This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Summer 1999 Edition

How to Acquire our Design and Software for a Dynamic Reference Work



The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is a new and innovative kind of reference work. It has been developed at the Center for the Study of Language and Information over the past two and a half years (i.e., beginning September 1995). During that time, we have been thinking through the issues and problems that arise in the design of a dynamic reference work that will meet the highest academic standards. The Unix software we have developed provides the necessary tools for a small staff on a small budget to administer a large-scale dynamic reference work. Our software may therefore meet the needs of: (1) academic disciplines and institutions (in both the sciences and humanities), (2) reference work publishers looking to build their own dynamic reference works, and (3) corporations that need to maintain and monitor a cooperatively-produced reference work.

The many hours we have spent over the past two and a half years working on the design (and working out the bugs) of the dynamic reference work represents a substantial investment of time and money. It would require a significant sum of money to pay one or more individuals with Unix administration, Perl scripting, and HTML webmastering experience to design, implement, and debug a similar system. Moreover, it would take them time to produce such a system. A simpler, faster, and less expensive alternative would be to acquire our design and software.

Design and Software:

On our design, the reference work lives in two directories: the webserver directory and /usr/local/encyclopedia. The webserver directory contains a special htdocs subdirectory which contains the reference work itself. The reference work includes a Homepage, Table of Contents, and an entries subdirectory where the entries are stored (each in it own subdirectory). The directory /usr/local/encyclopedia contains special subdirectories for scripts and databases. The programs and files in these subdirectories are the key to the automated administration of the reference work.

We have built Unix and Perl scripts that automate the following tasks: create accounts for the authors (from keyboard input by the Editor), send the authors email about their account and the ftp commands they will need, notice when authors place entries online for the first time, monitor subsequent changes in the content to entries, prompt the Editor when discreptancies arise among databases, automatically re-cross-reference the reference work when new entries come online, modify the email aliases such as `authors' (which contains a list of the email addresses of all the authors), and notify the board members that entries for which they are responsible have been changed. These scripts can be customized to run on virtually any Unix installation supporting a web server, Perl, and pine.

These scripts (and a several other "helper" scripts, which have not been mentioned), make it possible for a small staff on a small budget to administer a large-scale reference work.

Acquiring Our Design and Software:

The above programs and scripts can be acquired from the Center for the Study of Language and Information. The cost of the software varies according to the kind of the institution making the acquisition. The price for academic institutions and non-profit organizations is less than the price for commercial institutions.

In addition, commercial institutions can pay CSLI to send a team to configure and install a dynamic reference work on a Unix machine supplied by the purchaser. During the installation, we train your staff how to operate the reference work software. This service increases the cost of the software (depending on where the CSLI team has to travel).

Enquiries should be sent to:

or to: