This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Summer 1999 Edition

Entry Guidelines

In this document we orient our authors on the following topics:

Entry Content

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is intended to serve as an authoritative reference work suitable for use by professionals and students in the field of philosophy, as well as by all others interested in authoritative discussions on philosophical topics. Entries should therefor be written with the highest of professional standards, and be of interest to as wide an audience as possible. All entries should seek to provide objective, neutral analyses or surveys of particular topics or fields of inquiry, rather than promoting particular points of view.

The length of entries will typically be the equivalent of 2,000 to 6,000 words, depending on the requirements of the topic. However, authors may write somewhat longer entries if they organize the material in tree (nested), rather than in linear, format. By this we mean that the main HTML page of the entry should be readable in a sitting of about an hour or two maximum. If the author wishes to include more detailed material, this material can be put into a separate HTML page and linked into an appropriate (and well sign-posted) place of the main HTML page. The reader can follow these links if they are interested in the more technical or scholarly details. In this way, the document can be structured as a tree and can therefore be of interest to a wide audience. However, authors should create such nestings only if it seems unlikely that a separate entry in the Encyclopedia will be created to discuss this material.

Existing entries in the Encyclopedia may be consulted for style, content, and length.

Writing Your Entry in HTML

Because the Encyclopedia is being served over the World Wide Web, all entries must be written in HTML (HyperText Markup Language). This is the formatting language that controls the way text, graphics, and links are displayed in Web browsers. There are now available numerous HTML Editors and Web Authoring Tools and these allow the authors to format text and graphics in HTML easily, without learning any arcane commands.

To begin writing an entry, authors should follow the instructions sent to them for downloading the sourcefile of the "Entry Template". They can simply "Open" that file using an HTML Editor. This Entry Template will ensure that there is a uniform entry style, which is described below, in the section on "Entry Format".

For those authors who prefer to create an HTML sourcefile directly, without the assistance of an HTML editor, we've indicated, in our instructions, how to obtain the "Annotated Sourcefile". After downloading the sourcefile, authors can replace the sample text in this file with their own content. This will minimize the number of HTML commands authors will need to learn.

Entry Format

The Entry Template and Annotated Sourcefile are formatted in HTML so that the following divisions are preserved in every entry: These are discussed in turn.

Introduction. The Introduction should contain a brief definition of the subject. This may take one or two paragraphs, and if possible, these paragraphs should contain some statement of the subject's interest and significance. The main topics to be covered in the body of the entry may be mentioned here, so that the reader will get some idea of what is to follow.

Internal Links. The internal links should be a list of the main sections of the entry, and each item in the list should be a link to that section. The HTML commands needed to do this are included in the template and in the annotated sourcefile.

Main Sections. The sectioning of the entry is at the discretion of the author. However, we encourage authors to include a Chronology or "Life" section in Biographical entries. Moreover, a "History" section is called for in the discussion of many topics.

Bibliography. Please use a standard bibliographic format, beginning with author's last names, and at least the initials of their first names. The format "City:Publisher, Date" is preferred to the "Publisher, Date" format.

Other Internet Resources. To complete this section, authors are encouraged to conduct an on-line search of the Web for related resources. Your first search should be conducted on the Limited Area Search Engine for philosophy known as HIPPIAS: It can be found at the URL:
If this doesn't yield any results, you should try the rather serious search engine Alta Vista, which can be found at:
Other search engines include and However, please do not create links to websites that are not maintained by qualified individuals.

Related Entries. Please list the names of the most important concepts and philosophers that occur in your entry. You may list keywords that do not appear as topics in our Table of Contents if you feel that they are important. We have a program which will notice the discrepancy and alert the Editor. A decision will be made whether or not to include a new entry on that topic. If we decide that the topic is too specialized or otherwise inappropriate for the Encyclopedia, we will eliminate this keyword from your list in the Related Entries section.

Entry Revision

Because the Encyclopedia is designed to be a dynamic document, all authors are responsible for maintaining and periodically updating their entries. Specifically, authors are requested to revise their entries in light of comments from members of the Editorial Board and to update them regularly in response to new developments in their respective field of research. Authors should update their Bibliographies regularly, to keep pace with significant new publications on the topic. If entries are maintained in this way, the Encyclopedia will not go out of date and will be responsive to new research.

Authors should begin the process of revision by: (1) notifying the Editor that he/she plans to make changes, and (2) downloading the present version of his/her entry from the Encyclopedia. You can download your entry either by using your browser to examine and download the file or by retrieving the file by ftp (`get' rather than `put' your file from the relevant subdirectory in your home directory). After after editing this file, it should then be ftp'ed back to the Encyclopedia. It is prudent to send the Editor a brief note ahead of time, indicating that you plan to transfer a new version of your entry because the Editor can warn you whether any editorial changes being made to the Encyclopedia make it an inopportune time to ftp updates to entries.

We ask you to begin by downloading your entry from the Encyclopedia because your copy of the HTML sourcefile that you originally sent us is most probably out of date! When we receive your entry for the first time, we almost always have to make some changes to your HTML sourcefile. We must have a sourcefile that will look just like the other entries, so that our automated procedures and programs can operate on a well-defined structure. Here is an example of one reason why we modify the entries we receive: some text- and HTML-editors put entire paragraphs on a single line. This is incompatible with good search engines. Such search engines return a whole line as "context" whenever it finds a match for the keyword used in the search. So if there are no linebreaks in your paragraphs, the search engine will return the entire paragraph! But there are several other ways in which we sometimes have to modify the sourcefile you send us.

So, if you do not follow the revision procedure by first downloading your entry from the Encyclopedia and you work on an out of date version of your file, you will overwrite the editorially correct version when you ftp to us the result of your modifications. We would then have to retrieve the editorially correct version of your file from backup and ask you to make the modifications again to this file. So, to avoid this hassle, please remember to notify us of your intentions to modify and make changes to the Encyclopedia's version of your file on the day you start your modifications.

One Further Special Request: Some text- and HTML-editors are not friendly to HTML sourcefiles when you load those files into the editor. Some add special control characters to the file; others make changes to the HTML, following their own conception of how HTML should be written. So please make future modifications to your entry by using a simple text editor and saving the file as ASCII/plain text (HTML is written in ASCII/plain text). Though a simple text editor will show you all the HTML formatting code, it should be easy to find your way around the file and edit the portions you are interested in. By using a simple text editor, you save us the trouble of having to reedit the HTML produced by these unfriendly HTML editors.

The Use of Footnotes

Footnotes may be included. Then can often help to shorten the main page of the entry, to make it more readable. The footnotes themselves should be put into a separate html file called "notes.html" and these should be placed into the same directory on as the entry. To create links from the text to the footnotes, authors should follow these general guidelines. Suppose you want to add footnote number x at a point in the text:

...some text.[x]

To produce this, use the following HTML code at the point in the text where the footnote should occur:

...some text.<sup>[<A HREF="notes.html#x" NAME="return-x">x</A>]</sup>

This will place "[x]" as a superscript in the text, with "x" a link to the place in the notes.html file where the NAME="x" occurs (see below), and mark the spot for place to return. Then, create another HTML file named "notes.html" and begin footnote x with the following HTML code:

[<A HREF="index.html#return-x" NAME="x">x.</A>] Begin the body of the footnote.

This will start a new paragraph, start the footnote with the symbols "[x.]" (with "x." both a link back to the main text and the name of the place into which the footnote in the main text will be linked). Note: Users of the Encyclopedia can always use the "Back" or "Return" button on their browsers to get back to the text.

The Use of Special Symbols

Although the specifications for the HTML4.0 language does include support for a variety of special symbols, including Greek, logic and math symbols, there is little support for arranging these symbols on the page in the variety of ways needed by mathematicians and logicians. A new standard for typesetting mathematical and logical formulas is developing, namely, MathML. See W3C Math: MathML puts Math on the Web. However, it will be sometime before web browsers are reprogrammed to meet this standard. So, for now, we would ask you not to employ the MathML standard or the symbols that are supported in HTML4.0.

In the meantime, if the special symbol you need is not on this list of special HTML characters which is widely supported, we have created a wide variety of small graphics of the Greek, logic, and math symbols that logicians and others typically use. These symbols are located at the URL:

Table of Symbols
For example, we have produced the following graphic of the symbol for the "set membership" relation:
This symbol can be found at the URL displayed above and you can download it onto your machine from there. Follow the link to "element.gif" in the table for Math symbols. You can then save that graphic onto the drive of your local computer.

To produce the formatted line:

x y
place element.gif into the directory containing your HTML entry and use the following HTML code in your entry:
<I>x</I> <IMG SRC="element.gif"> <I>y</I>
Be sure to transfer the graphic to the same directory on plato when you transfer your entry to us.

You may use any graphic found in our symbols directory in this way. If you need a symbol not found in that directory, write to the editor---they are easily constructed.