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Some sets, such as the set of teacups, are not members of
themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are
members of themselves. Call the set of all sets which are not members
of themselves *S*. If *S* is a member of itself, then by
definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if *S*
is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a member of
itself. Discovered by Bertrand Russell in
1901, the paradox prompted much work in logic, set
theory and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics during the
early part of this century.

Russell wrote to Gottlob Frege with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of significance to Frege's logical work since, in effect, it showed that the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were inconsistent. Russell's letter arrived just as the second volume of Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The Basic Laws of Arithmetic) (1893, 1903) was in press. Immediately appreciating the difficulty that the paradox posed, Frege added an appendix to the Grundgesetze which discussed Russell's discovery. Nevertheless, he eventually felt forced to abandon many of his views as a result of the paradox. Russell himself first discusses the paradox in detail in an appendix to his Principles.

The paradox itself stems from the idea that any coherent condition may
be used to determine a set (or class). Attempts at resolving the
paradox therefore have typically concentrated on various means of
restricting the principles governing the existence of sets. Naive set
theory contained the so-called unrestricted comprehension (or
abstraction) axiom. This is an axiom, first introduced by Georg
Cantor, to the effect that any predicate expression
*P*(*x*), containing *x* as a free variable, will
determine a set. The set's members will be exactly those objects which
satisfy *P*(*x*), namely all *x*'s which are
*P*. It is now generally agreed that such an axiom must be either
abandoned or modified.

Russell's response to the paradox is contained in his theory of
types. His basic idea is that we can avoid reference to *S* (the
set of all sets which are not members of themselves) by arranging all
sentences into a hierarchy. This hierarchy will consist of sentences
about individuals at the lowest level, sentences about sets of
individuals at the next lowest level, sentences about sets of sets of
individuals at the next lowest level, etc. It is then possible to
refer to all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds
only if they are all at the same level or of the same "type". Although
Russell first introduced the idea of types in his
Principles, the theory found its mature expression five
years later in his 1908 article "Mathematical Logic as Based on the
Theory of Types" and in the monumental work he co-authored with
Alfred North Whitehead,
Principia Mathematica
(1910, 1912, 1913). Thus, in its details,
Russell's type theory admits of two versions, the "simple theory" and
the "ramified theory". Both versions have been criticized for being
too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully.

Other responses to the paradox included those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference which were deemed to be absolutely certain), and Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it). Yet a fourth response to the paradox was Ernst Zermelo's 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo's axioms were designed to resolve Russell's paradox by restricting Cantor's naive comprehension principle. ZF, the axiomatization generally used today, is a modification of Zermelo's theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

These four responses to the paradox, in turn, have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical results which are today commonly associated with them.

- Frege, Gottlob (1902) "Letter to Russell", in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1967, 126-128.
- Frege, Gottlob (1903) "The Russell Paradox", in Frege, Gottlob, The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964, 127-143.
- Russell, Bertrand (1902) "Letter to Frege", in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 124-125.
- Russell, Bertrand (1903) "Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types", in Russell, Bertrand, Principles of Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903, 523-528.
- Russell, Bertrand (1908) "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types", American Journal of Mathematics, 30, 222-262. Repr. in Russell, Bertrand, Logic and Knowledge, London: Allen & Unwin, 1956, 59-102, and in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 152-182.
- Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell (1910, 1912, 1913) Principia Mathematica, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Second edition, 1925 (Vol. 1), 1927 (Vols 2, 3). Abridged as Principia Mathematica to *56, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962.

A. D. Irvine

*First published: December 8, 1995*

*Content last modified: August 18, 1997*