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Principia Mathematica

[Photo of the title page of Principia Mathematica]

Principia Mathematica is the landmark work on mathematical logic and the foundations of mathematics written by Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell, and published in three volumes, in 1910, 1912 and 1913. Written as a defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is in some significant sense reducible to logic), the book was instrumental in popularizing modern mathematical logic. Next to Aristotle's Organon, it is the most influential book on logic ever written.

History of Principia Mathematica

Logicism, the idea of reducing all of mathematics to logic, is typically explained as a two-part thesis. First, it is the thesis that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of that of logic. Second, it is the thesis that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of those of logic.

In its essentials, this thesis was first advocated in the late 17th century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in much greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement initiated in the 1820s, Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass had succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematical theories of their day. By the late 1800s, William Hamilton had also introduced ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers, and Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work by H.G. Grassmann and Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had also gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. Thus, by Frege's day it was generally recognized that a large portion of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.

Nevertheless, it was not until 1879 when Frege developed the logical apparatus necessary for logicism that the project could be said to have become technically viable. Within another five years Frege had also arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic and, during the 1890s, he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would be required if logicism were to succeed.

By 1903, both Whitehead and Russell had come to similar conclusions. Both men were also in the initial stages of preparing second volumes to earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra and Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics. Since their research overlapped considerably, they began collaboration on what was eventually to become Principia Mathematica.

Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part of both men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing Principia would result in an estimated loss of approximately 600 pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, that still left a 100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors able to see their work through to publication.

Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.

Significance of Principia Mathematica

Principia's main goal of showing the detailed reduction of mathematics to logic proved to be controversial. Primarily at issue were the kinds of assumptions which Whitehead and Russell used to complete their project. Although Principia succeeded in providing detailed derivations of major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory, two axioms in particular were arguably non-logical in character: the axiom of infinity and the axiom of reducibility. The former of these assumed that there exists an infinity of objects. Thus, it made the kind of assumption that is generally thought to be empirical rather than logical in nature. The latter arose as a means of limiting the not completely satisfactory effects of the theory of types, the theory which Russell and Whitehead used to restrict the notion of a well-formed expression, and so to avoid the paradoxes. Although technically feasible, many critics claimed that the axiom was simply too ad hoc to be justified philosophically. As a result, the question of whether mathematics could be reduced to logic, or whether it could be reduced only to set-theory, remained open.

Despite these criticisms, Principia Mathematica proved to be remarkably influential in at least two other ways. First, it popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its authors. By using a notation superior in many ways to that of Frege, Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power of modern logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the new logic, Whitehead and Russell were also able to show how powerful the modern idea of a formal system could be. Thus, not only did Principia introduce other crucial notions (such as propositional function, logical construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery of classical metatheoretic results (such as those of Kurt Gödel and others) and initiated a tradition of technical work in fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics and computer science.

Contents of Principia Mathematica

Principia itself appeared in three volumes, which together in turn are divided into six parts. Volume 1 begins with a lengthy Introduction containing sections entitled "Preliminary Explanations of Ideas and Notations", "The Theory of Logical Types" and "Incomplete Symbols". It also contains Part I, entitled "Mathematical Logic", which contains sections on "The Theory of Deduction", "Theory of Apparent Variables", "Classes and Relations", "Logic of Relations", and "Products and Sums of Classes"; and Part II, entitled "Prolegomena to Cardinal Arithmetic", which contains sections on "Unit Classes and Couples", "Sub-Classes, Sub-Relations, and Relative Types", "One-Many, Many-One and One-One Relations", "Selections", and "Inductive Relations".

Volume 2 begins with a "Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions". It then continues with Part III, entitled "Cardinal Arithmetic", which itself contains sections on "Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers", "Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation", and "Finite and Infinite"; Part IV, entitled Relation-Arithmetic", which contains sections on "Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers", "Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations", "The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations", and "Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers"; and the first half of Part V, entitled "Series", which contains sections on "General Theory of Series", "On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives", and "On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions".

Volume 3 continues Part V with sections on "Well-Ordered Series", "Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals", and "Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series". It also contains Part VI, entitled "Quantity", which itself contains sections on "Generalization of Number", "Vector-Families", "Measurement", and "Cyclic Families".

A fourth volume, on geometry, was planned but never completed. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.


Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | logic | logicism | propositional function | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North

Copyright © 1996, 1997 by
A.D. Irvine

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First published: May 21, 1996
Content last modified: August 18, 1997