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Propositions are thought to perform a number of other functions in addition to being the primary bearers of truth and falsity and the things expressed by collections of declarative sentences in virtue of which all members of the collection "say the same thing". Propositions are thought to be the things we doubt and know. They are the bearers of modal properties, such as being necessary and possible. Some of them are the things that ought to be true.
That propositions perform these various functions is agreed upon by virtually all advocates of propositions. There is considerably less agreement concerning the nature of the things, propositions, that perform these functions.
To say that propositions are structured is to say something about the nature of propositions. Roughly, to say that propositions are structured is to say that they are complex entities, entities having parts or constituents, where the constituents are bound together in a certain way. So this view allows that different propositions may have the very same parts or constituents, but have them differently bound together. For example, a structured proposition theorist might hold that the following two sentences express propositions that have precisely the same constituents, but are nonetheless distinct in virtue of having those constituents bound together in different ways:
Jason loves Patti.The idea would be that since both sentences contain the same words and the words in question make the same contributions to both propositions, both propositions have the same constituents. However, corresponding to the fact that the words are combined differently in the two sentences, these constituents are bound together differently in the two propositions.
Patti loves Jason.
What has been said so far should make clear that particular accounts of structured propositions can differ in at least two ways: 1) they can differ as to what sorts of things are the constituents of structured propositions; and 2) they can differ as to what binds these constituents together in a proposition.
Complex linguistic expressions are also associated with senses. And Frege held that the sense of a complex expression is a function of the senses of its simple parts and how they are put together. Frege called propositions thoughts (Gedanken), and held that the thought/proposition expressed by a sentence is itself a sense. And the proposition/thought expressed by a sentence is a function of the senses of the words in the sentence and how they are put together.
Now Frege appears to hold the stronger view that the sense of a sentence (proposition/thought) has as constituents the senses of the words in the sentence. And as the following quotation shows, his account of how these sense-constituents are held together in the proposition/thought depends on different kinds of linguistic expressions having different kinds of senses:
For not all parts of a thought can be complete; at least one must be `unsaturated', or predicative; otherwise they would not hold together. For example, the sense of the phrase `the number 2' does not hold together with that of the expression `the concept prime number' without a link. We apply such a link in the sentence `the number 2 falls under the concept prime number'; it is contained in the words `falls under', which need to be completed in two ways--by a subject and an accusative; and only because their sense is thus `unsaturated' are they capable of serving as a link. (`On Concept and Object', p. 54)Thus Frege's view was that propositions are complex entities whose parts are other senses. The proposition is held together in virtue of the fact that at least one of the senses is unsaturated (Frege sometimes also says predicative, or in need of supplementation). The complete or saturated senses "saturate" or complete the unsaturated senses and in so doing are bound to them to form the proposition/thought. Thus, on Frege's view, the mechanism for binding together the constituents of a structured proposition is built right into some of the constituents.
Whatever may be an object of thought, or may occur in any true or false proposition ...I call a term. ...A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimæra, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term; and to deny that such and such a thing is a term must always be false. (Principles of Mathematics, p. 43)Thus we already see that Russell differs from Frege on what kinds of things can be constituents of propositions. For Frege, all constituents of propositions are senses. For Russell, a man or a mountain can be a constituent of a proposition. In a now famous correspondence with Frege, Russell replied to Frege's assertion that the sense of the name `Mont Blanc', and not Mont Blanc itself "with its snowfields", occurs in the proposition/thought that Mont Blanc is 4,000 meters high, by saying:
I believe that in spite of all its snowfields Mont Blanc itself is a component part of what is actually asserted in the proposition `Mont Blanc is more than 4,000 metres high'. (Letter to Frege of December 12, 1904, published in G. Gabriel, et al., 1980, p. 169)Russell goes on to distinguish two kinds of terms or propositional constituents:
Among terms, it is possible to distinguish two kinds, which I shall call respectively things and concepts. The former are the terms indicated by proper names, the latter those indicated by all other words. (Principles of Mathematics, p. 44)So for Russell, all propositional constituents are things or concepts. On Russell's view, a sentence such as "Socrates is human" expresses a proposition with three constituents, corresponding to the three words in the sentence. Socrates himself is one of the constituents, the other two constituents being the concepts contributed by `is' and `human'.
Having seen that Russell held different kinds of things to be constituents of propositions than did Frege, we shall turn to his views on what binds together the constituents of structured propositions. Russell appears to hold that the propositional contributions of verbs (which contributions Russell often calls verbs) hold together the constituents of propositions. Thus he writes:
Consider, for example, the proposition `A differs from B'. The constituents of this proposition, if we analyze it, appear to be only A, difference, B. Yet these constituents, thus placed side by side, do not reconstitute the proposition. The difference which occurs in the proposition actually relates A and B, whereas the difference after analysis is a notion which has no connection with A and B. (Principles of Mathematics, p. 49)And later Russell writes:
Owing to the way in which the verb [propositional contribution of a verb] actually relates the terms of a proposition, every proposition has a unity which renders it distinct from the sum of its constituents. (Principles of Mathematics, p. 52)Russell's idea that a proposition is something beyond the sum of its constituents certainly seems correct. The collection, or mereological sum, of A, difference and B is not the proposition that A differs from B. Different propositions may have the same Russellian constituents, as with the propositions expressed by our earlier sentence pair:
Jason loves Patti.However, Russell's idea that the propositional contribution of the verb binds the constituents together (in different ways in the case of our pair of sentences) is hard to understand. In the next to last quote from Russell above, he suggests that the proposition expressed by `A differs from B', whose constituents are A, difference and B, is held together by difference actually obtaining between A and B. If we call difference a relation, the proposition would consist of A standing in the relation of difference to B. Russell makes a number of remarks that suggest that this is his view. But it would seem that this cannot be correct. A standing in the relation of difference to B is what makes the proposition that A differs from B true. It is not the proposition itself, on pain of there being no false propositions. Perhaps Russell meant that propositional contributions of verbs hold propositional constituents together in some other manner. But it certainly is not clear what that manner would be.
Patti loves Jason.
The late 1950's and 1960's saw the development of a new sort of model
Because we wish the extensions of expressions to vary from possible world to possible world (at least in some cases), it is natural to associate with each expression a function (understood set theoretically) from possible worlds to extensions appropriate to that sort of expression. Thus we associate with names, functions from possible worlds to individuals; with n-place predicates functions from possible worlds to sets of n-tuples; and with sentences, functions from possible worlds to truth values. Such functions from possible worlds to extensions of the appropriate sort are often called `intensions' of the expressions in question. (See Montague  for an approach of this general sort.)
Now the intension of a sentence is a function from possible worlds to truth values. Intuitively, it maps a world to true if the sentence is true at that world. The intension of a sentence can be constructed as a function of the intensions of its parts, with the extensions of the sentence and its parts defined in terms of these intensions. Thus the intension of a sentence can be seen as the primary bearer of truth and falsity at a world: the sentence has the truth value it has at the world in virtue of its intension mapping that world to that truth value. Since propositions were traditionally held to be the primary bearers of truth and falsity, a sentence being true or false in virtue of the proposition it expressed being so, it was natural for possible world semanticists to identify propositions with functions from possible worlds to truth values (sentential intensions), or equivalently, sets of possible worlds (the set of possible worlds at which the sentence in question is true). Indeed, this identification was thought by many to vindicate the previously mysterious notion of a proposition. Possible worlds were apparently needed for the model theory of modal logic anyway; why not build propositions out of them? It should be clear that the account of propositions as sets of possible worlds is not a structured proposition account, even given the rather vague characterization of structured propositions given above. Even if we allow that possible worlds are "constituents" of the propositions (sets) they are members of, it is not the case that two propositions can have all the same constituents and yet be distinct because of having those constituents bound together differently.
Current structured proposition accounts arose out of dissatisfaction with the idea that propositions are sets of possible worlds. In fact, there were at least two quite distinct motivations for abandoning the view of propositions as sets of worlds and adopting the structured proposition account.
In order to make clear the first motivation, the notion of a
In the early 1970's, David Kaplan argued that indexicals (e.g. `I', `here', `now') and demonstratives (e.g. `that', `you', `he') are directly referential. Concerning directly referential expressions, Kaplan wrote:
For me, the intuitive idea is not that of an expression which turns out to designate the same object in all possible circumstances, but an expression whose semantical rules provide directly that the referent in all possible circumstances is fixed to be the actual referent. In typical cases the semantical rules will do this only implicitly, by providing a way of determining the actual referent, and no way of determining any other propositional component. (`Demonstratives' p. 493)Thus, a directly referential expression is a rigid designator: its associated semantic rules determine the actual referent of the expression (in a context) and when evaluating what is said by the sentence containing the expression in other possible circumstances, this same referent is always relevant. To illustrate, if I utter "I water ski" at the present time and we want to evaluate whether what I said by means of that utterance is true or false in other possible circumstances, it is my properties in those other circumstances that are relevant. Thus, `I' is rigid: when evaluating the truth or falsity of what is said by an utterance of a sentence containing `I' in counterfactual circumstances, it is the properties of whom `I' referred to in the utterance (the actual utterer) that are relevant.
Kaplan intended to contrast directly referential expressions with expressions such as definite descriptions, which, though designating particular individuals, do so by means of descriptive conditions being expressed by the description and satisfied by the designated individual. Thus Kaplan wrote that directly referential expressions "refer directly without the mediation of Fregean Sinn as meaning". (`Demonstratives', p. 483) The designation of definite descriptions is mediated by something like a Fregean sense (i.e. their associated descriptive conditions).
Of course, even if descriptions are not directly referential, some are rigid designators. For example, `the successor of 1' designates the same individual (2) in all possible worlds. So, though all directly referential expressions are rigid designators, some rigid designators are not directly referential. As was mentioned above, in a possible worlds semantics linguistic expressions are associated with intensions, functions from possible worlds to appropriate extensions. In the case of expressions designating individuals, these intensions will be functions from possible worlds to individuals. Note that all rigid designators will have intensions that are constant functions: they will be functions that map all possible worlds to the same individual. Thus possible worlds semantics tends to blur the distinction between directly referential expressions and e.g. rigid definite descriptions. To make the distinction between directly referential expressions and rigid non-directly referential expressions more vivid, Kaplan invoked the notion of structured propositions:
If I may wax metaphysical in order to fix an image, let us think of the vehicles of evaluation- the what-is-said in a given context -as propositions. Don't think of propositions as sets of possible worlds, but rather as structured entities looking something like the sentences which express them. For each occurrence of a singular term in a sentence there will be a corresponding constituent in the proposition expressed. The constituent of the proposition determines, for each circumstance of evaluation, the object relevant to evaluating the proposition in that circumstance. In general the constituent of the proposition will be some sort of complex, constructed from various attributes by logical composition. But in the case of a singular term which is directly referential, the constituent of the proposition is just the object itself. Thus it is that it does not just turn out that the constituent determines the same object in every circumstance, the constituent (corresponding to a rigid designator) just is the object. There is no determining to do at all. On this picture--and this is really a picture and not a theory--the definite description (1) The n[(snow is slight & n2=9) \/ (~snow is slight & 22=n+1)] would yield a constituent which is complex although it would determine the same object in all circumstances. Thus, (1), though a rigid designator, is not directly referential from this (metaphysical) point of view. (`Demonstratives' p. 494-495)(Kaplan goes on to attribute this "metaphysical picture" of structured propositions to Russell.) Adopting this account structured proposition account makes it simple to distinguish between directly referential expressions and other expressions, rigid or not. Directly referential expressions contribute their referents (in a context) to the propositions expressed (in that context) by the sentences containing them. Non-directly referential expressions contribute some complex that may or may not determine the same individual in all possible circumstances. Thus the desire to distinguish clearly between directly referential expressions and other rigid designators prompted Kaplan to re-introduce the notion of a structured proposition into the philosophical literature. However, in `Demonstratives' Kaplan tends to treat the notion of a structured proposition as a heuristic device. He repeatedly calls it a picture, explicitly says that it is not part of his theory, and in his formal semantics he adopts the possible worlds account of propositions (contents of formulae), taking them to be functions from worlds (and times) to truth values. Perhaps it is for this reason that though Kaplan says something about what the constituents of structured propositions are (e.g. the constituents contributed by directly referential expressions are their referents--in the case of `I', people), he says nothing about what it is that binds these constituents together.
There was a second reason, quite distinct from trying to make clear
the distinction between directly referential expressions and other
expressions, that prompted some philosophers to adopt the structured
proposition account. The view that propositions are sets of possible
worlds does not individuate propositions very finely. For example,
consider a metaphysically necessary proposition. Since it is true in
all possible worlds, it must be the set of all possible worlds. But
there is only one such set. Thus there is only one necessary
proposition! So this view apparently predicts that all true sentences
of mathematics express the same (necessary) proposition, that the
conjunction of any sentence S with a necessarily true sentence
expresses the same proposition as S, and so on. Further, if
Then in the mid 1980's, a couple of works appeared that convinced many philosophers that structured propositions were the way to go. On the one hand, Scott Soames [1985,1987] produced what many took to be a devastating attack on the view of propositions as sets of possible worlds. Soames showed that even when one tries to get more fine-grained propositions-as-sets-of-worlds by allowing metaphysically impossible worlds (e.g. worlds in which George Bush is identical with Ronald Reagan), inconsistent worlds (in which a thing can both possess and lack a property), and incomplete worlds (where some purported "matters of fact" are simply not settled), the resulting view, when combined with other independently plausible assumptions, is riddled with overwhelming difficulties. These difficulties all stem from the fact that on the worlds view, sentences with very different syntactic structures may express the same proposition. Soames  concludes that we ought to give up the view that propositions are sets of worlds of any sort, and embrace an account of propositions according to which propositions are structured entities, with individuals, properties and relations as constituents (Soames called these structured Russellian propositions). If the syntactic structures of sentences are reflected in the structures of propositions they express, sentences with different syntactic structures, whether true in all the same worlds or not, may express different propositions. It is perhaps worth noting that having sentences with different syntactic structures express different propositions doesn't require one to hold that propositions themselves are structured. Still, it is a natural way of accounting for why sentences with different syntactic structures that are true in all the same worlds express different propositions. Soames  sketched a formal theory of structured propositions, including an assignment of structured propositions to the sentences of a simple formal language, and a definition of truth relative to a circumstance for structured propositions.
At about the same time, Nathan Salmon  engaged in an extended defense of the view that the "information contents" of declarative sentences are structured propositions with individuals, properties and relations as constituents. Salmon was particularly concerned with showing how this account of propositions could deal with what he called Frege's puzzle. On the view of structured propositions of both Salmon and Soames, if `a' and `b' are co-referential proper names, then `a=a' and `a=b' express the same proposition, or in Salmon's terms, have the same information content. But how can that be? The former sentence is uninformative and a priori, whereas the latter is informative and a posteriori. So they could not have the same information content. Salmon responds that once we make a distinction between pragmatically imparted and semantically encoded information, we see that in the relevant sense `a=b' is not informative at all. Salmon defends the structured proposition account against a variety of other objections, and shows his particular version of the theory capable of resolving a number of puzzles. He also formulates a formal semantic theory of structured propositions in an appendix.
Among those who explicitly consider the question of what holds propositions together, currently there seem to be at least three views. First, there is the view that propositions are (and are not merely modeled or represented by) ordered n-tuples. The major difficulty with this view is that it does not seem to be able to account for some of the properties possessed by propositions. Propositions have truth conditions: they are true or false, depending on how the world is. So if some ordered n-tuples are propositions, some ordered n-tuples have truth conditions. But ordered n-tuples don't seem to be the kinds of things that have truth conditions. Indeed, presumably many ordered n-tuples have no truth conditions, (e.g. <1,2,3>). So how/why did those n-tuples that are propositions come to have truth conditions? Similar remarks apply to modal properties. Propositions are necessary, contingent, and possible. These, again, don't seem to be properties of n-tuples.
A second view, formulated by Jeffrey C. King [1995, 1996], holds that a complex relation binds together the constituents of a proposition and provides the proposition with its structure. In order to explain what complex relation binds the constituents together, let us consider the sentence `Rebecca loves Carl' in "tree form":
The tree represents the syntactical relation binding together the words in the sentence. We shall call this the sentential relation of the sentence. The words in the sentence, of course, bear semantic relations to things in the world, which we shall call their semantic values (or sv's): the sv of `Rebecca' is Rebecca; the sv of `loves' is the relation of loving; and the sv of `Carl' is Carl. The crucial point is that since the words stand in a sentential relation in the sentence, and the words in the sentence stand in semantic relations to the sv's, the sv's themselves stand in the relation resulting from composing the sentential relation of the sentence with the semantic relations the words in the sentence bear to their sv's, while existentially generalizing over the words. We can represent the relation the sv's stand in thus:
where Rebecca*, loves* and Carl* are the sv's of `Rebecca', `loves' and `Carl'; the portion of the diagram labeled R is the sentential relation binding together the words in the sentence above; the circles at the terminal nodes of this relation represent that the words have been existentially generalized away; and the lines from the circles to the sv's represent the semantic relations obtaining between `Rebecca' and Rebecca* (i.e. Rebecca), etc. Thus, for example, A is presumably the reference relation that obtains between `Rebecca' and Rebecca*. On the present view, then, the proposition expressed by `Rebecca loves Carl' is the above: namely, the sv's of the words in this sentence standing in the complex relation that is the result of composing the sentential relation of the sentence with the semantic relations the words bear to their sv's, existentially generalizing away the words. Thus the relation that holds together the constituents of the proposition is literally "built out of " the sentential relation and the semantic relations words bear to their sv's.
This view of what holds the constituents of propositions together has at least two virtues. First, it "builds" the relations binding together constituents of propositions out of relations (sentential relations binding together words in sentences; and semantic relations between words and their sv's) that we are already committed to. Second, it leaves little room for doubt that propositions exist. For from the fact that there is a sentence `Rebecca loves Carl', which in tree form looks as follows:
where `Rebecca' bears a semantic relation to Rebecca, `loves' bears a semantic relation to the relation of loving, and `Carl bears a semantic relation to Carl, it follows that Rebecca, the relation of loving and Carl stand in the relation of there being lexical items a, b and c occurring in a sentence in which they stand in the following relation:
such that Rebecca is the sv of a, the relation of loving is the sv of b, and Carl is the sv of c. In other words, it follows that the following entity exists:
But this entity just is our proposition! Thus, given very minimal, quite uncontentious assumptions, it follows that propositions exist on this view.
The main difficulty with the view is that, at least as currently formulated in King , the view requires variables to occur in "quantified" propositions. But then it appears that the view allows that there are propositions that differ only in what bound variables occur in them. This seems, at the least, counterintuitive. One might attempt to take equivalence classes of propositions under a relation like proposition x differs from proposition y at most on the bound variables occurring in it, and then "identify" all the propositions in a given equivalence class with some member of that class. But this procedure seems artificial.
A final view as to what holds the constituents of propositions together, due to Edward Zalta , represents a return to the views of Russell and Frege canvassed earlier. Though Zalta has an extensive, axiomatized theory of abstract individuals, properties, relations and propositions, we confine our attention here to his view about what it is that binds together the constituents of propositions. Recall that Frege and Russell, though differing on what the constituents of propositions are, both held that what binds together the constituents of a proposition is in some sense "built into" one of the constituents. Similarly for Zalta. Consider the sentence:
Robin hit Tony.Using r to represent (the actual individual) Robin, t to represent Tony and H to represent the two-place relation of hitting, according to Zalta the above sentence denotes the proposition Hrt, which is the result of plugging Robin and Tony into the two places in the two-place hitting relation. There are two things to notice about this proposal. First, it is one of the constituents of the proposition, the hitting relation, that binds the constituents of the proposition together. Second, the proposition just is Robin standing in the hitting relation to Tony.
Such a view immediately raises the worry about false propositions discussed in connection with Russell's account of propositions in Principles of Mathematics. For one might argue as follows. Suppose Robin didn't hit Tony. Then Robin doesn't stand in the hitting relation to Tony. But Robin standing in the hitting relation to Tony just is the proposition that Robin hit Tony. Thus there is no proposition that Robin hit Tony. Similar reasoning shows that any other false proposition fails to exist. So there are no false propositions.
Obviously, Zalta does not want to be saddled with this result, and he isn't. He holds that the even if Robin didn't hit Tony, there is a proposition consisting of Robin standing in the hitting relation to Tony. That proposition simply isn't true. To put the point somewhat paradoxically, even if Robin didn't hit Tony, Robin stands in the hitting relation to Tony, so that we have our (false) proposition.
To many, Zalta will appear to have confused a proposition with what makes it true. Robin standing in the hitting relation to Tony isn't the proposition that Robin hit Tony, one might think. It is what makes that proposition true! Of course Zalta must deny this. Having identified the proposition with the thing that other theorists take to be what makes the proposition true, Zalta holds that nothing outside of the proposition makes it true:
The metaphysical truth or falsity of these logical complexes [propositions] is basic. If a proposition is true, there is nothing else that "makes it true". Its being true is just the way things are (arranged). (Intensional Logic and the Metaphysics of Intentionality, p.56)Making the truth of propositions "basic" in this way will strike some as mysterious.
Finally, an apparent difficulty with Zalta's view is that his propositions don't seem to be the sorts of things that are true and false; or asserted and denied. Consider Robin standing in the hitting relation to Tony again. This others might call a state of affairs. Is that the sort of thing that is true or false? My coffee cup is now two feet away from me. Consider the state of affairs consisting of the cup standing two feet away from me. Is this state of affairs true? If I single out the state of affairs in question, and say `That's true' have I spoken truly? Intuitively, it doesn't seem so.
Thus it may be that none of the current views as to what holds together the constituents of structured propositions is completely unproblematic.
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First published: September 22, 1997
Content last modified: September 22, 1997