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From these sources, scholars have attempted to piece together a picture of the content, and in some cases, the development of Stoic doctrine. In some areas, there is a fair bit of consensus about what the Stoics thought and we can even attach names to some particular innovations. However, in other areas the proper interpretation of our meagre evidence is hotly contested. Until recently, non-specialists have been largely excluded from the debate because many important sources were not translated into modern languages. Fragments of Stoic works and testimonia in their original Greek and Latin were collected into a three-volume set in 1903-5 by H. von Arnim, Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta. In writings on the `old' Stoics, fragments and testimonia are often referred to by von Arnim's volume numbers and text numeration; e.g. SVF I.345 = Diogenes Laertius, Lives 4.40. In 1987, A. A. Long and David Sedley brought out The Hellenistic Philosophers (LS) which contains in its first volume English translations and commentary of many important texts on Stoics, Epicureans and Skeptics. Unless otherwise specifically noted, I refer in what follows to texts by or about Stoics using Long and Sedley's notation (and translation, sometimes slightly altered), i.e. 47G = section 47 of their work, text G.
In accord with this ontology, the Stoics, like the Epicureans, make God material. But while the Epicureans think the gods are too busy being blessed and happy to be bothered with the governance of the universe, the Stoic God is immanent throughout the whole of creation and directs its development down to the smallest detail. God is identical with one of the two ungenerated and indestructible first principles (archai) of the universe. One principle is matter which they regard as utterly unqualified and inert. It is that which is acted upon. God is identified with an eternal reason (logos, Diog. Laert. 44B ) or intelligent designing fire (Aetius, 46A) which structures matter in accordance with Its plan. This plan is enacted time and time again, beginning from a state in which all is fire, through the generation of the elements, to the creation of the world we are familiar with, and eventually back to fire in a cycle of endless recurrence. The designing fire of the conflagration is likened to a sperm which contains the principles or stories of all the things which will subsequently develop (Aristocles in Eusebius, 46G). Under this guise, God is also called `fate.' It is important to realise that the Stoic God does not craft its world in accordance with its plan from the outside, as the demiurge in Plato's Timaeus is described as doing. Rather, the history of the universe is determined by God's activity internal to it, shaping it with its differentiated characteristics. The biological conception of God as a kind of living heat or seed from which things grow seems to be fully intended.
The first thing to develop from the conflagration are the elements. Of the four elements, the Stoics identify two as active (fire and air) and two as passive (water and earth). The active elements, or at least the principles of hot and cold, combine to form breath or pneuma. Pneuma, in turn, is the `sustaining cause' (causa continens, synektikon aition) of all existing bodies and guides the growth and development of animate bodies. What is a sustaining cause? The Stoics think that the universe is a plenum. Like Aristotle, they reject the existence of empty space or void (except that the universe as a whole is surrounded by it). Thus, one might reasonably ask, `What marks any one object off from others surrounding it?' or, `What keeps an object from constantly falling apart as it rubs elbows with other things in the crowd?' The answer is: pneuma. Pneuma, by its nature, has a simultaneous movement inward and outward which constitutes its inherent `tensility.' (Perhaps this was suggested by the expansion and contraction associated with heat and cold.) Pneuma passes through all (other) bodies; in its outward motion it gives them the qualities that they have, and in its inward motion makes them unified objects (Nemesius, 47J). In this respect, pneuma plays something of the role of substantial form in Aristotle for this too makes the thing of which it is the form both `some this,' i.e. an individual, and `what it is' (Metaph. VII, 17). Because pneuma acts, it must be a body and it appears that the Stoics stressed the fact that its blending with matter is `through and through' (Galen 47H, Alex. Aph. 48C). Perhaps as a result of this, they developed a theory of mixture which allowed for two bodies to be in the same place at the same time. It should be noted, however, that some scholars (e.g. Richard Sorabji) think that the claim that pneuma is blended through the totality of matter is a conclusion that the Stoics' critics adversely drew about what some of their statements committed them to. Perhaps instead they proposed merely that pneuma is the matter of a body at a different level of description.
Pneuma comes in gradations and endows the bodies which it pervades with different qualities as a result. The pneuma which sustains an inanimate object is called (LS) a `tenor' (hexis, lit. a holding). Pneuma in plants is, in addition, (LS) physique (phusis, lit. `nature'). In animals, pneuma gets called also soul (psychê) and in rational animals pneuma is, besides, the commanding faculty (hêgemonikon) (Diog. Laert. 47O, Philo 47P)--that responsible for thinking, planning, deciding. The Stoics assign to `physique' or `nature' all the purely physiological life functions of a human animal (such as digestion, breathing, growth etc.)--self-movement from place to place is due to soul. Their account of the human soul (mind) is strongly monistic. Though they speak of the soul's faculties, these are parts of the commanding faculty associated with the physical sense organs (Aetius, 53H). Unlike the Platonic tri-partite soul, all impulses or desires are direct functions of the rational, commanding faculty. This strongly monistic conception of the human soul has serious implications for Stoic epistemology and ethics. In the first case, our impressions of sense are affections of the commanding faculty. In mature rational animals, these impressions are thoughts, or representations with propositional content. Though a person may have no choice about whether she has a particular rational impression, there is another power of the commanding faculty which the Stoics call `assent' and whether one assents to a rational impression is a matter of volition. To assent to an impression is to take its content as true. To withhold assent is to suspend judgement about whether it is true. Because both impression and assent are part of one and the same commanding faculty, there can be no conflict between separate and distinct rational and nonrational elements within onesel--a fight which reason might lose. Compare this situation with Plato's description of the conflict between the inferior soul within us which is taken in by sensory illusions and the calculating part which is not (Rep. X, 602e). There is no reason to think that the calculating part can always win the epistemological civil war which Plato imagines to take place within us. But because the impression and assent are both aspects of one and the same commanding faculty according to the Stoics, they think that we can always avoid falling into error if only our reason is sufficiently disciplined. In a similar fashion, impulses or desires are movements of the soul toward something. In a rational creature, these are exercises of the rational faculty which do not arise without assent. Thus, a movement of the soul toward X is not automatically consequent upon the impression that X is desirable. This is what the Stoics' opponents, the Academic Skeptics, argue against them is possible (Plutarch, 69A.) The Stoics, however, claim that there will be no impulse toward X--much less an action--unless one assents to the impression (Plutarch, 53S). The upshot of this is that all desires are not only (at least potentially) under the control of reason, they are acts of reason. Thus there could be no gap between forming the decisive judgement that one ought to do X and an effective impulse to do X.
Since pneuma is a body, there is a sense in which the Stoics have a materialist theory of mind. The pneuma which is a person's soul is subject to generation and destruction (Plutarch 53 C, Eusebius 53W). Unlike for the Epicureans, however, it does not follow from this that my soul will be destroyed at the time at which my body dies. Chrysippus alleged that the souls of the wise would not perish until the next conflagration (Diog. Laert. 7.157 = SVF 2.811, not in LS). Is this simply a failure of nerve on the part of an otherwise thorough-going materialist? Recall that the distinctive movement of pneuma is its simultaneous inward and outward motion. It is this which makes it tensile and capable of preserving, organising and, in some cases, animating the bodies which it interpenetrates. The Stoics equate virtue with wisdom and both with a kind of firmness or tensile strength within the commanding faculty of the soul (Arius Didymus 41H, Plutarch 61B, Galen 65T). Perhaps the thought was that the souls of the wise had a sufficient tensile strength that they could subsist as a distinct body on their own. Later Stoics like Panaetius (2nd c. BC) and Posidonius (first half 1st c. BC) may have abandoned this view of Chrysippus'.
The Stoics express their commitment to causal determinism in a potentially misleading way. They treat the claim that "all things happen through antecedent causes" as an alternative formulation of the claim that "all things happen through fate" (kath heimarmenên). But, in fact, the Stoics do not accept the doctrine that modern philosophers call fatalism. The matter is doubly confused, because the modern arguments for fatalism often emerge from the very considerations about bivalence that Aristotle discusses in On Interpretation. The classic example is Richard Taylor's argument. One way to see the difference between Taylor's fatalism and Chrysippus' causal determinism, is to ask, "What makes it the case that we won't have a sea battle tomorrow?" The Chrysippean causal determinist can say, "the lack of wind" or perhaps even "our decision not to go out and fight" and these things could all have been different, if only things had been different at some earlier time. So, though the present state of affairs determines that the future will only be one way, nonetheless there is a sense in which other things are possible (Alex. Aph., 38H). The fatalist responds that what makes it the case that we will not fight tomorrow is the fact that the proposition S, "There will not be a sea battle on such and such a date," has always been true. Much turns on what one says about the modal status of this truth. Is the proposition "It is true that not-S" itself necessary? Diodorus Cronus, against whom Chrysippus argued, claimed that (1) truths about the past are necessary: it is not merely that they aren't other than they are--they can't be other than they are, for nothing has the power to change the past (Epictetus, 38A). He also claimed that (2) nothing impossible follows from what is possible. In the so-called Master Argument, he attempted to show that these two theses were incompatible with the claim that (3) there is something which is possible, but yet does not happen. The details of the Master Argument are a matter of much dispute. We know that it was alleged to show that these three propositions formed an inconsistent triad, but exactly how it did this remains uncertain. We also know that Diodorus' manner of resolving this inconsistency was to reject (3) and to define the possible as that which is or will be the case. Now consider our sea battle which will not take place tomorrow. If "there is a sea battle on such and such a date" is now false and will not be true, then by Diodorus' lights, it is impossible (Boethius, 38C)! Chrysippus felt the need to preserve the thesis that there are things which are possible but which do not happen. To this end, he rejected the proposition (2) that what is impossible does not follow from what is possible, using the following example: consider the conditional "if Dion is dead, then this one is dead" when ostensive reference is being made to Dion. The antecedent is possible, since Dion will one day be dead. Hence, let us suppose it true. Then, by modus ponens, it follows that "this one is dead." However, the proposition that "this one is dead" is impossible (necessarily false), since one cannot make the requisite ostensive reference to a dead man so as to make it true that "this one [i.e. the (living) thing I'm pointing to] is dead," for a dead person isn't the same thing as what was there previously (Alex. Aph., 38F). This may appear utterly ad hoc, and it is possibly wrong, given the Stoics' views about `sayables' (lekta); but it is exactly the response that Chrysippus should make. It once again illustrates the systematic character of Stoic philosophy.
With respect to language, the Stoics distinguish between the signification, the signifier and the name-bearer. Two of these are bodies: the signifier which is the utterance and the name-bearer which gets signified. The signification, however, is an incorporeal thing called a lekton, or `sayable,' and it, and neither of the other two, is what is true or false (Sextus Empiricus, 33B). They define a sayable as "that which subsists in accordance with a rational impression." Rational impressions are those alterations of the commanding faculty whose content can be exhibited in language. Presumably `graphei Sôkratês' and `Socrates writes' exhibit the contents of one and the same rational impression in different languages. At first glance, this looks very like a modern theory of propositions. But propositions (axiômata) are only one subspecies of sayables. Sayables also include questions and commands on the one hand, and, in a category of sayables called `incomplete,' the Stoics include predicates and incomplete expressions like `graphei' (he or she writes) (Diog. Laert., 33F). An incomplete sayable like `writes' gets transformed into a proposition by being attached to a nominative case (ptôsis, Diog. Laert., 33G). Here a `nominative case' seems to mean the signification of the inflected word, Sôkratês' or `ho anthrôpos'--the nominative case (as we would say) of the Greek word `man'. The Stoic doctrine of case is one of those areas where there is as yet little consensus. Stoic propositions are unlike propositions in contemporary theories in another way too: Stoic sayables are not timelessly true or false. If it is now daytime, the lekton corresponding to an utterance of `it is day' is true. Tonight, however, it will be false (cf. Alex. Aph. in Simplicius, 37K). Finally, the Stoic theory gives a certain kind of priority to propositions involving demonstratives. `This one is writing' is definite, while `someone is writing' is indefinite. Strikingly, `Socrates is writing' is said to be intermediate between these two. When there is a failure of reference, the Stoics say that the lekton is destroyed and this is supposed to provide the reason why `this one is dead' (spoken in relation to Dion) is impossible (necessarily false).
Perhaps the most famous topic considered under the Stoic heading of logic is that of the criterion of truth and the Stoics' disputes with the skeptical New Academy about it. According to Chrysippus, the criterion of truth is the `cognitive impression' (phantasia katalêptikê, lit. an impression that firmly grasps its object) (Diog. Laert., 40A). A criterion or canon of truth is an instrument for definitely determining that something is true, and the Hellenistic schools all provide some view on how it is that we are to measure or evaluate whether something is true or not. The Stoics' cognitive impression is an impression which (according to Zeno's definition, cf. Cicero, SVF I.59) "arises from that which is; is stamped and impressed in accordance with that very thing; and of such a kind as could not arise from what is not" (Sextus Empiricus, 40E). Recall that among the powers of the commanding faculty is the capacity to assent or withhold assent to impressions. The fact that it is always within our power to withhold assent means that if we are sufficiently disciplined, we are capable of avoiding error. In itself, it does not mean that we are capable of attaining knowledge, for there might not be any impressions that one can be confident in assenting to. The cognitive impression was supposed to fill that role: when you experience one of these, provided that you recognize it as such, you can, on its basis, assert definitely that the matter in question is true. It was initially supposed that such an impression commanded one's assent by its very nature: it "all but seizes us by the hair" and drags us to assent. But this optimistic assessment seems to have been qualified in the face of criticism by members of the Skeptical Academy--perhaps, even if there are such impressions, it is not so easy to be sure when one is experiencing one.
However, the Stoics do not maintain that the mere having of a cognitive impression constitutes knowledge (epistêmê). Indeed, not even assent to such an impression amounts to knowledge: this is only cognition or grasp (katalêpsis) of some individual fact. Real knowledge (epistêmê) requires cognition which is secure, firm and unchangeable by reason (Sextus Empiricus, 41C)--and, furthermore, worked into to a systematic whole with other such cognitions (Arius Didymus, 41H). Weak and changeable assent to a cognitive impression is only an act of ignorance. It is not entirely clear where opinion or belief in general (doxa) stands in this categorization. Most Stoic sources define it as `assent to the incognitive' (i.e. to an impression that does not firmly grasp its object) (see Sextus Empiricus, 41E) but some suggest that changeable assent to a cognitive impression might still count as opinion. There is a potential for serious confusion when we try to assimilate the Stoic view to contemporary epistemology. Modern definitions of knowledge make the agent's belief that P a necessary but not sufficient condition for knowing that P. For the Stoics, doxa (involving `weak' assent) and knowledge are incompatible. In any event, there is an absolute distinction between the wise and the ignorant. Only the Stoic sage's assent to cognitive impressions clearly counts as knowledge for only a sage has the proper discipline always to avoid withdrawing assent, or assenting to things that one shouldn't. The Stoics call this epistemic virtue `non-precipitancy' (aproptôsia) and it underlies their claim that the Stoic sage never makes mistakes (41D).
The Skeptics responded by denying the existence of cognitive impressions. According to Arcesilaus, "no impression arising from something true is such that an impression arising from something false could not also be just like it" (Cicero, 40D). So Arcesilaus denies that the third conjunct of the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression is ever satisfied. We can distinguish two specific tactics for denying this. First, the Skeptics point to cases of insanity. In his madness, Heracles had the impression that his children were, in fact, the children of his enemy Eurystheus and killed them. Since the impression must have been utterly convincing to him at the time at which he had it (judging by his subsequent action), it is clear from this that there can be false impressions which are indistinguishable from ones that are allegedly "stamped and impressed in accordance with that very thing" (Sextus Empiricus, 41H). Their second line of attack was to draw attention to objects which are so similar as to be indistinguishable (so that a completely accurate impression from one would be indistinguisable from one from the other). The story is related (Diog. Laert., 40F) that the Stoic philosopher Sphaerus (a student of Zeno's) was tricked into thinking that wax pomegranates were real. This was again supposed to show thay there could be impressions arising from what is not [sc. a pomegranate] which are indistinguishable from a cognitive impression.
The Stoics met these arguments by first pointing out that Heracles' inability to distinguish cognitive from incognitive impressions in his madness says nothing about the capacities of normal human beings. It is no part of their thesis that just anyone can distinguish between cognitive and incognitive impressions. Their response to the second line of attack was two-fold. The first is a metaphysically motivated answer: if any two objects really were indistinguishable, they would be identical. This doctrine has come to be known as the identity of indiscernibles. They also replied that the Stoic sage would withhold assent in cases where things are too similar to be confident that one had it right (Cicero, 40I)--Sphaerus' response to his predicament was to say that he only assented to the proposition that it was `reasonable' that what he was presented with were pomegranates (and that was true!).
In some ways, the Stoics have an easier time with Skeptical objections than contemporary non-skeptics do. At bottom what the Stoics are committed to is the two-fold view that it is within our power to avoid falling into error and that there is a kind of impression which reveals to us the world as it really is and which is different from those impressions which might not so reveal the world. They are manifestly not committed to defending our ordinary intuitions about the range of knowledge: that most people in fact know most of the things that they and everyone else thinks that they know. The only person we can be sure has any knowledge is the Stoic sage and sages are as rare as the phoenix (Alex. Aph., 61N). Everyone else is equally ignorant. This absolute distinction between the wise and the ignorant is a consequence of the Stoic definition of knowledge as the "cognition which is secure and unchangeable by reason" (Arius Didymus, 41H). Either one's cognition is like this or it is not. By making opinion a kind of ignorance (contrast Plato, Rep V. 474a ff), they do not allow room for an intermediate state between the wise man and all the rest of us.
But if we leave aside the question of whether we in fact know anything, there are some serious puzzles about the cognitive impression. The Stoics insist that the cognitive impression not only "arises from what is and is stamped and impressed in accordance" with the thing from which it arises, but also that it is "such as could not arise from that which is not." But it seems that we can imagine all kinds of situations in which we might be in a position where the sense impressions that we have are indistinguishable from ones that misrepresent the world. Thus, consider Descartes' evil demon hypothesis or its modern counterpart, the brain in a vat scenario. In the latter example it is stipulated that electrical stimulation of your brain by incredibly clever but unscrupulous scientists produces sense impressions that are indistinguishable from the ones that you are presently having. Surely here we have a demonstration that there could not be a true impression which is such that it could not arise from what is not. No sane person thinks that these skeptical hypotheses are actually true. The point is rather that if one of them were true, our sense experience would be indistinguishable from what (we take to be) our true and accurate sense impressions of real tables, chairs and fireplaces. Doesn't this show that there is no such thing as a cognitive impression?
One thing to note in passing is that skeptical scenarios like the evil demon or the brain in the vat did not seem to figure in the debate between the Stoics and Skeptics. The Skeptics press the point that at the time the dream may be completely convincing to the dreamer, even if she does not believe that the events actually transpired when she awakes (Cicero, Lucullus or Academica II, 88). They do not consider thought experiments in which all our sense experience is systematically misleading. But if we set this aside, there will still be one important difference between a clear and distinct impression that arises from a real fireplace and one that arises from the manipulation of my neurons by unscrupulous brain scientists. The first is caused by a fireplace, while the second is caused by some other means. When the Stoics say that a cognitive impression is "of such a sort as could not arise from what is not," they can be interpreted to mean that the true clear and distinct impression will be different from a false one. They might deny that the difference between the two is always something that can be discerned from the subject's point of view. If this is so, then the Stoics' position would be somewhat akin to externalist theories of knowledge or justification. Externalists insist that an agent might know a proposition or be justified in believing a proposition even when, nonetheless, the evidence for that belief is not subjectively available to the person. So, on one early externalist theory of knowledge, it was suggested that an agent might know a certain sort of proposition (e.g. that there is a fireplace here) if their belief that there is a fireplace here was caused by a reliable causal process (e.g. a normal visual system)--and not, e.g., by the interventions of wicked scientists.
So where does this leave the matter? If this is the right way to understand the definition of the Stoic cognitive impression, then it would seem that they win their argument with the Skeptics. Examples of false impressions that are subjectively indiscernible from clear and distinct, true, ones do not show that there are no cognitive impressions. However, the admission that a cognitive impression might be subjectively indistinguishable from a false impression does alter the sense in which the cognitive impression can serve as a criterion of truth. Assent to a cognitive impression will guarantee that what you assent to is true. But, because cognitive impressions can be indistinguishable from the subject's point of view from false ones, the Stoics can no longer say that even the sage can be confident that what seems to be a cognitive impression actually is one. Thus instead of automatically commanding assent, the cognitive impression (according to later Stoics) commands assent "if there is no impediment" (Sextus Empiricus, 40K), and if it has been successfully "tested" and is "irreversible" (cf. Sextus Empiricus, 69E). This means that I should only assent to what seems to me to be a cognitive impression if I have reason to believe that I'm not in a context where deceptive but convincing impressions are possible. But the Stoic sage never errs. So when will I have absolutely compelling reasons to believe that I'm not presented with a convincing but deceptive impression? For these reasons, the Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus argues that the Stoic sage will never assent to any impression. In practice, he will suspend judgement, just like the Skeptic does (41C). Another suggestion (is that the Stoic sage hedges his bets by assenting only to the impression that it is reasonable that there is fireplace here (as Sphaerus did about the pomegranates, 40F). In this case it will also be hard to see how he differs from a skeptic who takes `the reasonable' as his criterion (Sextus Empiricus, 69B).
A bit of reflection tells us that the goal that we all have is happiness or flourishing (eudaimonia). But what is happiness? The Epicureans' answer was deceptively straightforward: the happy life is the one which is most pleasant. (But their account of what the highest pleasure consists in was not at all straightforward.) Zeno's answer was "a good flow of life" (Arius Didymus, 63A) or "living in agreement," and Cleanthes clarified that with the formulation that the end was "living in agreement with nature" (Arius Didymus, 63B). Chrysippus amplified this to (among other formulations) "living in accordance with experience of what happens by nature;" later Stoics inadvisably, in response to Academic attacks, substituted such formulations as "the rational selection of the primary things according to nature." The Stoics' specification of what happiness consists in cannot be adequately understood apart from their views about value and human psychology.
The best way into the thicket of Stoic ethics is through the question of what is good, for all parties agree that possession of what is genuinely good secures a person's happiness. The Stoics claim that whatever is good must benefit its possessor under all circumstances. But there are situations in which it is not to my benefit to be healthy or wealthy. (We may imagine that if I had money I would spend it on heroin which would not benefit me.) Thus, things like money are simply not good, in spite of how nearly everyone speaks, and the Stoics call them `indifferents' (Diog. Laert., 58A)--i.e., neither good nor bad. The only things that are good are the characteristic excellences or virtues of human beings (or of human minds): prudence or wisdom, justice, courage and moderation, and other related qualities. These are the first two of the `Stoic paradoxes' discussed by Cicero in his short work of that title: that only what is noble or fine or morally good (kalon) is good at all, and that the possession (and exercise) of the virtues is both necessary and sufficient for happiness. But the Stoics are not such lovers of paradox that they are willing to say that my preference for wealth over poverty in most circumstances is utterly groundless. They draw a distinction between what is good and things which have value (axia). Some indifferent things, like health or wealth, have value and therefore are to be preferred, even if they are not good, because they are typically appropriate, fitting or suitable (oikeion) for us.
Impulse, as noted above, is a movement of the soul toward an object. Though these movements are subject to the capacity for assent in fully rational creatures, impulse is present in all animate (self-moving) things from the moment of birth. The Stoics argue that the original impulse of ensouled creatures is toward what is appropriate for them, or aids in their self-preservation, and not toward what is pleasurable, as the Epicureans contend. Because the whole of the world is identical with the fully rational creature which is God, each part of it is naturally constituted so that it seeks what is appropriate or suitable to it, just as our own body parts are so constituted as to preserve both themselves and the whole of which they are parts. The Stoic doctrine of the natural attachment to what is appropriate (oikeiôsis) thus provides a foundation in nature for an objective ordering of preferences, at least on a prima facie basis. Other things being equal, it is objectively preferable to have health rather than sickness. The Stoics call things whose preferability is overridden only in very rare circumstances "things according to nature." As we mature, we discover new things which are according to our natures. As infants perhaps we only recognised that food and warmth are appropriate to us, but since humans are rational, more than these basic necessities are appropriate to us. The Greek term `oikeion' can mean not only what is suitable, but also what is akin to oneself, standing in a natural relation of affection. Thus, my blood relatives are--or least ought to be--oikeioi. It is partly in this sense that we eventually come to the recognition--or at least ought to--that other people, insofar as they are rational, are appropriate to us. Cicero's quotation of Terence's line `nothing human is alien to me' in the context of On Duties I.30 echoes this thought. More generally, the unfolding of God's providential plan is rational (and therefore beneficial) through and through, so that in some sense what will in fact happen to me in accordance with that plan must be appropriate to me.
When we take the rationality of the world order into consideration, we can begin to understand the Stoic formulations of the goal or end. "Living in agreement with nature" is meant to work at a variety of levels. Since my nature is such that health and wealth are appropriate to me (according to my nature), other things being equal, I ought to choose them. Hence the formulations of the end by later Stoics stress the idea that happiness consists in the rational selection of the things according to nature. But, we must bear in mind an important caveat here. Health and wealth are not the only things which are appropriate to me. So are other rational beings and it would be irrational to choose one thing which is appropriate to me without due consideration of the effect of that choice on other things which are also appropriate to me. This is why the later formulations stress that happiness consists in the rational selection of the things according to nature. But if I am faced with a choice between increasing my wealth (something which is prima facie appropriate to my nature) and preserving someone else's health (which is something appropriate to something which is appropriate to me, i.e. another rational being), which course of action is the rational one? The Stoic response is that it is the one which is ultimately both natural and rational: that is, the one that, so far as I can tell from my experience with what happens in the course of nature (see Chrysippus' formula for the end cited above, 63B), is most in agreement with the unfolding of nature's rational and providential plan. Living in agreement with nature in this sense can even demand that I select things which are not typically appropriate to my nature at all--when that nature is considered in isolation from these particular circumstances. Here Chrysippus' remark about what his foot would will if it were conscious is apposite.
As long as the future is uncertain to me I always hold to those things which are better adapted to obtaining the things in accordance with nature; for God himself has made me disposed to select these. But if I actually knew that I was fated now to be ill, I would even have an impulse to be ill. For my foot too, if it had intelligence, would have an impulse to get muddy. (Epictetus, 58J)We too, as rational parts of rational nature, ought to choose in accordance with what will in fact happen (provided we can know what that will be, which we rarely can--we are not gods; outcomes are uncertain to us) since this is wholly good and rational: when we cannot know the outcome, we ought to choose in accordance with what is typically or usually nature's purpose, as we can see from experience of what usually does happen in the course of nature. In extreme circumstances, however, a choice, for example, to end our lives by suicide can be in agreement with nature.
So far the emphasis has been on just one component of the Stoic formulation of the goal or end of life: it is the "rational selection of the things according to nature." The other thing that needs to be stressed is that it is rational selection--not the attainment of--these things which constitutes happiness. (The Stoics mark the distinction between the way we ought to opt for health as opposed to virtue by saying that I select (eklegomai) the preferred indifferent but I choose (hairoûmai) the virtuous action.) Even though the things according to nature have a kind of value (axia) which grounds the rationality of preferring them (other things being equal), this kind of value is still not goodness. From the point of view of happiness, the things according to nature are still indifferent. What matters for our happiness is whether we select them rationally and, as it turns out, this means selecting them in accordance with the virtuous way of regarding them (and virtuous action itself). Surely one motive for this is the rejection of even the limited role that external goods and fortune play in Aristotelian ethics. According to the Peripatetics, the happy life is one in which one exercises one's moral and theoretical virtues. But one can't exercise a moral virtue like liberality (Nic. Eth. IV.1) without having some, even considerable, money. The Stoics, by contrast, claim that so long as I order (and express) my preferences in accordance with my nature and universal nature, I will be virtuous and happy, even if I do not actually get the things I prefer. Though these things are typically appropriate to me, rational choice is even more appropriate or akin to me, and so long as I have that, then I have perfected my nature. The perfection of one's rational nature is the condition of being virtuous and it is exercising this, and this alone, which is good. Since possession of that which is good is sufficient for happiness, virtuous agents are happy even if they do not attain the preferred indifferents they select.
One is tempted to think that this is simply a misuse of the word `happiness' (or would be, if the Stoics had been speaking English). We are inclined to think (and a Greek talking about eudaimonia would arguably be similarly inclined) that happiness has something to do with getting what you want and not merely ordering one's wants rationally regardless of whether they are satisfied. People are also frequently tempted to assimilate the Stoics' position to one (increasingly contested) interpretation of Kant's moral philosophy. On this reading, acting with the right motive is the only thing that is good--but being good in this sense has nothing whatsoever to do with happiness.
With respect to the first point, the Stoic sage typically selects the preferred indifferents and selects them in light of her knowledge of how the world works. There will be times when the circumstances make it rational for her to select something that is (generally speaking) contrary to her nature (e.g. cutting off one's own hand in order to thwart a tyrant). But these circumstances will be rare and the sage will not be oppressed by the additional false beliefs that this act of self-mutilation is a genuinely bad thing: only vice is genuinely bad. For the most part, her knowledge of nature and other people will mean that she attains the things that she selects. Her conditional positive attitude toward them will mean that when circumstances do conspire to bring it about that the object of her selection is not secured, she doesn't care. She only preferred to be wealthy if it was fated for her to be wealthy. These reflections illustrate the way in which the virtuous person is self-sufficient (autarkês) and this seems to be an important component of our intuitive idea of happiness. The person who is genuinely happy lacks nothing and enjoys a kind of independence from the vagaries of fortune. To this extent at least, the Stoics are not just using the word `happiness' for a condition that has nothing at all to do with what we typically mean by it. With respect to the second point, the Stoic sage will never find herself in a situation where she acts contrary to what Kant calls inclination or desire. The only thing she unconditionally wants is to live virtuously. Anything that she conditionally prefers is always subordinate to her conception of the genuine good. Thus, there is no room for a conflict between duty and happiness where the latter is thought of solely in terms of the satisfaction of our desires. Cicero provides an engaging, if not altogether rigorous, discussion of the question of whether virtue is sufficient for happiness in Tusculan Disputations, book V.
How do these general considerations about the goal of living translate into an evaluation of actions? When I perform an action that accords with my nature and for which a good reason can be given, then I perform what the Stoics call (LS) a `proper function' (kathêkon, Arius Didymus, 59B)--something that it "falls to me" to do. It is important to note that non-rational animals and plants perform proper functions as well (Diog. Laert., 59C). This shows how much importance is placed upon the idea of what accords with one's nature or, in another formulation, "activity which is consequential upon a thing's nature." It also shows the gap between proper functions and morally right actions, for the Stoics, like most contemporary philosophers, think that animals cannot act morally or immorally--let alone plants.
Most proper functions are directed toward securing things which are appropriate to nature. Thus, if I take good care of my body, then this is a proper function. The Stoics divide proper functions into those which do not depend upon circumstances and those that do. Taking care of one's health is among the former, while mutilating oneself is among the latter (Diog. Laert., 59E). It appears that this is an attempt to work out a set of prima facie duties based upon our natures. Other things being equal, looking after one's health is a course of action which accords with one's nature and thus is one for which a good reason can be given. However, there are circumstances in which a better reason can be given for mutilating oneself--for instance, if this is the only way you can prevent Fagin from compelling you to steal for him.
Since both ordinary people and Stoic wise men look after their health except in very extraordinary circumstances, both the sage and the ordinary person perform proper functions. A proper function becomes a fully correct action (katorthôma) only when it is perfected as an action of the specific kind to which it belongs, and so is done virtuously. In the tradition of Socratic moral theory, the Stoics regard virtues like courage and justice, and so on, as knowledge or science within the soul about how to live. Thus a specific virtue like moderation is defined as "the science (epistêmê) of what is to be chosen and what is to be avoided and what is neither of these" (Arius Didymus, 61H). More broadly, virtue is "an expertise (technê) concerned with the whole of life" (Arius Didymus, 61G). Like other forms of knowledge, virtues are characters of the soul's commanding faculty which are firm and unchangeable. The other similarity with Socratic ethics is that the Stoics think that the virtues are really just one state of soul (Plutarch , 61B, C; Arius Didymus, 61D). No one can be moderate without also being just, courageous and prudent as well--moreover, "anyone who does any action in accordance with one does so in accordance with them all" (Plutarch, 61F). When someone who has any virtue, and therefore all the virtues, performs any proper function, he performs it in accordance with virtue or virtuously (i.e. with all the virtues) and this transforms it into a right action or a perfect function. The connection here between a perfect function and a virtuous one is almost analytic in Greek ethical theorizing. Virtues just are those features which make a thing a good thing of its kind or allow it to perform its function well. So, actions done in accordance with virtue are actions which are done well. The Stoics draw the conclusion from this that the wise (and therefore virtuous) person does everything within the scope of moral action well (Arius Didymus, 61G). This makes it seem far less strange than it might at first appear to say that virtue is sufficient for happiness. Furthermore, because virtue is a kind of knowledge and there is no cognitive state between knowledge and ignorance, those who are not wise do everything equally badly. Strictly speaking, there is no such thing as moral progress for the Stoics (if that means progress within morality), and they give the charming illustration of drowning to make their point: a person an arm's length from the surface is drowning every bit as surely as one who is five hundred fathoms down (Plutarch, 61T). Of course, as the analogy also suggests, it is possible to be closer or farther from finally being able to perform proper functions in this perfected way. In that sense, progress is possible.
We are finally in a position to understand and evaluate the Stoic view on emotions, since it is a consequence of their views on the soul and the good. It is perhaps more accurate to call it the Stoic view of the passions, though this is a somewhat dated term. The passions or pathê are literally `things which one undergoes' and are to be contrasted with actions or things that one does. Thus, the view that one should be `apathetic,' in its original Hellenistic sense, is not the view that you shouldn't care about anything, but rather the view that you should not be psychologically subject to anything--manipulated and moved by it, rather than yourself being actively and positively in command of your reactions and responses to things as they occur or are in prospect. It connotes a kind of complete self-sufficiency. The Stoics distinguish two primary passions: appetite and fear. These arise in relation to what appears to us to be good or bad. They are associated with two other passions: pleasure and distress. These result when we get or fail to avoid the objects of the first two passions. What distinguishes these states of soul from normal impulses is that they are "excessive impulses which are disobedient to reason" (Arius Didymus, 65A). Part of what this means is that one's fear of dogs may not go away with the rational recognition that this blind, 16 year old, 3 legged Yorkshire terrier poses no threat to you. But this is not all. The Stoics call a passion like distress a fresh opinion that something bad is present (Andronicus, 65B): you may have been excitedly delighted when you first saw you'd won the race, but after a while, when the impression of the victory is no longer fresh, you may calm down. Recall that opinion is assent to a false impression. Given the Stoics' view about good and bad, as against merely indifferent things, the only time that one should assent to the impression that something bad is present is when there is something which might threaten one's virtue, for this and this alone is good. Thus all passions involve an element of false value-judgement. But these are false judgements which are inseparable from physiological changes in the pneuma which constitutes one's commanding faculty. The Stoics describe these changes as shrinkings (like fear) or swellings (like delight), and part of the reason that they locate the commanding faculty in the heart (rather than the head, as Plato in the Timaeus and many medical writers did) is that this seems to be where the physical sensations which accompany passions like fear are manifested. Taking note of this point of physiology is surely necessary to give their theory any plausibility. From the inside a value-judgement--even one like "this impending dog bite will be bad"--might often just not feel like such an emotional state as fear. But when the judgement is vivid and so the commanding faculty is undergoing such a change, one can readily enough see that the characteristic sensations might inexorably accompany the judgement.
Another obvious objection to the Stoic theory is that someone who fears, say pigeons, may not think that they are dangerous. We say that she knows rationally that pigeons are harmless but that she has an irrational fear. It might be thought that in such a case, the judgement which the Stoics think is essential to the passion is missing. Here they resort to the idea that a passion is a fluttering of the commanding faculty. At one instant my commanding faculty judges (rightly) that this pigeon is not dangerous, but an instant later assents to the impression that it is and from this assent flows the excessive impulse away from the pigeon which is my fear. This switch of assent occurs repeatedly and rapidly so that it appears that one has the fear without the requisite judgement but in fact you are making it and taking it back during the time you undergo the passion (Plutarch, 65G).
It is important to bear in mind that the Stoics do not think that all impulses are to be done away with. What distinguishes normal impulses or desires from passions is the idea that the latter are excessive and irrational. Galen provides a nice illustration of the difference (65J). Suppose I want to run, or, in Stoic terminology, I have an impulse to run. If I go running down a sharp incline I may be unable to stop or change direction in response to a new impulse. My running is excessive in relation to my initial impulse. Passions are distinguished from normal impulses in much the same way: they have a kind of momentum which carries one beyond the dictates of reason. If, for instance, you are consumed with lust (a passion falling under appetite), you might not do what under other circumstances you yourself would judge to be the sensible thing.
Even in antiquity the Stoics were ridiculed for their views on the passions. Some critics called them the men of stone. But this is not entirely fair, for the Stoics allow that the sage will experience what they call the good feelings (eupatheiai, Diog. Laert. 65F). These include joy, watchfulness and wishing and are distinguished from their negative counterparts (pleasure, fear and appetite) in being well-reasoned and not excessive. Naturally there is no positive counterpart to distress. The species under wishing include kindness, generosity and warmth. A good feeling like kindness is a moderate and reasonable stretching or expansion of the soul presumably prompted by the correct judgement that other rational beings are appropriate to oneself.
Criticisms of the Stoic theory of the passions in antiquity focused on two issues. The first was whether the passions were, in fact, activities of the rational soul. The medical writer and philosopher Galen defended the Platonic account of emotions as a product of an irrational part of the soul. Posidonius, a 1st c. BC Stoic, also criticised Chrysippus on the psychology of emotions, and developed a position that recognized the influence in the mind of something like Plato's irrational soul-parts. The other opposition to the Stoic doctrine came from philosophers in the Aristotelian tradition. They, like the Stoics, made judgement a component in emotions. But they argued that the happy life required the moderation of the passions, not their complete extinction. Cicero's Tusculan Disputations, books III and IV take up the question of whether it is possible and desirable to rid oneself of the emotions.
Whereas Zeno of Citium, son of Mnaseas, has for many years been devoted to philosophy in the city and has continued to be a man of worth in all other respects, exhorting to virtue and temperance those of the youth who came to him to be taught, directing them to what is best, affording to all in his own conduct a pattern for imitation in perfect consistency with his teaching ... (Diog. Laert. 7.10-11, tr. Hicks)Of course the citizens of Athens couldn't have honoured Zeno for a life lived in consistency with his philosophical principles unless the content of those principles was known to the general public. Since the Stoics gathered, discussed and taught philosophy in a public place, the general import of their philosophy was widely known. Stoicism became a "popular philosophy" in a way that neither Platonism nor Aristotelianism ever did. In part this is because Stoicism, like its rival Epicureanism, addressed the questions that most people are concerned with in very direct and practical ways. It tells you how you should regard death, suffering, great wealth, poverty, power over others and slavery. In the political and social context of the Hellenistic period (where a person could move between these extremes in very short order) Stoicism provided a psychological fortress which was secure from bad fortune. Historians of philosophy earlier in this century regarded this as a mark against Hellenistic philosophy generally. The notion was that philosophy peaked with Plato and Aristotle and then degenerated into the popular "feel good" philosophy of the Hellenistic period and did not approach its earlier glory again until Plotinus. It may be true that the lack of political autonomy in the Greek city states made the ideal of the self-sufficient Stoic sage appear more relevant and desirable. But even if the philosophy suited the times, the Stoics and Epicureans provided arguments for their view which still have interest for us who live in a social and political context that is quite different. (Or perhaps not so different. I suppose it depends on how pessimistic you are about the possibilities for self-determination for individuals and small communities in the age of globalization.)
At the political level, the Antigonid dynasty (which ruled Greece and Macedon from shortly after the death of Alexander to 168 BC) had connections with the Stoic philosophers. Antigonus Gonatas was alleged to have been a pupil of Zeno of Citium. He requested that Zeno serve as the tutor to his son, Demetrius, but Zeno excused himself on the ground that he was too old for the job. The man he sent instead, Persaeus, was deeply involved in affairs at court and, according to some sources, died in battle at Corinth in the service of Antigonus. Another Hellenistic strong-man, Cleomenes of Sparta, had the Stoic philosopher Sphaerus as one of his advisors. The reforms instituted in Sparta (including the extension of citizenship to foreigners and the redistribution of land) were seen by some as a Stoic social reform, though it is less clear that it was anything other than an instrument of power for Cleomenes. (See Plutarch's Life of Cleomenes.) Peter Green takes a rather more cynical view of the matter (p. 248 ff), but Green is perhaps unduly hard on Stoicism generally.
In 155 BC Athens sent a delegation of three philosophers (Stoic, Academic skeptic, and Peripatetic) on an embassy to Rome--no Epicurean was included, perhaps because Epicureans refused on principle to participate in public affairs. Their teachings caused a sensation among the educated. The Skeptic Carneades addressed a crowd of thousands on one day and argued that justice was a genuine good in its own right. The next day he argued against the proposition that it was in an agent's interest to be just in terms every bit as convincing. This dazzling display of dialectical skill, together with the deep seated suspicion of philosophical culture, generated a conservative backlash against all Greek philosophers led by Marcus Porcius Cato (the Censor). By 86, however, Rome was ready to receive Greek philosophy with open arms. It was natural that an ambitious and well off Roman like Cicero should go and study at the philosophical schools in Athens and return to popularise Greek philosophy for his less cosmopolitan countrymen. Epicureanism tended to be favored in the ranks in Rome's military, while Stoicism appealed more to members of the Senate and other political movers and shakers. Many Roman politicians at least adopted the high moral tone of Stoicism according to which only virtue is a genuine good, while money, health and even life itself are simply preferred indifferents. Roman political figures associated with Stoicism include Cato the Younger and Scipio Amelianus (though some of the claims made in earlier scholarship about Greek philosophy and culture and the Scipionic Circle are now regarded with some suspicion). Marcus Brutus (the friend of Cicero who took part in the murder of Julius Caesar) professed Stoicism but was not above engaging in loan-sharking (hence the joke that he was a man of high principles and even higher interest). Pompey thought it sufficiently important to look in on the Stoic philosopher Panaetius of Rhodes in his comings and goings. Octavian (who became Augustus) had a Stoic tutor. Among the Roman emperors, the Stoic philosopher Seneca was the advisor of Nero. Helvidius Priscus advertised himself as a Stoic. When he rather unwisely criticised the Emperor Vespasian in the Senate, he was executed and all the philosophers were excluded from Rome as trouble makers. Under Domitian, they were banished from all of Italy. Clearly the worst of the Roman emperors had no use for people who did not regard death as the greatest of evils! The hostility of the Empire did not last long. Hadrian (117-138) was a friend of Greek philosophy and saw to it that his relative and his successor Antoninus' heir, Marcus Aurelius, had an education which included it. The latter's Meditations are still a good read, even if you know nothing about Stoicism but especially if you do. Marcus atoned in effect for Rome's sins against philosophy by establishing `professorships' in the four schools of philosophy in Athens and other cities in 176. In spite of this, Stoicism as a philosophical movement in its own right nearly disappears after the second century.
The influence of Stoicism on the subsequent history of philosophical and religious thought is hard to evaluate directly. The tradition of theories of natural law in ethics seems to stem directly from Stoicism. (Compare Cicero, de Legibus I, 18 with later writers like Aquinas in Summa Theologica II, 2, q. 94.) Christian theologians were certainly receptive to some of the elements of Stoicism. There was even a forged correspondence between St Paul and Seneca. (That it could ever have been thought genuine tells us something.) Augustine, alas, chose to follow the Stoics rather than the Platonists (his usual allies among the philosophers) on the question of animals' membership in the moral community (City of God 1.20). Medieval and Renaissance philosophers were acquainted with Stoicism chiefly through the writings of Seneca and Cicero. The influence of Stoicism on Medieval thought has been considered by Verbeke and Colish. I know of no study on the impact of Stoicism on Renaissance and early modern thought.
This site contains links to lots of interesting sites as well as biographical material on Zeno, Chrysippus, etc.
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First published: April 15, 1996
Content last modified: February 10, 1999