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Popper obtained a primary school teaching diploma in 1925, took a Ph.D. in philosophy in 1928, and qualified to teach mathematics and physics in secondary school in 1929. The dominant philosophical group in Vienna from its inception in 1928 was the Wiener Kreis, the circle of `scientifically-minded' intellectuals who gathered around the figure of Moritz Schlick. This included Rudolf Carnap, Otto Neurath, Viktor Kraft, Hans Hahn, and Herbert Feigl. The principal objective of the members of the Circle was to unify the sciences, which carried with it, in their view, the need to eliminate metaphysics once and for all by showing that metaphysical propositions are meaningless. Thus was born the movement in philosophy known as logical positivism, and its chief tool became the verification principle. Although he was friendly with some of the Circle's members - especially Feigl, who encouraged him to write his first book - and shared their esteem for science, Popper was heavily critical of the main tenets of logical positivism, especially of what he considered to be its misplaced focus on the theory of meaning in philosophy and upon verification in scientific methodology. He articulated his own view of science, and his criticisms of the positivists, in his first work, published under the title Logik der Forschung in 1934. The book - which he was later to claim rang the death knell for logical positivism - attracted more attention than Popper had anticipated, and he was invited to lecture in England in 1935. He spent the next few years working productively on science and philosophy, but storm clouds were gathering - the growth of Nazism in Germany and Austria compelled him, like many other intellectuals who shared his Jewish origins, to leave his native country.
In 1937 Popper took up a position teaching philosophy at the
University of Canterbury in New Zealand, where he was to remain for
the duration of the Second World War. The annexation of Austria in
1938 became the catalyst which prompted him to refocus his writings on
social and political philosophy. In 1946 he moved to England to teach
at the London School of Economics, and became professor of logic and
scientific method at the University of London in 1949. From this point
on Popper's reputation and stature as a philosopher of science and
social thinker grew enormously, and he continued to write prolifically
- a number of his works, particularly The Logic of Scientific
Discovery (1959), are now universally recognised as classics in
the field. He was knighted in 1965, and retired from the University of
London in 1969, though he remained active as a writer, broadcaster and
lecturer until his death in 1994. (For more detail on Popper's life,
cf. his Unended Quest).
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The Marxist account of history too, Popper held, is not scientific, although it differs in certain crucial respects from psychoanalysis. For Marxism, Popper believed, had been initially scientific, in that Marx had postulated a theory which was genuinely predictive. However, when these predictions were not in fact borne out, the theory was saved from falsification by the addition of ad hoc hypotheses which made it compatible with the facts. By this means, Popper asserted, a theory which was initially genuinely scientific degenerated into pseudo-scientific dogma.
These factors combined to make Popper take falsifiability
as his criterion for demarcating science from non-science: if a theory
is incompatible with possible empirical observations it is scientific;
conversely, a theory which is compatible with all such observations,
either because, as in the case of Marxism, it has been modified solely
to accommodate such observations, or because, as in the case of
psychoanalytic theories, it is consistent with all possible
observations, is unscientific. For Popper, however, to assert that a
theory is unscientific, is not necessarily to hold that it is
unenlightening, still less that it is meaningless, for it sometimes
happens that a theory which is unscientific (because it is
unfalsifiable) at a given time may become falsifiable, and thus
scientific, with the development of technology, or with the further
articulation and refinement of the theory. Further, even purely
mythogenic explanations have performed a valuable function in the past
in expediting our understanding of the nature of reality.
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Popper, then, repudiates induction, and rejects the view that it is the characteristic method of scientific investigation and inference, and substitutes falsifiability in its place. It is easy, he argues, to obtain evidence in favour of virtually any theory, and he consequently holds that such `corroboration', as he terms it, should count scientifically only if it is the positive result of a genuinely `risky' prediction, which might conceivably have been false. For Popper, a theory is scientific only if it is refutable by a conceivable event. Every genuine test of a scientific theory, then, is logically an attempt to refute or to falsify it, and one genuine counter-instance falsifies the whole theory. In a critical sense, Popper's theory of demarcation is based upon his perception of the logical asymmetry which holds between verification and falsification: it is logically impossible to conclusively verify a universal proposition by reference to experience (as Hume saw clearly), but a single counter-instance conclusively falsifies the corresponding universal law. In a word, an exception, far from `proving' a rule, conclusively refutes it.
Every genuine scientific theory then, in Popper's view, is prohibitive, in the sense that it forbids, by implication, particular events or occurrences. As such it can be tested and falsified, but never logically verified. Thus Popper stresses that it should not be inferred from the fact that a theory has withstood the most rigorous testing, for however long a period of time, that it has been verified; rather we should recognise that such a theory has received a high measure of corroboration. and may be provisionally retained as the best available theory until it is finally falsified (if indeed it is ever falsified), and/or is superseded by a better theory.
Popper has always drawn a clear distinction between the logic of falsifiability and its applied methodology. The logic of his theory is utterly simple: if a single ferrous metal is unaffected by a magnetic field it cannot be the case that all ferrous metals are affected by magnetic fields. Logically speaking, a scientific law is conclusively falsifiable although it is not conclusively verifiable. Methodologically, however, the situation is much more complex: no observation is free from the possibility of error - consequently we may question whether our experimental result was what it appeared to be.
Thus, while advocating falsifiability as the criterion of demarcation for science, Popper explicitly allows for the fact that in practice a single conflicting or counter-instance is never sufficient methodologically to falsify a theory, and that scientific theories are often retained even though much of the available evidence conflicts with them, or is anomalous with respect to them. Scientific theories may, and do, arise genetically in many different ways, and the manner in which a particular scientist comes to formulate a particular theory may be of biographical interest, but it is of no consequence as far as the philosophy of science is concerned. Popper stresses in particular that there is no unique way, no single method such as induction, which functions as the route to scientific theory, a view which Einstein personally endorsed with his affirmation that `There is no logical path leading to [the highly universal laws of science]. They can only be reached by intuition, based upon something like an intellectual love of the objects of experience'. Science, in Popper's view, starts with problems rather than with observations - it is, indeed, precisely in the context of grappling with a problem that the scientist makes observations in the first instance: his observations are selectively designed to test the extent to which a given theory functions as a satisfactory solution to a given problem.
On this criterion of demarcation physics, chemistry, and
(non-introspective) psychology, amongst others, are sciences,
psychoanalysis is a pre-science (i.e. it undoubtedly contains useful
and informative truths, but until such time as psychoanalytical
theories can be formulated in such a manner as to be falsifiable, they
will not attain the status of scientific theories), and astrology and
phrenology are pseudo-sciences. Formally, then, Popper's theory of
demarcation may be articulated as follows: where a `basic statement'
is to be understood as a particular observation-report, then we may
say that a theory is scientific if and only if the class of basic
statements relating to it can be divided into the following two
non-empty sub-classes: (a) the class of all those basic statements
with which it is inconsistent, or which it prohibits - this is the
class of its potential falsifiers (i.e. those statements which,
if true, falsify the whole theory), and (b) the class of those basic
statements with which it is consistent, or which it permits
(i.e. those statements which, if true, corroborate it, or bear it
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How then does the deductive procedure work? Popper specifies four steps:
(a) The first is formal, a testing of the internal consistency of the theoretical system to see if it involves any contradictions.
(b) The second step is semi-formal, the axiomatising of the theory to distinguish between its empirical and its logical elements. In performing this step the scientist makes the logical form of the theory explicit. Failure to do this can lead to category-mistakes - the scientist ends up asking the wrong questions, and searches for empirical data where none are available. Most scientific theories contain analytic (i.e. a priori) and synthetic elements, and it is necessary to axiomatise them in order to distinguish the two clearly.
(c) The third step is the comparing of the new theory with existing ones to determine whether it constitutes an advance upon them. If it does not constitute such an advance, it will not be adopted. If, on the other hand, its explanatory success matches that of the existing theories, and additionally, it explains some hitherto anomalous phenomenon, or solves some hitherto unsolvable problems, it will be deemed to constitute an advance upon the existing theories, and will be adopted. Thus science involves theoretical progress. However, Popper stresses that we ascertain whether one theory is better than another by deductively testing both theories, rather than by induction. For this reason, he argues that a theory is deemed to be better than another if (while unfalsified) it has greater empirical content, and therefore greater predictive power than its rival. The classic illustration of this in physics was the replacement of Newton's theory of universal gravitation by Einstein's theory of relativity. This elucidates the nature of science as Popper sees it: at any given time there will be a number of conflicting theories or conjectures, some of which will explain more than others. The latter will consequently be provisionally adopted. In short, for Popper any theory X is better than a `rival' theory Y if X has greater empirical content, and hence greater predictive power, than Y.
(d) The fourth and final step is the testing of a theory by the empirical application of the conclusions derived from it. If such conclusions are shown to be true, the theory is corroborated (but never verified). If the conclusion is shown to be false, then this is taken as a signal that the theory cannot be completely correct (logically the theory is falsified), and the scientist begins his quest for a better theory. He does not, however, abandon the present theory until such time as he has a better one to substitute for it. More precisely, the method of theory-testing is as follows: certain singular propositions are deduced from the new theory - these are predictions, and of special interest are those predictions which are `risky' (in the sense of being intuitively implausible or of being startlingly novel) and experimentally testable. From amongst the latter the scientist next selects those which are not derivable from the current or existing theory - of particular importance are those which contradict the current or existing theory. He then seeks a decision as regards these and other derived statements by comparing them with the results of practical applications and experimentation. If the new predictions are borne out, then the new theory is corroborated (and the old one falsified), and is adopted as a working hypothesis. If the predictions are not borne out, then they falsify the theory from which they are derived. Thus Popper retains an element of empiricism: for him scientific method does involve making an appeal to experience. But unlike traditional empiricists, Popper holds that experience cannot determine theory (i.e. we do not argue or infer from observation to theory), it rather delimits it: it shows which theories are false, not which theories are true. Moreover, Popper also rejects the empiricist doctrine that empirical observations are, or can be, infallible, in view of the fact that they are themselves theory-laden.
The general picture of Popper's philosophy of science, then is this:
Hume's philosophy demonstrates that there is a contradiction implicit
in traditional empiricism, which holds both that all knowledge is
derived from experience and that universal propositions
(including scientific laws) are verifiable by reference to
experience. The contradiction, which Hume himself saw clearly, derives
from the attempt to show that, notwithstanding the open-ended nature
of experience, scientific laws may be construed as empirical
generalisations which are in some way finally confirmable by a
`positive' experience. Popper eliminates the contradiction by
rejecting the first of these principles and removing the demand for
empirical verification in favour of empirical falsification in the
second. Scientific theories, for him, are not inductively inferred
from experience, nor is scientific experimentation carried out with a
view to verifying or finally establishing the truth of theories;
rather, all knowledge is provisional, conjectural, hypothetical
- we can never finally prove our scientific theories, we can
merely (provisionally) confirm or (conclusively) refute them; hence at
any given time we have to choose between the potentially infinite
number of theories which will explain the set of phenomena under
investigation. Faced with this choice, we can only eliminate those
theories which are demonstrably false, and rationally choose between
the remaining, unfalsified theories. Hence Popper's emphasis on the
importance of the critical spirit to science - for him critical
thinking is the very essence of rationality. For it is only by
critical thought that we can eliminate false theories, and determine
which of the remaining theories is the best available one, in the
sense of possessing the highest level of explanatory force and
predictive power. It is precisely this kind of critical thinking which
is conspicuous by its absence in contemporary Marxism and in
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For Popper, all scientific criticism must be piecemeal, i.e. he holds that it is not possible to question every aspect of a theory at once. More precisely, while attempting to resolve a particular problem a scientist of necessity accepts all kinds of things as unproblematic. These things constitute what Popper terms the `background knowledge'. However, he stresses that the background knowledge is not knowledge in the sense of being conclusively established; it may be challenged at any time, especially if it is suspected that its uncritical acceptance may be responsible for difficulties which are subsequently encountered. Nevertheless, it is clearly not possible to question both the theory and the background knowledge at the same time (e.g. in conducting an experiment the scientist of necessity assumes that the apparatus used is in working order).
How then can one be certain that one is questioning the right thing? The Popperian answer is that we cannot have absolute certainty here, but repeated tests usually show where the trouble lies. Even observation statements, Popper maintains, are fallible, and science in his view is not a quest for certain knowledge, but an evolutionary process in which hypotheses or conjectures are imaginatively proposed and tested in order to explain facts or to solve problems. Popper emphasises both the importance of questioning the background knowledge when the need arises, and the significance of the fact that observation-statements are theory-laden, and hence fallible. For while falsifiability is simple as a logical principle, in practice it is exceedingly complicated - no single observation can ever be taken to falsify a theory, for there is always the possibility (a) that the observation itself is mistaken, or (b) that the assumed background knowledge is faulty or defective.
Popper was initially uneasy with the concept of truth, and in his earliest writings he avoided asserting that a theory which is corroborated is true - for clearly if every theory is an open-ended hypothesis, as he maintains, then ipso facto it has to be at least potentially false. For this reason Popper restricted himself to the contention that a theory which is falsified is false and is known to be such, and that a theory which replaces a falsified theory (because it has a higher empirical content than the latter, and explains what has falsified it) is a `better theory' than its predecessor. However, he came to accept Tarski's reformulation of the correspondence theory of truth, and in Conjectures and Refutations (1963) he integrated the concepts of truth and content to frame the metalogical concept of `truthlikeness' or `verisimilitude'. A `good' scientific theory, Popper thus argued, has a higher level of verisimilitude than its rivals, and he explicated this concept by reference to the logical consequences of theories. A theory's content is the totality of its logical consequences, which can be divided into two classes: there is the `truth-content' of a theory, which is the class of true propositions which may be derived from it, on the one hand, and the `falsity-content' of a theory, on the other hand, which is the class of the theory's false consequences (this latter class may of course be empty, and in the case of a theory which is true is necessarily empty).
Popper offered two methods of comparing theories in terms of verisimilitude, the qualitative and quantitative definitions. On the qualitative account, Popper asserted:
Assuming that the truth-content and the falsity-content of two theories t1 and t2 are comparable, we can say that t2 is more closely similar to the truth, or corresponds better to the facts, than t1, if and only if either:Here, verisimilitude is defined in terms of subclass relationships: t2 has a higher level of verisimilitude than t1 if and only if their truth- and falsity-contents are comparable through subclass relationships, and either (a) t2's truth-content includes t1's and t2's falsity-content, if it exists, is included in, or is the same as, t1's, or (b) t2's truth-content includes or is the same as t1's and t2's falsity-content, if it exists, is included in t1's.
(a) the truth-content but not the falsity-content of t2 exceeds that of t1, or
(b) the falsity-content of t1, but not its truth-content, exceeds that of t2. (Conjectures and Refutations, 233).
On the quantitative account, verisimilitude is defined by assigning quantities to contents, where the index of the content of a given theory is its logical improbability (given again that content and probability vary inversely). Formally, then, Popper defines the quantitative verisimilitude which a statement `a' possesses by means of a formula:
Vs(a) = CtT(a) - CtF(a),where Vs(a) represents the verisimilitude of `a', CtT(a) is a measure of the truth-content of `a', and CtF(a) is a measure of its falsity-content.
The utilisation of either method of computing verisimilitude shows, Popper held, that even if a theory t2 with a higher content than a rival theory t1 is subsequently falsified, it can still legitimately be regarded as a better theory than t1, and `better' is here now understood to mean t2 is closer to the truth than t1. Thus scientific progress involves, on this view, the abandonment of partially true, but falsified, theories, for theories with a higher level of verisimilitude, i.e., which approach more closely to the truth. In this way, verisimilitude allowed Popper to mitigate what many saw as the pessimism of an anti-inductivist philosophy of science which held that most, if not all scientific theories are false, and that a true theory, even if discovered, could not be known to be such. With the introduction of the new concept, Popper was able to represent this as an essentially optimistic position in terms of which we can legitimately be said to have reason to believe that science makes progress towards the truth through the falsification and corroboration of theories. Scientific progress, in other words, could now be represented as progress towards the truth, and experimental corroboration could be seen an indicator of verisimilitude.
However, in the 1970's a series of papers published by researchers such as Miller, Tichý, and Grünbaum in particular revealed fundamental defects in Popper's formal definitions of verisimilitude. The significance of this work was that verisimilitude is largely important in Popper's system because of its application to theories which are known to be false. In this connection, Popper had written:
Ultimately, the idea of verisimilitude is most important in cases where we know that we have to work with theories which are at best approximationsthat is to say, theories of which we know that they cannot be true. (This is often the case in the social sciences). In these cases we can still speak of better or worse approximations to the truth (and we therefore do not need to interpret these cases in an instrumentalist sense). (Conjectures and Refutations, 235).For these reasons, the deficiencies discovered by the critics in Popper's formal definitions were seen by many as devastating, precisely because the most significant of these related to the levels of verisimilitude of false theories. In 1974, Miller and Tichý, working independently of each other, demonstrated that the conditions specified by Popper in his accounts of both qualitative and quantitative verisimilitude for comparing the truth- and falsity-contents of theories can be satisfied only when the theories are true. In the crucially important case of false theories, however, Popper's definitions are formally defective. For while Popper had believed that verisimilitude intersected positively with his account of corroboration, in the sense that he viewed an improbable theory which had withstood critical testing as one the truth-content of which is great relative to rival theories, while its falsity-content (if it exists) would be relatively low, Miller and Tichý proved, on the contrary, that in the case of a false theory t2which has excess content over a rival theory false t1both the truth-content and the falsity-content of t2will exceed that of t1. With respect to theories which are false, therefore, Popper's conditions for comparing levels of verisimilitude, whether in quantitative and qualitative terms, can never be met.
Commentators on Popper, with few exceptions, had initially attached
little importance to his theory of verisimilitude. However, after the
failure of Popper's definitions in 1974, some critics came to see it
as central to his philosophy of science, and consequentially held that
the whole edifice of the latter had been subverted. For his part,
Popper's response was two-fold. In the first place, while
acknowledging the deficiencies in his own formal account ("my main
mistake was my failure to see at once that
if the content of a
false statement a exceeds that of a statement b, then
the truth-content of a exceeds the truth-content of b,
and the same holds of their falsity-contents", Objective
Knowledge, 371), Popper argued that "I do think that we should not
conclude from the failure of my attempts to solve the problem [of
defining verisimilitude] that the problem cannot be solved"
(Objective Knowledge, 372), a point of view which was to
precipitate more than two decades of important technical research in
this field. At another, more fundamental level, he moved the task of
formally defining the concept from centre-stage in his philosophy of
science, by protesting that he had never intended to imply "that
degrees of verisimilitude ... can ever be numerically determined,
except in certain limiting cases" (Objective Knowledge, 59),
and arguing instead that the chief value of the concept is heuristic
and intuitive, in which the absence of an adequate formal definition
is not an insuperable impediment to its utilisation in the actual
appraisal of theories relativised to problems in which we have an
interest. The thrust of the latter strategy seems to many to genuinely
reflect the significance of the concept of verisimilitude in Popper's
system, but it has not satisfied all of his critics.
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These beliefs lead to what Popper calls `The Historicist Doctrine of the Social Sciences', the views (a) that the principal task of the social sciences is to make predictions about the social and political development of man, and (b) that the task of politics, once the key predictions have been made, is, in Marx's words, to lessen the `birth pangs' of future social and political developments. Popper thinks that this view of the social sciences is both theoretically misconceived (in the sense of being based upon a view of natural science and its methodology which is totally wrong), and socially dangerous, as it leads inevitably to totalitarianism and authoritarianism - to centralised governmental control of the individual and the attempted imposition of large-scale social planning. Against this Popper strongly advances the view that any human social grouping is no more (or less) than the sum of its individual members, that what happens in history is the (largely unplanned and unforeseeable) result of the actions of such individuals, and that large scale social planning to an antecedently conceived blueprint is inherently misconceived - and inevitably disastrous - precisely because human actions have consequences which cannot be foreseen. Popper, then, is an historical indeterminist, insofar as he holds that history does not evolve in accordance with intrinsic laws or principles, that in the absence of such laws and principles unconditional prediction in the social sciences is an impossibility, and that there is no such thing as historical necessity.
The link between Popper's theory of knowledge and his social
philosophy is his fallibilism - just as we make theoretical progress
in science by deliberately subjecting our theories to critical
scrutiny, and abandoning those which have been falsified, so too,
Popper holds, the critical spirit can and should be sustained at the
social level. More specifically, the open society can be brought about
only if it is possible for the individual citizen to evaluate
critically the consequences of the implementation of government
policies, which can then be abandoned or modified in the light of such
critical scrutiny - in such a society, the rights of the individual to
criticise administrative policies will be formally safeguarded and
upheld, undesirable policies will be eliminated in a manner analogous
to the elimination of falsified scientific theories, and differences
between people on social policy will be resolved by critical
discussion and argument rather than by force. The open society as thus
conceived of by Popper may be defined as `an association of free
individuals respecting each other's rights within the framework of
mutual protection supplied by the state, and achieving, through the
making of responsible, rational decisions, a growing measure of humane
and enlightened life' (Levinson, R.B. In Defense of Plato,
17). As such, Popper holds, it is not a utopian ideal, but an
empirically realised form of social organisation which, he argues, is
in every respect superior to its (real or potential) totalitarian
rivals. But he does not engage in a moral defence of the ideology of
liberalism; rather his strategy is the much deeper one of showing that
totalitarianism is typically based upon historicist and holist
presuppositions, and of demonstrating that these presuppositions are
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His first argument may be summarised as follows: in relation to the critically important concept of prediction, Popper makes a distinction between what he terms `conditional scientific predictions', which have the form `If X takes place, then Y will take place', and `unconditional scientific prophecies', which have the form `Y will take place'. Contrary to popular belief, it is the former rather than the latter which are typical of the natural sciences, which means that typically prediction in natural science is conditional and limited in scope - it takes the form of hypothetical assertions stating that certain specified changes will come about if particular specified events antecedently take place. This is not to deny that `unconditional scientific prophecies', such as the prediction of eclipses, for example, do take place in science, and that the theoretical natural sciences make them possible. However, Popper argues that (a) these unconditional prophecies are not characteristic of the natural sciences, and (b) that the mechanism whereby they occur, in the very limited way in which they do, is not understood by the historicist.
What is the mechanism which makes unconditional scientific prophecies possible? The answer is that such prophecies can sometimes be derived from a combination of conditional predictions (themselves derived from scientific laws) and existential statements specifying that the conditions in relation to the system being investigated are fulfilled. Schematically, this can be represented as follows:
[C.P. + E.S.] = U.P.where C.P. = Conditional Prediction; E.S. = Existential Statement; U.P. = Unconditional Prophecy. The most common examples of unconditional scientific prophecies in science relate to the prediction of such phenomena as lunar and solar eclipses and comets.
Given, then, that this is the mechanism which generates unconditional scientific prophecies, Popper makes two related claims about historicism: (a) That the historicist does not in fact derive his unconditional scientific prophecies in this manner from conditional predictions, and (b) the historicist cannot do so because long-term unconditional scientific prophecies can be derived from conditional predictions only if they apply to systems which are well-isolated, stationary, and recurrent (like our solar system). Such systems are quite rare in nature, and human society is most emphatically not one of them.
This, then, Popper argues, is the reason why it is a fundamental
mistake for the historicist to take the unconditional scientific
prophecies of eclipses as being typical and characteristic of the
predictions of natural science - in fact such predictions are possible
only because our solar system is a stationary and repetitive system
which is isolated from other such systems by immense expanses of empty
space. The solar system aside, there are very few such systems around
for scientific investigation - most of the others are confined to the
field of biology, where unconditional prophecies about the life-cycles
of organisms are made possible by the existence of precisely the same
factors. Thus one of the fallacies committed by the historicist is to
take the (relatively rare) instances of unconditional prophecies in
the natural science as constituting the essence of what scientific
prediction is, to fail to see that such prophecies apply only to
systems which are isolated, stationary, and repetitive, and to seek to
apply the method of scientific prophecy to human society and human
history. The latter, of course, is not an isolated system
(in fact it's not a system at all), it is constantly changing, and it
continually undergoes rapid, non-repetitive development. In the most
fundamental sense possible, every event in human history is discrete,
novel, quite unique, and ontologically distinct from every other
historical event. For this reason, it is impossible in principle that
unconditional scientific prophecies could be made in relation to human
history - the idea that the successful unconditional prediction of
eclipses provides us with reasonable grounds for the hope of
successful unconditional prediction regarding the evolution of human
history turns out to be based upon a gross misconception, and is quite
false. As Popper himself concludes, "The fact that we predict eclipses
does not, therefore, provide a valid reason for expecting that we can
predict revolutions." (Conjectures and Refutations, 340).
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The historicist's failure to distinguish between scientific laws and trends is equally destructive of his cause. This failure makes him think it possible to explain change by discovering trends running through past history, and to anticipate and predict future occurrences on the basis of such observations. Here Popper points out that there is a critical difference between a trend and a scientific law, the failure to observe which is fatal. For a scientific law is universal in form, while a trend can be expressed only as a singular existential statement. This logical difference is crucial because unconditional predictions, as we have already seen, can be based only upon conditional ones, which themselves must be derived from scientific laws. Neither conditional nor unconditional predictions can be based upon trends, because these may change or be reversed with a change in the conditions which gave rise to them in the first instance. As Popper puts it, there can be no doubt that "the habit of confusing trends with laws, together with the intuitive observation of trends such as technical progress, inspired the central doctrines of ... historicism." (The Poverty of Historicism, 116). Popper does not, of course, dispute the existence of trends, nor does he deny that the observation of trends can be of practical utility value - but the essential point is that a trend is something which itself ultimately stands in need of scientific explanation, and it cannot therefore function as the frame of reference in terms of which anything else can be scientifically explained or predicted.
A point which connects with this has to do with the role which the evolution of human knowledge has played in the historical development of human society. It is incontestable that, as Marx himself observed, there has been a causal link between the two, in the sense that advances in scientific and technological knowledge have given rise to widespread global changes in patterns of human social organisation and social interaction, which in turn have led to social structures (e.g. educational systems) which further growth in human knowledge. In short, the evolution of human history has been strongly influenced by the growth of human knowledge, and it is extremely likely that this will continue to be the case - all the empirical evidence suggests that the link between the two is progressively consolidating. However, this gives rise to further problems for the historicist. In the first place, the statement that `if there is such a thing as growing human knowledge, then we cannot anticipate today what we shall know only tomorrow' is, Popper holds, intuitively highly plausible. Moreover, he argues, it is logically demonstrable by a consideration of the implications of the fact that no scientific predictor, human or otherwise, can possibly predict, by scientific methods, its own future results. From this it follows, he holds, that `no society can predict, scientifically, its own future states of knowledge'. (The Poverty of Historicism, vii). Thus, while the future evolution of human history is extremely likely to be influenced by new developments in human knowledge, as it always has in the past, we cannot now scientifically determine what such knowledge will be. From this it follows that if the future holds any new discoveries or any new developments in the growth of our knowledge (and given the fallible nature of the latter, it is inconceivable that it does not), then it is impossible for us to predict them now, and it is therefore impossible for us to predict the future development of human history now, given that the latter will, at least in part, be determined by the future growth of our knowledge. Thus once again historicism collapses - the dream of a theoretical, predictive science of history is unrealisable, because it is an impossible dream.
Popper's arguments against holism, and in particular his arguments against the propriety of large-scale planning of social structures, are interconnected with his demonstration of the logical shortcomings of the presuppositions of historicism. Such planning (which actually took place, of course, in the USSR, in China, and in Cambodia, for example, under totalitarian regimes which accepted forms of historicism and holism), Popper points out, is necessarily structured in the light of the predictions which have been made about future history on the basis of the so-called `laws' which historicists such as Marx and Mao claimed to have discovered in relation to human history. Accordingly, recognition that there are no such laws, and that unconditional predictions about future history are based, at best, upon nothing more substantial than the observation of contingent trends, shows that, from a purely theoretical as well as a practical point of view, large-scale social planning is indeed a recipe for disaster. In summary, unconditional large-scale planning for the future is theoretically as well as practically misguided, because, again, part of what we are planning for is our future knowledge, and our future knowledge is not something which we can in principle now possess - we cannot adequately plan for unexpected advances in our future knowledge, or for the effects which such advances will have upon society as a whole. The acceptance of historical indeterminism, then, as the only philosophy of history which is commensurate with a proper understanding of the nature of scientific knowledge, fatally undermines both historicism and holism.
Popper's critique of both historicism and holism is balanced, on the
positive side, by his strong defence of the open society, the view,
again, that a society is equivalent to the sum of its members, that
the actions of the members of society serve to fashion and to shape
it, not conversely, and that the social consequences of intentional
actions are very often, and very largely, unintentional. This is why
Popper himself advocates what he (rather unfortunately) terms
`piecemeal social engineering' as the central mechanism for social
planning - for in utilising this mechanism intentional actions are
directed to the achievement of one specific goal at a time, which
makes it possible to monitor the situation to determine whether
adverse unintended effects of intentional actions occur, in order to
correct and readjust when this proves necessary. This, of course,
parallels precisely the critical testing of theories in scientific
investigation. This approach to social planning (which is explicitly
based upon the premise that we do not, because we cannot, know what
the future will be like) encourages attempts to put right what is
problematic in society - generally-acknowledged social ills - rather
than attempts to impose some preconceived idea of the `good' upon
society as a whole. For this reason, in a genuinely open society
piecemeal social engineering goes hand-in-hand for Popper with
negative utilitarianism (the attempt to minimise the amount of
misery, rather than, as with positive utilitarianism, the attempt to
maximise the amount of happiness). The state, he holds, should concern
itself with the task of progressively formulating and implementing
policies designed to deal with the social problems which actually
confront it, with the goal of eliminating human misery and suffering
to the highest possible degree. The positive task of increasing social
and personal happiness, by contrast, can and should be should be left
to individual citizens (who may, of course, act collectively to this
end), who, unlike the state, have at least a chance of achieving this
goal, but who in a free society are rarely in a position to
systematically subvert the rights of others in the pursuit of
idealised objectives. Thus in the final analysis for Popper the
activity of problem-solving is as definitive of our humanity at the
level of social and political organisation as it is at the level of
science, and it is this key insight which unifies and integrates the
broad spectrum of his thought.
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1. Popper professes to be anti-conventionalist, and his commitment to the correspondence theory of truth places him firmly within the realist's camp. Yet, following Kant, he strongly repudiates the positivist/empiricist view that basic statements (i.e. present-tense observation statements about sense-data) are infallible, and argues convincingly that such basic statements are not mere `reports' of passively registered sensations. Rather they are descriptions of what is observed as interpreted by the observer with reference to a determinate theoretical framework. This is why Popper repeatedly emphasises that basic statements are not infallible, and it indicates what he means when he says that they are `theory laden' - perception itself is an active process, in which the mind assimilates data by reference to an assumed theoretical backdrop. He accordingly asserts that basic statements themselves are open-ended hypotheses: they have a certain causal relationship with experience, but they are not determined by experience, and they cannot be verified or confirmed by experience. However, this poses a difficulty regarding the consistency of Popper's theory: if a theory X is to be genuinely testable (and so scientific) it must be possible to determine whether or not the basic propositions which would, if true, falsify it, are actually true or false (i.e. whether its potential falsifiers are actual falsifiers). But how can this be known, if such basic statements cannot be verified by experience? Popper's answer is that `basic statements are not justifiable by our immediate experiences, but are .... accepted by an act, a free decision'. (Logic of Scientific Discovery, 109). However, and notwithstanding Popper's claims to the contrary, this itself seems to be a refined form of conventionalism - it implies that it is almost entirely an arbitrary matter whether it is accepted that a potential falsifier is an actual one, and consequently that the falsification of a theory is itself the function of a `free' and arbitrary act. It also seems very difficult to reconcile this with Popper's view that science progressively moves closer to the truth, conceived of in terms of the correspondence theory, for this kind of conventionalism is inimical to this (classical) conception of truth.
2. As Lakatos has pointed out, Popper's theory of demarcation hinges quite fundamentally on the assumption that there are such things as critical tests, which either conclusively falsify a theory, or give it a strong measure of corroboration. Popper himself is fond of citing, as an example of such a critical test, the resolution, by Adams and Leverrier, of the problem which the anomalous orbit of Uranus posed for nineteenth century astronomers. Both men independently came to the conclusion that, assuming Newtonian mechanics to be precisely correct, the observed divergence in the elliptical orbit of Uranus could be explained if the existence of a seventh, as yet unobserved outer planet was posited. Further, they were able, again within the framework of Newtonian mechanics, to calculate the precise position of the `new' planet. Thus when subsequent research by Galle at the Berlin observatory revealed that such a planet (Neptune) did in fact exist, and was situated precisely where Adams and Leverrier had calculated, this was hailed as by all and sundry as a magnificent triumph for Newtonian physics: in Popperian terms, Newton's theory had been subjected to a critical test, and had passed with flying colours. Popper himself refers to this strong corroboration of Newtonian physics as `the most startling and convincing success of any human intellectual achievement'. Yet Lakatos flatly denies that there are critical tests, in the Popperian sense, in science, and argues the point convincingly by turning the above example of an alleged critical test on its head. What, he asks, would have happened if Galle had not found the planet Neptune? Would Newtonian physics have been abandoned, or would Newton's theory have been falsified? The answer is clearly not, for Galle's failure could have been attributed to any number of causes other than the falsity of Newtonian physics (e.g. the interference of the earth's atmosphere with the telescope, the existence of an asteroid belt which hides the new planet from the earth, etc). The point here is that the `falsification/corroboration' disjunction offered by Popper is far too logically neat: non-corroboration is not necessarily falsification, and falsification of a high-level scientific theory is never brought about by an isolated observation or set of observations. Such theories are, it is now generally accepted, highly resistant to falsification. They are falsified, if at all, Lakatos argues, not by Popperian critical tests, but rather within the elaborate context of the research programmes associated with them gradually grinding to a halt, with the result that an ever-widening gap opens up between the facts to be explained, and the research programmes themselves. (Lakatos, I. The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes, passim). Popper's distinction between the logic of falsifiability and its applied methodology does not in the end do full justice to the fact that all high-level theories grow and live despite the existence of anomalies (i.e. events/phenomena which are incompatible with the theories). The existence of such anomalies is not usually taken by the working scientist as an indication that the theory in question is false; on the contrary, he will usually, and necessarily, assume that the auxiliary hypotheses which are associated with the theory can be modified to incorporate, and explain, existing anomalies.
3. Scientific laws are expressed by universal statements (i.e. they take the logical form `All A's are X', or some equivalent) which are therefore concealed conditionals - they have to be understood as hypothetical statements asserting what would be the case under certain ideal conditions. In themselves they are not existential in nature. Thus `All A's are X' means `If anything is an A, then it is X'. Since scientific laws are non-existential in nature, they logically cannot imply any basic statements, since the latter are explicitly existential. The question arises, then, as to how any basic statement can falsify a scientific law, given that basic statements are not deducible from scientific laws in themselves? Popper answers that scientific laws are always taken in conjunction with statements outlining the `initial conditions' of the system under investigation; these latter, which are singular existential statements, do, when combined with the scientific law, yield hard and fast implications. Thus, the law `All A's are X', together with the initial condition statement `There is an A at Y', yields the implication `The A at Y is X', which, if false, falsifies the original law.
This reply is adequate only if it is true, as Popper assumes, that singular existential statements will always do the work of bridging the gap between a universal theory and a prediction. Hilary Putnam in particular has argued that this assumption is false, in that in some cases at least the statements required to bridge this gap (which he calls `auxiliary hypotheses') are general rather than particular, and consequently that when the prediction turns out to be false we have no way of knowing whether this is due to the falsity of the scientific law or the falsity of the auxiliary hypotheses. The working scientist, Putnam argues, always initially assumes that it is the latter, which shows not only that scientific laws are, contra Popper, highly resistant to falsification, but also why they are so highly resistant to falsification.
Popper's final position is that he acknowledges that it is impossible
to discriminate science from non-science on the basis of the
falsifiability of the scientific statements alone; he
recognizes that scientific theories are predictive, and consequently
prohibitive, only when taken in conjunction with auxiliary
hypotheses, and he also recognizes that readjustment or modification
of the latter is an integral part of scientific practice. Hence his
final concern is to outline conditions which indicate when such
modification is genuinely scientific, and when it is merely ad
hoc. This is itself clearly a major alteration in his position,
and arguably represents a substantial retraction on his part: Marxism
can no longer be dismissed as `unscientific' simply because its
advocates preserved the theory from falsification by modifying it (for
in general terms, such a procedure, it now transpires, is perfectly
respectable scientific practice). It is now condemned as unscientific
by Popper because the only rationale for the modifications
which were made to the original theory was to ensure that it evaded
falsification, and so such modifications were ad hoc, rather
than scientific. This contention - though not at all implausible -
has, to hostile eyes, a somewhat contrived air about it, and is
unlikely to worry the convinced Marxist. On the other hand, the shift
in Popper's own basic position is taken by some critics as an
indicator that falsificationism, for all its apparent merits, fares no
better in the final analysis than verificationism.
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First published: November 13, 1997
Content last modified: December 20, 1998