Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
A trope is an instance or bit (not an exemplification) of a property or
a relation; e.g. Clinton's eloquence, Sydney's beauty, or Pierre's love
of Heloïse. Clinton's eloquence is understood here not as
Clinton's participating in the universal eloquence, nor as the peculiar
quality of Clinton's eloquence, but simply as
Clinton's bit of eloquence, the eloquence that he and he alone has.
Similarly, Pierre's love is not his participation in love
as such, nor the special way he loves, but
the loving peculiar to Pierre as directed toward Heloïse.
The appeal of tropes for philosophers is
as an ontological basis free of the postulation of
obscure abstract entities such as propositions and universals.
The ontological theory of tropes holds that properties and relations
subsist as so many instances or tropes, one for each exemplification.
These tropes are particulars, not universals, distinct from the concrete
particulars they characterize. By other names, trope ontologies have
been espoused throughout the history of Western philosophy. According
to D. W. Mertz (1996, ch. IV), variants can be found in the writings of
Plato, Aristotle, Boëthius, Avicenna, Averroës, Thomas,
Scotus, Buridan, Suárez, Leibniz, Husserl, the early Russell
(1911), Stout, Cook Wilson, and Strawson. Tropes have been variously
called "property (and relation) instances", "abstract particulars",
"concrete properties", "unit properties (and relations)",
"quality (and relation) bits", "individual accidents", and
(in German) "Momente". (Parenthesized years refer to the
The most compelling advocate of such objects in our time has been
D. C. Williams (1953), who is responsible for the
regrettable term trope. It has nothing to do with
figures of speech in rhetoric, Leitmotive in music, or
tropisms in plants. Williams coined it as a sort of philosophical joke:
Santayana, he says, had employed `trope' pointlessly for `essence of
an occurrence'. Williams would go him one better and press it into
service for `occurrence of an essence' (1953: 78). [Far from poking fun
at Santayana, Williams published an appreciation of his views on essence
and occurrence in a memorial issue of the Journal of
Philosophy (1954).] Ironically, the word `trope' is to be heard
correctly these days mainly from the lips of poststructuralists.
Meanwhile, many trope theorists have adopted Williams' usage, but some
avoid it (e.g. Mertz). Williams acknowledged the close affinity between
his trope theory and G. F. Stout's theory of abstract particulars (1921,
Obviously one could see tropes as complexes of some sort, perhaps
composed of particulars and universals. (I use `universal' here to
cover both properties and relations.) Such a construction is, indeed,
very strongly suggested by the subject-predicate form of our language.
Philosophical ontologists have, however, long since considered departing
from this linguistic pattern in various ways. Nominalists recognize the
particulars as subjects, but hold that there really are no universals
beyond the linguistic predicates themselves. Plato held, by contrast,
that certain universals, the Forms, are the only realities, the
particulars being mere figments of belief (-380). A less radical
variant of nominalism recognizes properties and relations, but as mere
set-theoretic constructs out of individuals. This approach is usual in
model-theoretic semantics. A less otherworldly version of Platonism
takes particulars to be bundles of universals; cf. Russell (1940, ch. 6,
8, 24) and Blanshard (1939, ch. 16, 17). For those students of
ontology who are not obsessed with parsimony, however, the most natural
course would probably seem to be to take a leaf from our language and to
recognize both exemplifying individuals and repeatedly exemplified
universals. Such a view is so common that it has no particular name;
Armstrong calls it the "substance-attribute view" (1989: 59 et seq.).
This view need not deny that there are tropes, but it denies that they
are basic or simple or primitive. Rather they must be composite
structures involving a property or relation, some individuals, and an
exemplification nexus. An ontology based on tropes takes the opposite
approach. It recognizes tropes as basic, not as constructed.
Individuals and properties then require further analysis. Ontological
theories thus based on primitive tropes may be called versions of
tropism or trope theory. A major attraction of tropism has been its
promise of parsimony; some adherents go so far as to proclaim a
one-category ontology (Campbell, Mertz).
Trope theories divide according to their treatment of universals and
individuals. What I should like to regard as the classic trope theory
(Stout, Williams) treats universals and individuals as constructs or
bundles of tropes. This is the trope-bundle theory, called by some
(Simons, Mertz) trope nominalism or moderate nominalism (Hochberg).
(`Nominalism' because it repudiates primitive universals; `moderate'
because it still recognizes unit properties). Then there are trope
theories that retain either primitive individuals or primitive
universals. The former position, substratum tropism, was taken in a
way by Leibniz, who recognized individual substances (monads), but
correlated with complete individual concepts comprising nonrelational
tropelike representations of the whole world (1686: §§9, 14;
1714: §§8, 14, 17-19). A similar view is hailed by
C. B. Martin (1980) in Locke (1690: 159) and noted approvingly by
Armstrong (1989: 114, 136). The latter view, tropes plus primitive
universals, was held by Cook Wilson (1926, vol. 2, 713 et
passim) and may be represented also by Mertz (1996), with the
important qualification that his universals are given conceptual, not
Platonic status. Such a position might be called trope universalism;
Mertz calls his version "moderate realism". ('Realism' because
universals are recognized; `moderate' because they are immanent: only
their instances really exist.) Finally, there is the possibility of
combining tropism with a full substance-attribute view. Husserl
(1913-21: 430f, 436f) may perhaps be read in this way, and certain
truthmaker theories may come close. (Truthmakers, like tropes, may be
posited in addition to states of affairs, complexes made up of
particulars and universals.)
Another significant division among trope theories separates the
actualists from the meinongians. (The term alludes to no specific
teaching of Meinong, just the preparedness to recognize nonexistents.)
For the actualist, there is a trope, say, of Old Faithful's heat, only
if Old Faithful is actually hot. The only property instances are actual
ones. For the meinongian, on the other hand, there are also tropes of
Old Faithful's coldness, Bill Clinton's shyness, etc. (The contrast
mirrors the traditional dispute over false facts or nonobtaining states
of affairs.) These days actualism is popular. Meinongian tropism has,
however, one great advantage: it affords a straightforward account of
possible worlds (deemed by many hopelessly obscure). A possible world,
on this approach, is simply a set of tropes. (There are problems with
nonlogically incompatible tropes, such as a's redness and
a's greenness, but similar problems beset other theories. Not
every trope set need be a possible world.)
Classic tropism, the trope-bundle theory, would seem to hold the
greatest promise of economy. For this theory dispenses with both
primitive individuals and primitive universals, leaving at first glance
only tropes. However, second-level bundling relations of tropes prove
necessary. Tropes belong to the same individual if they are all
compresent (concurrent) with one another. Tropes belong to the
same universal (property or relation) if they exactly resemble
one another. The two second-level trope relations of compresence and
exact resemblance are essential to the bundle theory. They are
similarity relations (reflexive and symmetric); compresence is also
transitive, an equivalence relation on tropes. Thus universals become
similarity classes and individuals equivalence classes of tropes: both
are products of abstraction. (This is a first approximation:
individuals may ultimately have be taken as more complicated; see
Individuals Refined.) Exemplification (as
expressed by predication) is then simply overlapping. On the actualist
approach, Clinton is eloquent iff he (his compresence class) overlaps
eloquence (the set of eloquences). The meinongian approach brings in
possible worlds: Clinton is eloquent in w iff he, eloquence,
and w all overlap.
Trope-bundle theory can be further developed to include a treatment of
compound universals (also requiring further complications in the
structure of individuals and universals) and a construction of what
Bacon calls states of affairs (essentially, world sets) (1995, ch. III).
The whole question of the relation of tropes to states of affairs is a
vexed one, partly because intuitive conceptions of states of affairs
diverge. For some, it is analytic that states of affairs are complexes,
making it unthinkable for them to be tropes. Others see an extensive
parallel between the two notions. The latter view is ruled out if the
tropes are assumed as basic. But there is some interest in seeing what
results if we plug states of affairs (complexes) into trope theory in
place of tropes. Connections both to situation semantics and to
Armstrong's later theory of universals (1989: 94) are revealed.
The seemingly parsimonious trope-bundle theory, as we saw, is pushed to
acknowledge at least a second category besides tropes, the second-level
relations. There are probably more such relations, e.g. temporal
precedence and betterness. Williams advocated the obvious therapy here
without working out the details. The second-level relations, he
suggested, crumble into second-level tropes (1953: 84). But it should
be clear that in order to bundle second-level tropes into the requisite
relations, third-level relations will be needed, and so forth.
It turns out that a significant simplification is actually achieved at
the third or fourth level, so the regress is not vicious. At least one
unpulverized relation is still needed though, and the
third- or fourth-level tropes ultimately assumed are scarcely
plausible candidates for basic constituents of reality.
Mertz points out how hostile the Western tradition has been to
recognizing genuine relations (1996, ch. 6). Only Russell's early
insistence on their importance turned the tide in our century. Few
trope theories have a well worked out treatment even of first-level
(ordinary) relations. Campbell holds that while
relational discourse is ineliminable,
relations themselves come down to their foundations,
the properties of their relata in which they are grounded (1990: 98ff).
As Mertz has pointed out (1996: 63-67), this general approach goes back
at least as far as Ockham. Although Campbell does not give details,
the project is not to be regarded as hopeless.
Bacon, on the other hand, retains first-level relations in the same
status as properties, bundled into universals by exact resemblance
(1995, ch. II). But whereas modern predicate logic treats the semantic
values of relational predicates as complicated (as sets of
n-tuples), Bacon complicates individuals. He multiplies
compresence into indexed 1-compresence, 2-compresence, . . . An
individual (in the new extended sense) is then a chain (sequence) of a
1-compresence-equivalence class, a 2-compresence-equivalence class, and
so on. This inobvious extension makes a unified treatment of predication
possible. On the actualist approach, Yeltsin is healthy iff his first
compresence class overlaps health. Pierre loves Heloïse iff his
first compresence class, her second compresence class, and love all
overlap. The meinongian approach brings in possible worlds: Yeltsin is
healthy in w iff his 1-compresence class, health, and w all
overlap. The dyadic case is similar. Williams considered the
explication of exemplification to be one of the important achievements
of tropism, "do[ing] much to dispel the ancient mystery of predication"
(1953: 82). Bacon extends that explication to relational predication.
For some trope theorists, a mere set of tropes, or even a chain of such,
has too little inner coherence and unity to qualify as an individual.
Thus Williams takes an individual to be the mereological sum of
a compresence class (1953: 81). Martin writes, "An object is not a
collectable out of its properties or qualities as a crowd is collectable
out of its members. For each and every property of an object has to be
had by that object to exist at all" (1980: 8). Mertz constructs
individuals with the help of what he calls integrated networks
(1996: 76). The integrated network of a particular t comprises
all the atomic facts about t. Since the integrated network is
itself a nonrepeatable individual, it can have its own integrated
network, and so on. A hierarchy of such integrated networks is then an
ordinary individual. Mertz appears to leave it open whether the
hierarchy ever terminates. He is also vague about facts (states of
affairs): they are complexes consisting of a trope and its
exemplification or relata, the latter apparently also tropes. Facts
serve as truthmakers. Mertz's account is developed partly to avoid
positing individuals as bare particulars. The price would seem to be to
obscure the truth condition for simple predication sentences.
A further refinement of bundles is offered in Simons' nuclear theory
(1994). In place of compresence,
Simons takes over Husserl's foundation relation (1913-22.478f).
A trope s is founded on t if t's existence is
necessary for the existence of s. s and t are
directly foundationally related if either is founded on the
other. Foundational relatedness, the ancestral of direct
foundational relatedness, is an equivalence relation on tropes. Its
equivalence classes are foundational systems. An integral
whole [Husserl: whole in the pregnant sense (1913-22.475)] is the
mereological fusion of a foundational system. An integral whole forms
the nucleus or individual nature of a substance. Its
accidents are a nimbus of tropes dependent (founded) on the
nucleus, generically though not individually required by it. Thus
Simons envisions a tight bundle within a loose bundle, the whole
constituting a thick particular. The tight bundle (the nucleus) is
like a substratum, but is not assumed as basic.
The assault on the trope-bundle theory has been led by Mertz. His
objections appear to stem from two deeply held intuitions, which I will
call the predication intuition and the glue intuition.
According to the former, it is unacceptable to conceive of tropes as
free-floating (Mertz 1996.26). They are not genuine property instances
unless they are saturable, properties of something. Compresence classes
do not possess enough unity to be genuine subjects of predication. At
the same time, as we have seen, Mertz hesitates to posit primitive
individuals lest they turn out to be bare particulars, which would be
incoherent by his lights. Hence his hierarchies of integrated networks
of tropes (see previous section).
According to the glue intuition, complexes need to be held together, and
relations are the glue. They are "ontoglial", Mertz says, i.e., from
the Greek, the glue of being (1996: 25). Sets and bundles as such lack
unity. Thus Mertz is obliged to reject the bundle theory of relations
as well as that of individuals. Only genuine relations can be ontoglial.
Together with the predication intuition, this yields
Mertz's distinctive dualism about relations, his trope universalism or
moderate realism. The basic universals do the gluing, but the basic
tropes get predicated. What is the connection between the two?
They are both aspects of the trope, the relation instance.
The instance aspect is the fundamental ontic unit;
the repeatable aspect is conceptual.
It might seem that this makes the glue unreal,
but Mertz speaks also of extra-conceptual intensions (universals)
as goals of total science (1996: 32).
D. H. Mellor, citing Ramsey (1931), and Thomas Hofweber have objected
that the above tropist account of predication in terms of overlapping
makes exemplification symmetric: it fails to explain which is the
subject and which is the the predicate, or which is the individual and
which is the universal. So long as compresence classes can be
distinguished from exact-resemblance classes (particulars from
universals), there is no problem. But what if the same class could be
both a particular (or a link in its bundle chain) and a universal?
Bacon rules out this possibility, but seemingly ad hoc. Might
it not be, for example, on a radically monotheistic scheme, that the
trope God's divinity was the sole trope in the individual God as well as
the sole trope in the property of divinity?
Various applications have been proposed for trope theory. Campbell
suggests that tropes are the natural relata of causation (1981: 480f).
Although events are often cast in that role, Williams affirms that they
are a kind of trope (1953: 90). It remains to see whether this insight
will shed any real light on the nature of causation. [Bacon sketches a
treatment of causation in trope theory, but it is not clear that he
makes any essential use of tropes, other than to form possible worlds
(1995, ch. VIII).] Campbell further suggests that tropes are the
natural subjects of evaluation (1981: 481). Again, while this seems
feasible, it is not clear where it takes us. [Bacon tries to develop
this idea too (1995, ch. IX), but his treatment would seem to work
equally well with states of affairs rather than tropes.] Campbell
suggests a trope-theoretic interpretation of the fields recognized by
modern physics, but a lot is expected of his field-tropes. Why not have
just one trope, the-world's-being-the-way-it-is?
Mertz puts forward a distinctive system of logic, particularized
predicate logic (PPL), exploiting the opportunity of quantifying over
tropes in many places where we should expect second-order quantification
over properties (1996, ch. IX). Impressive claims are made for PPL. It
is said to be a provably consistent type-free extension of second-order
logic, admitting impredicative definitions. Diagonal arguments and
Gödel's incompleteness proofs are allegedly defeated,
and solutions are proffered to
the various liar paradoxes, and the generalized Fitch-Curry paradox.
While tropism, like any other theory, must stand or fall on its merits,
it may be asking too much to expect metaphysical arguments to establish
its pre-eminence. The substance-attribute view, the property-bundle
theory, the trope-bundle theory, and even perhaps model-theoretic
particularism are apparently all capable of modeling each other (Bacon
1988). If tropes deserve first place in first philosophy, it may be for
epistemological or even pragmatic reasons. As we knock about the world,
it is tropes we encounter in the first instance. An intelligible theory
can start there.
state of affairs |
Meinong, Alexius |
Russell's paradox |
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