes
goes on to show how the arithmetical operations of addition,
subtraction, multiplication, division and the extraction of roots can
be represented geometrically. For example, multiplication of two
lines *BD* and *BC* can be carried out by joining them
as in the diagram below by *AC*, with *AB* taken as the
unit length. If *DE* is then drawn parallel to *AC*,
*BE* is the required result. (Since the ratio of
* BD* to BE is the same as the ratio of

Problems can indeed then be broken down into simpler problems
involving the construction of individual straight lines, encouraging
the decompositional conception of analysis. But what is of greatest
importance in Descartes's *Geometry* is the use made of
algebra. Although the invention of algebra too can be traced back to
the ancient Greeks, most notably, Diophantus, who had introduced
numerical variables (‘*x*’,
‘*x*²’, etc.), it was only in the 16th century
that algebra finally established itself. Vieta, in a work of 1591,
added schematic letters to numerical variables, so that quadratic
equations, for example, could then be represented (in the form
‘*ax*² + *bx* + *c* = 0’),
yielding results of greater generality. Algebra was specifically
called an ‘art of analysis’, and it was in the work of
Descartes (as well as Fermat) that its enormous potential was
realised. It did indeed prove a powerful tool of analysis, enabling
complex geometrical figures to be represented algebraically, allowing
the resources of algebra and arithmetic to be employed in solving the
transformed geometrical problems.

The philosophical significance was no less momentous. For in
reducing geometrical problems to arithmetical and algebraic problems,
the need to appeal to geometrical ‘intuition’ was
removed. Indeed, as Descartes himself makes clear in ‘Rule
Sixteen’, representing everything algebraically—abstracting
from specific numerical magnitudes as well as from geometrical
figures—allows us to appreciate just what is essential
(*PW*, I, 66-9.) The aim is not just to solve a problem, or to
come out with the right answer, but to gain an insight into
*how* the problem is solved, or *why* it is the right
answer. What algebraic representation reveals is the structure of the
solution in its appropriate generality. (Cf. Gaukroger 1989, ch. 3.)
Of course, ‘intuition’ is still required, according to
Descartes, to attain the ‘clear and distinct’ ideas of the
fundamental truths and relations that lie at the base of what we are
doing, but this was not seen as something that we could just appeal
to without rigorous training in the whole Cartesian method.

The further application of algebraic techniques, in the context of the development of function theory, was to lead to the creation by Leibniz and Newton of the differential and integral calculus—which, in mathematics, came to be called ‘analysis’. In turn, it was the project of rigorizing the calculus in the 19th century that played a key role in the work of Frege and Russell, in which function theory was extended to logic itself and ‘analytic’ philosophy was founded (see §6 of the main document).

The decompositional conception of analysis, as applied to ideas or
concepts, was particularly characteristic of British empiricism. As
Locke put it, “all our complex Ideas are ultimately resolvable
into simple Ideas, of which they are compounded, and originally made
up, though perhaps their immediate Ingredients, as I may so say, are
also complex Ideas” (*Essay*, II, xxii, 9). The aim was
then to provide an account of these ideas, explaining how they arise,
showing what simpler ideas make up our complex ideas (e.g., of
substance) and distinguishing the various mental operations performed
on them in generating what knowledge and beliefs we have. Locke only
uses the term ‘Analysis’, however, once in the entire
*Essay* (shortly after the remark just quoted). Perhaps he was
conscious of its meaning in ancient Greek geometry, making him
hesitant to use it more widely, but it is still significant that when
he does, he does so in precisely the sense of
‘decomposition’. Locke tends to talk, though, of
‘combining’ or ‘composing’ rather than
‘synthesizing’ complex ideas from simpler ideas, and of
‘separating’ or ‘resolving’ rather than
‘analyzing’ them into simpler ideas. But in the period
following Locke, ‘analysis’ came to be used more and more
for the process of ‘resolving’ complexes into their
constituents.

Leibniz occupies a pivotal point in the history of conceptions of
analysis. Well versed in both classical and modern thought, at the
forefront of both mathematics and philosophy, he provided a grand
synthesis of existing conceptions of analysis and at the same time
paved the way for the dominance of the decompositional
conception. The key to all of this is what can be called his
*containment principle*. In a letter to Arnauld, he writes:
“in every affirmative true proposition, necessary or contingent,
universal or singular, the notion of the predicate is contained in
some way in that of the subject, *praedicatum inest
subjecto*. Or else I do not know what truth is.”
(*PW*, 62.) If this containment of the predicate in the
subject could then be made explicit, according to Leibniz, a proof of
the proposition could thereby be achieved. Proof thus proceeds by
*analyzing* the subject, the aim being to reduce the
proposition to what Leibniz calls an ‘identity’—by
successive applications of the rule of ‘substitution of
equivalents’, utilizing an appropriate definition. A proposition
expresses an identity, in Leibniz's terminology, if the predicate is
explicitly either identical with or included in the subject. The
following proof of ‘4 = 2 + 2’ illustrates the procedure
(cf. Leibniz *NE*, IV, vii, 10):

(a) 4 = 2 + 2 (b) 3 + 1 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘4 = 3 + 1’) (c) (2 + 1) + 1 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘3 = 2 + 1’) (d) 2 + (1 + 1) = 2 + 2 (by associativity) (e) 2 + 2 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘2 = 1 + 1’)

The final line of the proof is an ‘identity’ in
Leibniz's sense, and the important point about an identity is
that it is ‘self-evident’ or ‘known through
itself’, i.e., can be simply ‘seen’ to be true
(cf. Leibniz *PW*, 15; *LP*, 62). It would be tempting
to talk here of identities being ‘intuited’ as true, but
Leibniz tends to use the word ‘intuition’ for the immediate
grasp of the *content* of a concept (cf. *MKTI*, 23-7),
whereas the point about knowing the truth of identities is that we can
do so without grasping the content of any of the terms. To the extent
that we can still judge that such a proposition is true, our knowledge
is what Leibniz calls ‘blind’ or ‘symbolic’ rather
than ‘intuitive’ (*ibid*., 25).

Indeed, it was precisely because proofs could be carried out without
appeal to intuition that Leibniz was so attracted to the symbolic
method. As he remarked in the *New Essays*, the great value of
algebra, or the generalized algebra that he called the ‘art of
symbols’, lay in the way it ‘unburdens the
imagination’ (*NE*, 488). If proofs could be generated
purely mechanically, then they were freed from the vagaries of our
own mental processes (cf. *NE*, 75, 412). For Leibniz, the
status of a proposition—its truth or falsity, necessity or
contingency—was dependent not on its mode of apprehension (as it
was for Descartes and Locke), which could vary from person to person,
but on its method of proof, which was an objectively determinable
matter.

Leibniz's conception of analysis can thus be seen as combining
aspects of Plato's method of division, in the centrality accorded to
the definition of concepts, of ancient Greek geometry and
Aristotelian logic, in the emphasis placed on proof and working back
to first principles, and of Cartesian geometry and the new algebra,
in the value attributed to symbolic formulations. Furthermore, we can
see how, on Leibniz's view, analysis and synthesis are strictly
complementary. For since we are concerned only with identities, all
steps are reversible. As long as the right notation and appropriate
definitions and principles are provided, one can move with equal
facility in either an ‘analytic’ or a ‘synthetic’
direction, i.e., in the example above, either from (a) to (e) or from
(e) to (a). If a *characteristica universalis* or ideal
logical language could thus be created, we would have a system that
could function not only as an international language and scientific
notation but also as a *calculus ratiocinator* that provided
both a logic of proof and a logic of discovery. Leibniz's vision may
have been absurdly ambitious, but the ideal was to influence many
subsequent philosophers, most notably, Frege and Russell.

The decompositional conception of analysis, as applied to concepts,
reached its high-point in the work of Kant, although it has continued
to have an influence ever since, most notably, in Russell's and
Moore's early philosophies (see
§3 and
§4
of the supplementary document on Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic
Philosophy). As his pre-critical writings show, Kant simply takes
over the Leibnizian conception of analysis, and even though, in his
critical period, he comes to reject the Leibnizian view that all
truths are, in Leibniz's sense, ‘analytic’, he retains the
underlying conception of analysis. He simply recognizes a further
class of ‘synthetic’ truths, and within this, a subclass of
‘synthetic *a priori*’ truths, which it is the main
task of the *Critique of Pure Reason* to elucidate.

As the ‘Introduction’ to the *Critique* shows
(A6-7/B10-11), the decompositional conception of analysis lies at the
base of Kant's distinction between analytic and synthetic
judgements. We can formulate Kant's ‘official’ criterion
for analyticity as follows:

(ANO) A true judgement of the form ‘AisB’ isanalyticif and only if the predicateBis contained in the subjectA.

The problem with this criterion, though, or at least, with the way
that Kant glosses it, is obvious. For who is the judge of whether a
predicate is or is not ‘contained’—however
‘covertly’—in the subject? According to Leibniz, for
example, all truths, even contingent ones, are ‘analytic’:
it is just that, in the case of a contingent truth, only God can know
what is ‘covertly contained’ in the subject, i.e., know its
analysis. Kant's talk of the connection between subject and predicate
in analytic judgements being ‘thought through identity’,
however, suggests a more objective criterion—a logical rather
than phenomenological one. This is made more explicit later on in the
*Critique*, when Kant specifies the principle of contradiction
as ‘the highest principle of all analytic judgements’
(A150-1/B189-91). The alternative criterion can be formulated
thus:

(ANL) A true judgement of the form ‘AisB’ isanalyticif and only if its negation ‘Ais notB’ is self-contradictory.

However, in anything other than trivial cases (such as Leibnizian
‘identities’), it will still require ‘analysis’
to show that ‘*A* is not *B*’ is
self-contradictory, and for any given step of ‘analysis’,
it seems that we would still have to rely on what is
‘thought’ in the relevant concept. So it is not clear that
(ANL) is an improvement within Kant's
system.

Whatever criterion we might offer to capture Kant's notion of
analyticity, the fundamental point of contrast between
‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ judgements, rooted in
the decompositional conception of analysis, lies in the former merely
‘clarifying’ and the latter ‘extending’ our
knowledge. It was for this reason that Kant regarded mathematical
propositions as synthetic, since he was
convinced—rightly—that mathematics advances our
knowledge. This is made clear in chapter 1 of the
‘Transcendental Doctrine of Method’ (*CPR*,
A716-7/B744-5), where Kant argues that no amount of
‘analysis’ of the concept of a triangle will enable a
philosopher to show that the sum of the angles of a triangle equals
two right angles. It takes a geometer to demonstrate this, by
actually constructing the triangle and drawing appropriate auxiliary
lines (as Euclid does in I, 32 of the *Elements*). Kant writes
that “To *construct* a concept means to exhibit *a
priori* the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741); and
such ‘intuition’ is also needed in constructing the
auxiliary lines. According to Kant, then, the whole process is one of
*synthesis*. But the two activities mentioned here are both
part of what the ancient geometers called *analysis* (see
§2
of the supplementary document on Ancient Conceptions of
Analysis). What is remarkable about Kant's conception is the way
that it has inverted the original conception of analysis in ancient
Greek geometry—or at least collapsed together into
‘synthesis’ what had previously been
distinguished. ‘Analysis’ is left with such a small role to
play that it is not surprising that it is condemned as useless.

Michael Beaney m.a.beaney@open.ac.uk |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy