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Russell's Paradox

The most famous of the logical or set-theoretical paradoxes. The paradox arises within naive set theory by considering the set of all sets which are not members of themselves. Such a set appears to be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself.

Some sets, such as the set of teacups, are not members of themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are members of themselves. Call the set of all sets which are not members of themselves S. If S is a member of itself, then by definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if S is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a member of itself. Discovered by Bertrand Russell in 1901, the paradox prompted much work in logic, set theory and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics during the early part of this century.

History of the paradox

Russell discovered his paradox in May 1901, while working on his Principles of Mathematics (1903). Cesare Burali-Forti, an assistant to Giuseppe Peano, had discovered a similar antinomy in 1897 when he noticed that since the set of ordinals is well-ordered, it, too, must have an ordinal. However, this ordinal must be both an element of the set of ordinals and yet greater than any such element.

Russell wrote to Gottlob Frege with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of significance to Frege's logical work since, in effect, it showed that the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were inconsistent. Russell's letter arrived just as the second volume of Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The Basic Laws of Arithmetic) (1893, 1903) was in press. Immediately appreciating the difficulty that the paradox posed, Frege added an appendix to the Grundgesetze which discussed Russell's discovery. Nevertheless, he eventually felt forced to abandon many of his views as a result of the paradox. Russell himself first discusses the paradox in detail in an appendix to his Principles.

Significance of the paradox

The significance of Russell's paradox can be seen once it is realized that, using classical logic, all sentences follow from a contradiction. In the eyes of many, it therefore appeared that no mathematical proof could be trusted once it was discovered that the logic and set theory apparently underlying all of mathematics was contradictory.

The paradox itself stems from the idea that any coherent condition may be used to determine a set (or class). Attempts at resolving the paradox therefore have typically concentrated on various means of restricting the principles governing the existence of sets. Naive set theory contained the so-called unrestricted comprehension (or abstraction) axiom. This is an axiom, first introduced by Georg Cantor, to the effect that any predicate expression P(x), containing x as a free variable, will determine a set. The set's members will be exactly those objects which satisfy P(x), namely all x's which are P. It is now generally agreed that such an axiom must be either abandoned or modified.

Russell's response to the paradox is contained in his theory of types. His basic idea is that we can avoid reference to S (the set of all sets which are not members of themselves) by arranging all sentences into a hierarchy. This hierarchy will consist of sentences about individuals at the lowest level, sentences about sets of individuals at the next lowest level, sentences about sets of sets of individuals at the next lowest level, etc. It is then possible to refer to all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds only if they are all at the same level or of the same "type". Although Russell first introduced the idea of types in his Principles, the theory found its mature expression five years later in his 1908 article "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types" and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). Thus, in its details, Russell's type theory admits of two versions, the "simple theory" and the "ramified theory". Both versions have been criticized for being too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully.

Other responses to the paradox included those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference which were deemed to be absolutely certain), and Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it). Yet a fourth response to the paradox was Ernst Zermelo's 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo's axioms were designed to resolve Russell's paradox by restricting Cantor's naive comprehension principle. ZF, the axiomatization generally used today, is a modification of Zermelo's theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

These four responses to the paradox, in turn, have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical results which are today commonly associated with them.


Related Entries

Cantor, Georg | Frege, Gottlob | Frege's logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | paradox | Peano, Giuseppe | Principia Mathematica | Russell, Bertrand | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North

Copyright © 1995, 1997 by
A. D. Irvine

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First published: December 8, 1995
Content last modified: August 18, 1997