|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is our working prototype of a dynamic encyclopedia. This prototype implements the technical specifications developed in the paper `A Solution to the Problem of Updating Encyclopedias', which was coauthored by Eric Hammer and Edward N. Zalta (Computers and the Humanities, Volume 31/1, 1997, pp. 47-60).
We are now working towards the goal of turning this working prototype into a mature dynamic encyclopedia that will be useful both to professional scholars and the general public. It will not be a `finished' product because dynamic encyclopedias are never finished. But within a few years, we will have refined the operation of this new and innovative kind of dynamic reference work so that it will continue to prove its worth far into the future. We believe that the principles upon which our encyclopedia is based will contribute to a reconceptualization the nature of reference works for the age of the Internet.
However, the innovative technical feature of our encyclopedia is that authors are given an ftp (`file transfer protocol') account on plato.stanford.edu, i.e., the computer that runs the encyclopedia's World Wide Web server. Once an Editorial Board member decides on a topic and finds or approves an author to write it, he or she then forwards the information (via email) to the Editor of the encyclopedia, who then creates an ftp account and home directory for the author on plato.stanford.edu and sends the author detailed information on how to prepare the entry and ftp the entry (or update) when it is ready. When an author sends (via ftp) an entry or an update to his or her home directory on plato.stanford.edu, it becomes part of the encyclopedia and both the Editor and the Board member responsible for that entry are automatically notified. The Editor immediately verifies that the form of the entry is correct and that the content is of good quality. The Board member more carefully evaluates the content of the (modified) entry and informs the author of any changes that should be made.
The other innovative features of a dynamic encyclopedia that has been organized on the above plan are:
This is not so, however. The last major, comprehensive encyclopedia before Routledge's was the 1967 Macmillan Encyclopedia. Even in a relatively slow moving field such as philosophy, 30 years is a long time to wait between encyclopedias. As fine as the Macmillan Encyclopedia was, by the time it was five years old, its value as a reference work for the philosophy profession had greatly diminished. By the mid to late 1970s, a student might go to an encyclopedia looking for information about the Kripke/Donnellan theory of reference, the Lewis and Armstrong identity theories of mind, Putnam's functionalist theory of mind, or Rawls's theory of justice and find nothing of value in the Macmillan Encyclopedia. So the philosophy community went for 20 -- 25 years before the recent handbooks and dictionaries attempted to fill the gap.
In this context, the Routledge Encyclopedia will be a welcome addition and a wonderful new tool. But within the next five to ten years, it too will be out of date, along with the other reference works in philosophy cited. There are more professional philosophers, more journals, more articles, more books than every before in history. There is much valuable and interesting work being done that will be cited in undergraduate classes long before another encyclopedia is due on the present thirty year cycle.
Moreover, the philosophy profession cannot be confident that there will ever be another major print encyclopedia. The Routledge encyclopedia represents an enormous investment. The cost of purchase is also enormous, about $2500 for the CD-ROM edition. Routledge will not be quick to replace it. And yet even the CD-ROM technology is already dated for reference tools. By contrast, the Internet is ideal for reference tools, but not ideal (as far as one can see at present) for traditional private print publishers to make money.
Those academic disciplines deemed more scientific and essential to national goals or business interests than philosophy will have many more ways to subsidize their reference needs. We believe a partnership between CSLI and the philosophy profession to develop an online philosophy encyclopedia represents the best chance for the profession not to be left behind and without adequate reference tools in the future.
Our online encyclopedia, by its nature, will never be `finished'. But we project that it will be mature, in the sense of having virtually all presently planned entries complete, in about four years. Within two years thereafter, its inventory of articles should be very close to that of the Routledge. That means our Encyclopedia will be available as a full-fledged alternative for philosophy students at about the time that the Routledge encyclopedia begins to show signs of age, and at a time when students will increasingly be familiar with the web and expect to use it for reference work. Because of the fact that our Encyclopedia is `alive', it will stay current.
Thus, we propose not to redo the work that has already been done for the Routledge Encyclopedia, but to to use new technology to begin working on the next generation of reference tools for philosophers and their students.
However, we do not believe the Encyclopedia can function on a completely volunteer basis. At a minimum, we must pay for a part-time Editor, part-time editorial assistants and at least one part-time computer programmer. Some equipment and supplies have to be purchased and telephone and other services (e.g., networking) need to be paid for. We estimate costs as follows:
1. Staff Salaries: $100,000
2. Staff Benefits: $25,000
3. Supplies, equipment, services, etc.: $25,000
4. Total: $150,000
Print encyclopedias are funded by sales to individual and institutional users. Our hope is our dynamic encyclopedia will remain free to all individual users. There should be as few obstacles to the serious study of philosophy as possible. We hope that the online encyclopedia will be available to anyone anywhere with access to the net.
The institutions most closely associated with users include Philosophy departments, universities (and their libraries), and professional organizations for philosophers (such as the APA, CPA, AAP, etc.). Universities should be able, in the long run, to support online encyclopedias and other online resource materials from the same budget lines used for print materials that now serve these purposes. One strategy for funding the Encyclopedia would be to charge university libraries a nominal yearly access (subscription) fee. This subscription fee would give computers based at those universities the right to access the Encyclopedia. If 1000 universities each pay $150/year for unrestricted access to the Encyclopedia, the Encyclopedia's projected annual budget would be covered. The $150/year access fee could simply represent an average---the fee could be set so that universities with larger (smaller) budgets or student populations pay a proportionally larger (smaller) access fee. This would keep the Encyclopedia free to the public.
However, in the short run, we do not expect to be able to tap these resources. Our Encyclopedia won't be mature for another 3 - 5 years. Right now, we want University libraries to use their funds to purchase the much anticipated Routledge Encyclopedia. Until our encyclopedia has matured, we will need to look elsewhere for support.
We feel that Philosophy departments and professional organizations are natural sources of funding. Philosophy departments differ enormously in the amount of discretionary funds available to them, with the mean amount extremely low. Some departments do have such funds, however, and a few hundred dollars from a number of such departments could help significantly. However, we prefer not to approach individual departments until there is mature product that will be useful to them. (We might make an exception for a number of the most well-endowed departments, some of which are represented on our Editorial Board.) At the startup phase, it seems more appropriate to approach those institutions part of whose mission, or enlightened self-interest, is to help projects like this get off the ground. Within philosophy, this means professional organizations like the APA. At this point, the Pacific APA and the CPA have made generous contributions, and we have approached the Central and Eastern APA. Of course, a commitment at the national level would be preferable.
Among the funding sources that are not directly connected to Encyclopedia users, we distinguish between government sources, foundations, and businesses. We have received a 2-year grant from the NEH. They will give us $120,000 to develop the Encyclopedia, to be delivered over two years (AY 1998-99 and 1999-2000). We will apply for an NSF grant through the Digital Libraries II initiative. If this proposal proves successful, this would take care of our funding needs until 2003, at which point the Encyclopedia will be close to maturity.
We are just beginning to solicit funds from appropriate foundations. The development and fund-raising staffs at CSLI and Stanford are being most helpful in this respect.
It seems to us that Netscape, Microsoft, Yahoo, and other companies with a stake in the future of the Internet might have multiple reasons for investing in our Encyclopedia. In this regard, it would be very helpful to discover philosophers within such companies who would be willing to help us identify and approach the relevant people with funding authority.
(Some of these companies have been indirectly funding the Encyclopedia for the past two years through CSLI's Industrial Affiliates program. CSLI was founded in 1983 with a grant from the Systems Development Foundation. These funds were exhausted long ago. Since 1993, the Industrial Affiliates program has been the principal source of CSLI's operating budget.)
A final possibility for money from the private sector is advertising. One can imagine tasteful and wholly appropriate links from the Encyclopedia home page to the websites of publishers of philosophy books. Whether these publishers will find this to be a economical use of their advertising budgets remains to be seen.
We would welcome comments from the APA membership on any aspect of fund-raising. Anything from leads concerning fund-raising in industry to comments about the appropriateness of advertising would be welcome.
2. The list includes: A Companion to the Philosophy of Language (Blackwell, 1997), Companion Encyclopedia of Asian Philosophy (Routledge, 1997), Routledge History of Philosophy (Routledge, 1997), Oxford Dictionary of Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1996), Blackwell Companion to Philosophy (Blackwell, 1996), Biographical Dictionary of Twentieth Century Philosophers (Routledge, 1995), Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1995), Oxford Companion to Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1995), A Companion to Metaphysics (Blackwell, 1995), A Companion to Epistemology (Blackwell, 1992), A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind (Blackwell, 1994), and Handbook on Metaphysics and Ontology (Philosophia Verlag, 1991). (return to text)