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The thesis that the choice of standard synchrony is a convention, rather than one necessitated by facts about the physical universe (within the framework of the special theory of relativity), has been argued particularly by Reichenbach (see, for example, Reichenbach, 1958, pp. 123-135) and Grünbaum (see, for example, Grünbaum, 1973, pp. 342-368). They argue that the only nonconventional basis for claiming that two distinct events are not simultaneous would be the possibility of a causal influence connecting the events. In the pre-Einsteinian view of the universe, there was no reason to rule out the possibility of arbitrarily fast causal influences, which would then be able to single out a unique event at A that would be simultaneous with E. In an Einsteinian universe, however, no causal influence can travel faster than the speed of light in vacuum, so from the point of view of Reichenbach and Grünbaum, any event at A whose time of occurrence is in the open interval between t1 and t2 could be defined to be simultaneous with E. In terms of the -notation introduced by Reichenbach, any event at A occurring at a time t1 + (t2 - t1), where 0 < < 1, could be simultaneous with E. That is, the conventionality thesis asserts that any particular choice of within its stated range is a matter of convention, including the choice = 1/2 (which corresponds to standard synchrony).
It might be argued that the definition of standard synchrony makes use only of the relation of equality (of the one-way speeds of light in different directions), so that simplicity dictates its choice rather than a choice that requires the specification of a particular value for a parameter. Grünbaum (1973, p. 356) rejects this argument on the grounds that, since the equality of the one-way speeds of light is a convention, this choice does not simplify the postulational basis of the theory but only gives a symbolically simpler representation.
It has been argued (see, for example, Janis, 1983, pp. 103-105, and Norton, 1986, p. 119) that all such schemes for establishing convention-free synchrony must fail. The argument can be summarized as follows: Suppose that clocks are set in standard synchrony, and consider the detailed space-time description of the proposed synchronization procedure that would be obtained with the use of such clocks. Next suppose that the clocks are reset in some nonstandard fashion (consistent with the causal order of events), and consider the description of the same sequence of events that would be obtained with the use of the reset clocks. In such a description, familiar laws may take unfamiliar forms, as in the case of the law of conservation of momentum in the example mentioned above. Indeed, all of special relativity has been reformulated (in an unfamiliar form) in terms of nonstandard synchronies (Winnie, 1970a and 1970b). Since the proposed synchronization procedure can itself be described in terms of a nonstandard synchrony, the scheme cannot describe a sequence of events that is incompatible with nonstandard synchrony. A comparison of the two descriptions makes clear what hidden assumptions in the scheme are equivalent to standard synchrony.
One objection to the use of the slow-transport scheme to synchronize clocks is that, until the clocks are synchronized, there is no way of measuring the one-way velocity of the transported clock. Bridgman (1962, p. 26) uses the "self-measured" velocity, determined by using the transported clock to measure the time interval, to avoid this problem. Using this meaning of velocity, he suggests (1962, pp. 64-67) a modified procedure that is equivalent to Eddington's, but does not require having started in the infinite past. Bridgman would transport a number of clocks from A to B at various velocities; the readings of these clocks at B would differ. He would then pick one clock, say the one whose velocity was the smallest, and find the differences between its reading and the readings of the other clocks. Finally, he would plot these differences against the velocities of the corresponding clocks, and extrapolate to zero velocity. Like Eddington, Bridgman does not see this scheme as contradicting the conventionality thesis. He says (1962, p.66), "What becomes of Einstein's insistence that his method for setting distant clocks -- that is, choosing the value 1/2 for -- constituted a `definition' of distant simultaneity? It seems to me that Einstein's remark is by no means invalidated."
Ellis and Bowman (1967) take a different point of view. Their means of synchronizing clocks by slow transport (1967, pp. 129-130) is again somewhat different from, but equivalent to, those already mentioned. They would place clocks at A and B with arbitrary settings. They would then place a third clock at A and synchronize it with the one already there. Next they would move this third clock to B with a velocity they refer to as the "intervening `velocity'", determined by using the clocks in place at A and B to measure the time interval. They would repeat this procedure with decreasing velocities and extrapolate to find the zero-velocity limit of the difference between the readings of the clock at B and the transported clock. Finally, they would set the clock at B back by this limiting amount. On the basis of their analysis of this procedure, they argue that, although consistent nonstandard synchronization appears to be possible, there are good physical reasons (assuming the correctness of empirical predictions of the special theory of relativity) for preferring standard synchrony. Their conclusion (as summarized in the abstract of their 1967, p. 116) is, "The thesis of the conventionality of distant simultaneity espoused particularly by Reichenbach and Grünbaum is thus either trivialized or refuted."
A number of responses to these views of Ellis and Bowman (see, for example, Grünbaum et al., 1969; Winnie, 1970b, pp. 223-228; and Redhead, 1993, pp. 111-113) argue that nontrivial conventions are implicit in the choice to synchronize clocks by the slow-transport method. For example, Grünbaum (Grünbaum et al., 1969, pp. 5-43) argues that it is a nontrivial convention to equate the time interval measured by the infinitely slowly moving clock traveling from A to B with the interval measured by the clock remaining at A and in standard synchrony with that at B, and the conclusion of van Fraassen (Grünbaum et al., 1969, p. 73) is, "Ellis and Bowman have not proved that the standard simultaneity relation is nonconventional, which it is not, but have succeeded in exhibiting some alternative conventions which also yield that simultaneity relation." Winnie (1970b), using his reformulation of special relativity in terms of arbitrary synchrony, shows explicitly that synchrony by slow-clock transport agrees with synchrony by the standard light-signal method when both are described in terms of an arbitrary value of within the range 0 < < 1, and argues that Ellis and Bowman err in having assumed the = 1/2 form of the time-dilation formula in their arguments. He concludes (Winnie, 1970b, p. 228) that "it is not possible that the method of slow-transport, or any other synchrony method, could, within the framework of the nonconventional ingredients of the Special Theory, result in fixing any particular value of to the exclusion of any other particular values." Redhead (1993) also argues that slow transport of clocks fails to give a convention-free definition of simultaneity. He says (1993, p. 112), "There is no absolute factual sense in the term `slow.' If we estimate `slow' relative to a moving frame K', then slow-clock-transport will pick out standard synchrony in K', but this ... corresponds to nonstandard synchrony in K."
Some commentators have taken Malament's theorem to have settled the debate on the side of nonconventionality. For example, Torretti (1983, p. 229) says, "Malament proved that simultaneity by standard synchronism in an inertial frame F is the only non-universal equivalence between events at different points of F that is definable (`in any sense of "definable" no matter how weak') in terms of causal connectibility alone, for a given F"; and Norton (Salmon et al., 1992, p. 222) says, "Contrary to most expectations, [Malament] was able to prove that the central claim about simultaneity of the causal theorists of time was false. He showed that the standard simultaneity relation was the only nontrivial simultaneity relation definable in terms of the causal structure of a Minkowski spacetime of special relativity."
Other commentators disagree with such arguments, however. Grünbaum (as reported by Norton in Salmon et al., 1992, p. 226) and Redhead (1993, p.114) cite Malament's need to postulate that S is an equivalence relation as a weakness in the argument. Havas (1987, p. 444) says, "What Malament has shown, in fact, is that in Minkowski space-time ... one can always introduce time-orthogonal coordinates ..., an obvious and well-known result which implies = 1/2." Janis (1983, pp. 107-109) argues that Malament's theorem leads to a unique (but different) synchrony relative to any inertial observer, that this latitude is the same as that in introducing Reichenbach's , and thus Malament's theorem should carry neither more nor less weight against the conventionality thesis than the argument (mentioned above in the last paragraph of the first section of this article) that standard synchrony is the simplest choice. Similarly, Redhead (1993, p. 114) says that "we can use the same argument as we did for slow-clock-transport to demonstrate that we are faced with a conventional choice betweeen standard synchronies defined à la Malament in all possible inertial frames." In a comprehensive review of the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity, Anderson, Vetharaniam, and Stedman (1998, pp. 124-125) claim that Malament's proof is erroneous. Although they appear to be wrong in this claim, the nature of their error highlights the fact that Malament's proof, which uses the time-symmetric relation , would not be valid if a temporal orientation were introduced into space-time (see, for example, Spirtes, 1981, Ch. VI, Sec. F; and Stein, 1991, p. 153n).
A claim that no value of other than 1/2 is mathematically possible has been put forward by Zangari (1994). He argues that spin-1/2 particles (e.g., electrons) must be represented mathematically by what are known as complex spinors, and that the transformation properties of these spinors are not consistent with the introduction of nonstandard coordinates (corresponding to values of other than 1/2). Gunn and Vetharaniam (1995), however, present a derivation of the Dirac equation (the fundamental equation describing spin-1/2 particles) using coordinates that are consistent with arbitrary synchrony. They argue that Zangari mistakenly required a particular representation of space-time points as the only one consistent with the spinorial description of spin-1/2 particles.
The debate about conventionality of simultaneity seems far from settled, although some proponents on both sides of the argument might disagree with that statement. The reader wishing to pursue the matter further should consult the sources listed below as well as additional references cited in those sources.
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First published: August 31, 1998
Content last modified: August 31, 1998