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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Analysis
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Definitions and Descriptions of Analysis

This supplement collects together various definitions and descriptions of analysis that have been offered in the history of philosophy, to indicate the range of different conceptions. (Included also are some remarks on related topics such as analyticity, definition, and methodology more generally.) Where full references are not provided below, they can be found in the Annotated Bibliography on Analysis, in the section mentioned in curly brackets after the relevant definition or description.

1. Definitions of Analysis

Baldwin, Thomas, entry under ‘Analytical Philosophy’ in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 1998: “Philosophical analysis is a method of inquiry in which one seeks to assess complex systems of thought by ‘analysing’ them into simpler elements whose relationships are thereby brought into focus.” {§1.1}

Blackburn, Simon, Oxford Dictionary of Philosophy, 1996: “The process of breaking a concept down into more simple parts, so that its logical structure is displayed.” {§1.1}

Hügli, A. and Lübcke, P., (ed.), Philosophielexikon, 1997: “Auflösung, Zerlegung in Bestandteile, im Gegensatz zu Synthese.” {§1.1}

Sykes, J.B., (ed.), Concise Oxford Dictionary, 1976: “1. Resolution into simpler elements by analysing (opp. synthesis); statement of result of this; … 2. (Math.) Use of algebra and calculus in problem-solving.” {§1.1}

Annotated Bibliography, §1.1

2. Descriptions of Analysis

Alexander of Aphrodisias, commenting on the title of Aristotle's Analytics: “And he [Aristotle] called them Analytics because the resolution of every compound into those things out of which the synthesis [is made] is called analysis. For analysis is the converse of synthesis. Synthesis is the road from the principles to those things that derive from the principles, and analysis is the return from the end to the principles. For geometers are said to analyze when, beginning from the conclusion they go up to the principles and the problem, following the order of those things which were assumed for the demonstration of the conclusion {1}. But he also uses analysis who reduces composite bodies into simple bodies {2}, and he analyzes who divides the word into the parts of the word {3}; also he who divides the parts of the word into the syllables {4}; and he who divides these into their components {5}. And they are severally said to analyse who reduce compound syllogisms into simple ones {6}, and simple ones into the premisses out of which they get their being {7}. And further, resolving imperfect syllogisms into perfect ones is called analyzing {8}. And they call analysis the reducing of the given syllogism into the proper schemata {9}. And it is especially in this meaning of analysis that these are entitled Analytics, for he describes for us a method at the end of the first book with which we shall be able to do this. (Tr. in Gilbert 1960, 32; the square brackets are in the original translation, the curly brackets have been added here to highlight the nine senses that Alexander distinguishes.) {§2.4, §3.2}

Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre, LAT, 233: “The art of arranging a series of thoughts properly, either for discovering the truth when we do not know it, or for proving to others what we already know, can generally be called method. Hence there are two kinds of method, one for discovering the truth, which is known as analysis, or the method of resolution, and which can also be called the method of discovery. The other is for making the truth understood by others once it is found. This is known as synthesis, or the method of composition, and can also be called the method of instruction.” (§4.1)

Bentham, Jeremy, EL, 246: “By the word paraphrasis may be designated that sort of exposition which may be afforded by transmuting into a proposition, having for its subject some real entity, a proposition which has not for its subject any other than a fictitious entity.” {§5.4}

Carnap, Rudolf, 1936, 143: “The logical analysis of a particular expression consists in the setting-up of a linguistic system and the placing of that expression in this system.” {§6.7}

-----, 1947, 8-9: “The task of making more exact a vague or not quite exact concept used in everyday life or in an earlier stage of scientific or logical development, or rather of replacing it by a newly constructed, more exact concept, belongs among the most important tasks of logical analysis and logical construction. We call this the task of explicating, or of giving an explication for, the earlier concept …” {§6.7}

De Chardin, Teilhard, 1955, The Phenomenon of Man, tr. Bernard Wall (Fontana, 1965; tr. first publ. 1959), 283: “Unlike the primitives who gave a face to every moving thing, or the early Greeks who defined all the aspects and forces of nature, modern man is obsessed by the need to depersonalise (or impersonalise) all that he most admires. There are two reasons for this tendency. The first is analysis, that marvellous instrument of scientific research to which we owe all our advances but which, breaking down synthesis after synthesis, allows one soul after another to escape, leaving us confronted with a pile of dismantled machinery, and evanescent particles. The second reason lies in the discovery of the sidereal world, so vast that it seems to do away with all proportion between our own being and the dimensions of the cosmos around us.”

Geertz, Clifford, 1973, The Interpretation of Cultures (New York: Basic Books), 9: “Analysis … is sorting out the structures of signification … and determining their social ground and import.”

-----, ibid., 20: “Cultural analysis is (or should be) guessing at meanings, assessing the guesses, and drawing explanatory conclusions from the better guesses, not discovering the Continent of Meaning and mapping out its bodiless landscape.”

Hanna, Robert, entry under ‘Conceptual Analysis’ in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 1998: “The theory of conceptual analysis holds that concepts – general meanings of linguistic predicates – are the fundamental objects of philosophical inquiry, and that insights into conceptual contents are expressed in necessary ‘conceptual truths’ (analytic propositions).” {§1.1}

Heidegger, Martin, 1927, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, tr. A. Hofstadter (Indiana University Press, 1982), §12, 114-15: “What we are trying to bring to light here by means of phenomenological analysis in regard to the intentional structure of production is not contrived and fabricated but already present in the everyday, pre-philosophical productive behaviour of the Dasein. In producing, the Dasein lives in such an understanding of being without conceiving it or grasping it as such.”

Hodges, Wilfrid, 1977, Logic (Harmondsworth: Penguin), 86: Logical analysis “stands somewhere between translating and paraphrasing”.

Lichtenberg, Georg Christoph, Aphorisms, tr. R.J. Hollingdale (Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1990), 115: “Our whole philosophy is rectification of colloquial linguistic usage.”

-----, ibid., 119: “Writing is an excellent means of awakening in every man the system slumbering within him; and everyone who has ever written will have discovered that writing always awakens something which, though it lay within us, we failed clearly to recognize before.”

-----, ibid., 162: “Whichever way you look at it, philosophy is always analytical chemistry. The peasant employs all the propositions of the most abstract philosophy, only he employs them enveloped, concealed, compounded, latent, as the chemist and physicist says; the philosopher gives us the propositions pure.”

Lodge, David, Therapy (London), 31: “Analysis has a way of unravelling the self: the longer you pull on the thread, the more flaws you find.”

Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1887, On the Genealogy of Morals, tr. Walter Kaufmann (New York: Random House, 1968), 80: “All concepts in which an entire process is semiotically telescoped elude definition.”

-----, 1895, The Antichrist, §13: “the most valuable insights are methods.”

Pappus, PAC, passage tr. in Hintikka and Remes 1974, 8-9: “Now analysis is the way from what is sought -- as if it were admitted -- through its concomitants (akolouthôn) in order to something admitted in synthesis. For in analysis we suppose that which is sought to be already done, and we inquire from what it results, and again what is the antecedent of the latter, until we on our backward way light upon something already known and being first in order. And we call such a method analysis, as being a solution backwards (anapalin lysin).” {§2.2}

Russell, Bertrand, TK, 119: “Analysis may be defined as the discovery of the constituents and the manner of combination of a given complex. The complex is to be one with which we are acquainted; the analysis is complete when we become acquainted with all the constituents and with their manner of combination, and know that there are no more constituents and that that is their manner of combination. We may distinguish formal analysis as the discovery of the manner of combination, and material analysis as the discovery of the constituents. Material analysis may be called descriptive when the constituents are only known by description, not by acquaintance.” {§6.3}

-----, OKEW, 189-90: “In the special sciences, when they have become fully developed, the movement is forward and synthetic, from the simpler to the more complex. But in philosophy we follow the inverse direction: from the complex and relatively concrete we proceed towards the simple and abstract by means of analysis, seeking, in the process, to eliminate the particularity of the original subject-matter, and to confine our attention entirely to the logical form of the facts concerned.” {§6.3}

-----, OKEW, 214: “The nature of philosophic analysis … can now be stated in general terms. We start from a body of common knowledge, which constitutes our data. On examination, the data are found to be complex, rather vague, and largely interdependent logically. By analysis we reduce them to propositions which are as nearly as possible simple and precise, and we arrange them in deductive chains, in which a certain number of initial propositions form a logical guarantee for all the rest.” {§6.3}

-----, PLA, 189: “the chief thesis that I have to maintain is the legitimacy of analysis”. {§6.3}

-----, LA, 341: “The business of philosophy, as I conceive it, is essentially that of logical analysis, followed by logical synthesis.” {§6.3}

-----, MPD, 11: “Ever since I abandoned the philosophy of Kant and Hegel, I have sought solutions of philosophical problems by means of analysis; and I remain firmly persuaded, in spite of some modern tendencies to the contrary, that only by analysing is progress possible”. {§6.3}

Ryle, Gilbert, 1932, 100: “philosophical analysis … is the sole and whole function of philosophy.” {§6.8}

Schiller, Friedrich, AE, I, 4: “alas! intellect must first destroy the object of Inner Sense if it would make it its own. Like the analytical chemist, the philosopher can only discover how things are combined by analysing them, only lay bare the workings of spontaneous Nature by subjecting them to the torment of his own techniques. In order to lay hold of the fleeting phenomenon, he must first bind it in the fetters of rule, tear its fair body to pieces by reducing it to concepts, and preserve its living spirit in a sorry skeleton of words. Is it any wonder that natural feeling cannot find itself again in such an image, or that in the account of the analytical thinker truth should appear as paradox?” {§5.2}

Sellars, Wilfrid, 1962, ‘Time and the World Order’, in Herbert Feigl and Grover Maxwell, (eds.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science III (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press 1962), 527: “analysis without synopsis must be blind”.

Whitehead, Alfred North, 1947, Essays in Science and Philosophy (New York: Philosophical Library), 157: “The primary weapon is analysis. And analysis is the evocation of insight by the hypothetical suggestions of thought, and the evocation of thought by the activities of direct insight. In this process the composite whole, the interrelations, and the things related, concurrently emerge into clarity.”

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, PI, §90: “Our investigation is therefore a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language. -- Some of them can be removed by substituting one form of expression for another; this may be called an “analysis” of our forms of expression, for the process is sometimes like one of taking a thing apart.” {§6.5}

A list of key works on analysis (monographs and collections) can be found in the

Annotated Bibliography, §1.2

Copyright © 2003
Michael Beaney

Supplement to Analysis
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy