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Principia Mathematica is the landmark work on mathematical logic and the foundations of mathematics written by Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell, and published in three volumes, in 1910, 1912 and 1913. Written as a defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is in some significant sense reducible to logic), the book was instrumental in popularizing modern mathematical logic. Next to Aristotle's Organon, it is the most influential book on logic ever written.
In its essentials, this thesis was first advocated in the late 17th century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in much greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement initiated in the 1820s, Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass had succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematical theories of their day. By the late 1800s, William Hamilton had also introduced ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers, and Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work by H.G. Grassmann and Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had also gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. Thus, by Frege's day it was generally recognized that a large portion of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.
Nevertheless, it was not until 1879 when Frege developed the logical apparatus necessary for logicism that the project could be said to have become technically viable. Within another five years Frege had also arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic and, during the 1890s, he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would be required if logicism were to succeed.
By 1903, both Whitehead and Russell had come to similar conclusions. Both men were also in the initial stages of preparing second volumes to earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra and Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics. Since their research overlapped considerably, they began collaboration on what was eventually to become Principia Mathematica.
Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part of both men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing Principia would result in an estimated loss of approximately 600 pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, that still left a 100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors able to see their work through to publication.
Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.
Despite these criticisms, Principia Mathematica proved to be remarkably influential in at least two other ways. First, it popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its authors. By using a notation superior in many ways to that of Frege, Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power of modern logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the new logic, Whitehead and Russell were also able to show how powerful the modern idea of a formal system could be. Thus, not only did Principia introduce other crucial notions (such as propositional function, logical construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery of classical metatheoretic results (such as those of Kurt Gödel and others) and initiated a tradition of technical work in fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics and computer science.
Volume 2 begins with a "Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions". It then continues with Part III, entitled "Cardinal Arithmetic", which itself contains sections on "Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers", "Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation", and "Finite and Infinite"; Part IV, entitled Relation-Arithmetic", which contains sections on "Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers", "Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations", "The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations", and "Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers"; and the first half of Part V, entitled "Series", which contains sections on "General Theory of Series", "On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives", and "On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions".
Volume 3 continues Part V with sections on "Well-Ordered Series", "Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals", and "Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series". It also contains Part VI, entitled "Quantity", which itself contains sections on "Generalization of Number", "Vector-Families", "Measurement", and "Cyclic Families".
A fourth volume, on geometry, was planned but never completed. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.
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First published: May 21, 1996
Content last modified: August 18, 1997