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Although there are significant continuities throughout his thought, Whitehead's intellectual life is often divided into three periods. The first corresponds roughly with his time at Cambridge, from 1884 to 1910, during which he worked primarily on logic and mathematics. The second corresponds roughly with his time at London, from 1910 to 1924, during which he concentrated mainly on issues in the philosophy of science. The third corresponds roughly with his time at Harvard, from 1924 onward, during which he worked on more general issues in philosophy, including the development of a comprehensive metaphysical system which has come to be known as process philosophy.
Whitehead began his academic career at Trinity College, Cambridge, where, starting in 1885, he taught for twenty-five years. In 1890 Bertrand Russell arrived as a student at Trinity and during the 1890s the two men came into regular contact with one another. According to Russell, "Whitehead was extraordinarily perfect as a teacher"1 and Whitehead soon became something of a mentor to the younger man.
By the early 1900s, both men had completed books on the foundations of mathematics. Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra had resulted in his election to the Royal Society. Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics had marked a decisive break from his earlier neo-Kantian work, such as his 1897 An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry. Since the research for a proposed second volume of Russell's Principles overlapped considerably with Whitehead's own research for the proposed second volume of his Universal Algebra, the two men began collaboration on what was eventually to become Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). According to Whitehead, they initially expected the research to take about a year to complete. In the end, they worked together on the project for a full decade.
Logicism, the theory that mathematics is in some important sense reducible to logic, consists of two main theses. The first is that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of that of logic. The second is that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of those of logic.
Like Gottlob Frege, Whitehead and Russell took the view that numbers could be identified with sets of sets, and that number-theoretic operations could be explained in terms of set theoretic operations such as intersection, union, and difference. Although Whitehead and Russell were then able to provide many detailed derivations of major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory, the issue of whether set theory itself can be said to have been successfully reduced to logic remains controversial.
Following the completion of Principia, Whitehead and Russell began to go their separate ways. Perhaps inevitably, Russell's anti-war activities during World War I (in which Whitehead lost his youngest son) also led to something of a split between the two men. Nevertheless, they remained on relatively good terms for the rest of their lives.
At the University of London, Whitehead turned his attention to issues in the philosophy of science. Of particular note was his rejection of the idea that each object has a simple spatial location. Instead, Whitehead advocated the view that all objects should be understood as fields having both temporal and spatial extensions. Further, each object may be understood to be a series of events and processes. It is this latter idea which Whitehead later systematically elaborated in his imposing Process and Reality (1929), going so far as to suggest that process, rather than substance, should be taken as the fundamental metaphysical constituent of the world. It was during this time that Whitehead published several less well known books, including An Inquiry Concerning the Principles of Natural Knowledge (1919), The Concept of Nature (1920), and The Principle of Relativity (1922).
While at London, Whitehead also became involved in many practical aspects of tertiary education, serving as Dean of the Faculty of Science and holding several other senior administrative posts. Many of the essays in his The Aims of Education and Other Essays (1929) date from this time.
Upon being offered an appointment at Harvard, Whitehead moved to the United States in 1924. Given his prior training in mathematics and in the physical sciences, it was sometimes joked that the first philosophy lectures he ever attended were those which he delivered at Harvard in his new role as Professor of Philosophy. A year later he also delivered Harvard's prestigious Lowell Lectures which formed the basis for his first primarily metaphysical book, Science and the Modern World (1925). In it he again introduced several themes which later found fuller expression in Process and Reality. The same was true of the 1927/28 Gifford Lectures at the University of Edinburgh on which Process and Reality came to be based.
In Process and Reality, rather than assuming substances as the basic metaphysical category, Whitehead introduces the notion of an actual occasion. On Whitehead's view, an actual occasion is not an enduring substance, but a process of becoming. As Donald Sherburne points out, "It is customary to compare an actual occasion with a Leibnizian monad, with the caveat that whereas a monad is windowless, an actual occasion is 'all window'. It is as though one were to take Aristotle's system of categories and ask what would result if the category of substance were displaced from its preeminence by the category of relation ... ."2 As Whitehead himself explains, his "philosophy of organism is the inversion of Kant's philosophy ... For Kant, the world emerges from the subject; for the philosophy of organism, the subject emerges from the world."3
Whitehead's ultimate attempt to develop a metaphysical unification of space, time, matter and events has proved to be rather controversial. In part this may be because of the connections which Whitehead saw between his metaphysics and traditional theism. According to Whitehead, religion is concerned with permanence amid change, and can be found in the ordering we find within nature, something he sometimes called the "primordial nature of God". Thus although not especially influential among contemporary Anglo-American secular philosophers, his metaphysical ideas have had greater influence among many theologians and philosophers of religion.
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First published: May 21, 1996
Content last modified: August 18, 1997