Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Experiment in Physics
Physics, and natural science in general, is a reasonable enterprise
based on valid experimental evidence, criticism, and rational
discussion. It provides us with knowledge of the physical world and it
is experiment that provides the evidence that grounds that knowledge.
Experiment plays many roles in science. One of its important roles is
to test theories and to provide the basis for scientific
knowledge.\*/ It can also
call for a new theory, either by showing that an accepted theory is
incorrect, or by exhibiting a new phenomenon which needs explanation.
Experiment can provide hints toward the structure or mathematical form
of a theory and it can provide evidence for the existence of the
entities involved in our theories. Finally, it may also have a life of
its own, independent of theory. Scientists may investigate a
phenomenon just because it looks interesting. This will also provide
evidence for a future theory to explain. [Examples of these different
roles will be presented below.] As we shall see below, a single
experiment may play several of these roles at once.
If experiment is to play these important roles in science then we
must have good reasons to believe experimental results, for science is
a fallible enterprise. Theoretical calculations, experimental results,
or the comparison between experiment and theory may all be
wrong. Science is more complex than "The scientist proposes, Nature
disposes." It may not always be clear what the scientist is
proposing. Theories often need to be articulated and clarified. It
also may not be clear how Nature is disposing. Experiments may not
always give clear-cut results, and may even disagree for a time.
In what follows, the reader will find an epistemology of
experiment, a set of strategies that provides reasonable belief in
experimental results. Scientific knowledge can then be reasonably
based on these experimental results.
It has been almost two decades since Ian Hacking asked, "Do we see
through a microscope?" (Hacking 1981). Hacking's question really
asked how do we come to believe in an experimental result obtained
with a complex experimental apparatus? How do we distinguish between a
valid result\1/ and an
artifact created by that apparatus? If experiment is to play all of
the important roles in science mentioned above and to provide the
evidential basis for scientific knowledge, then we must have good
reasons to believe in those results. Hacking provided an extended
answer in the second half of Representing and Intervening
(1983). He pointed out that even though an experimental apparatus is
laden with, at the very least, the theory of the apparatus,
observations remain robust despite changes in the theory of the
apparatus or in the theory of the phenomenon. His illustration was
the continuous belief in microscope images despite the major change in
the theory of the microscope when Abbe pointed out the importance of
diffraction in its operation. One reason Hacking gave for this is
that in making such observations the experimenters intervened. They
manipulated the object under observation. Thus, in looking at a cell
through a microscope one might inject fluid into the cell or stain the
specimen. One expects the cell to change shape or color when this is
done. Observing the predicted effect strengthens our belief in both
the proper operation of the microscope and in the observation. This is
true in general. Observing the predicted effect of an intervention
strengthens our belief in both the proper operation of the
experimental apparatus and in the observations made with it.
Hacking also discussed the strengthening of one's belief in an
observation by independent confirmation. The fact that the same
pattern of dots, dense bodies in cells, is seen with "different"
microscopes, i.e. ordinary, polarizing, phase-contrast, fluorescence,
interference, electron, acoustic etc., argues for the validity of the
observation. One might question whether or not "different" is theory
laden. After all, it is our theory of light and of the microscope that
allows us to consider these microscopes "different." Nevertheless, the
argument goes through. Hacking correctly argues that it would be a
preposterous coincidence if the same pattern of dots were produced in
two totally different kinds of physical systems. Different apparatuses
have different backgrounds and systematic errors, making the
coincidence, if it is an artifact, most unlikely. If it is a correct
result, and the instruments are working properly, the coincidence of
results is understandable.
Hacking's answer is correct as far as it goes. It is, however,
incomplete. What happens when one can perform the experiment with only
one type of apparatus, such as an electron microscope or a radio
telescope, or when intervention is either impossible or extremely
difficult? Other strategies are needed to validate the
observation.\2/ These may
1) Experimental checks and calibration, in which the
experimental apparatus reproduces known phenomena. For example, if we
wished to argue that the spectrum of a substance obtained with a new
type of spectrometer is correct, we might check that this new
spectrometer could reproduce the known Balmer Series in hydrogen. If
we correctly observe the Balmer Series then we strengthen our belief
that the spectrometer is working properly. This also strengthens our
belief in the results obtained with that spectrometer. If the check
fails then we have good reason to question the results obtained with
These strategies along with Hacking's intervention and independent
confirmation constitute an epistemology of experiment. They provide us
with good reasons for belief in experimental results, They do not,
however, guarantee that the results are correct. There are many
experiments in which these strategies are applied, but whose results
are later shown to be incorrect (examples will be presented
below). Experiment is fallible.
In How Experiments End (1987), Peter Galison extended the
discussion of experiment to more complex situations. In his histories
of the measurements of the gyromagnetic ratio of the electron, of the
discovery of the muon, and of the discovery of weak neutral currents,
he considered a series of experiments measuring a single quantity, a
set of different experiments culminating in a discovery, and two high
energy physics experiments performed by large groups with complex
2) Reproducing artifacts that are known in advance to be present. An
example of this comes from experiments to measure the infrared spectra
of organic molecules (Randall et al. 1949). It was not always
possible to prepare a pure sample of such material. Sometimes one had
to place the substance in an oil paste or in solution. In such cases,
one expects to observe, superimposed on the spectrum of the substance,
the spectrum of the oil or the solvent, which one can compare with the
known spectrum of the oil or the solvent. Observation of this artifact
gives confidence in other measurements made with the spectrometer.
3) Elimination of plausible sources of error and alternative
explanations of the result (the Sherlock Holmes
strategy).\3/ Thus, when
scientists claimed to have observed electric discharges in the rings
of Saturn, they argued for their result by showing that it could not
have been caused by defects in the telemetry, by interaction with the
environment of Saturn, by lightning, or by dust. The only remaining
explanation of their result was that it was due to electric discharges
in the rings. There was no other plausible explanation of the
observation. In addition, the same result was observed by both Voyager
1 and Voyager 2. This provided independent confirmation. Often,
several epistemological strategies are used in the same experiment.
4) Using the results themselves to argue for their
validity. Consider the problem of Galileo's telescopic observations of
the moons of Jupiter. Although one might very well believe that his
early telescope might have created spots of light, it would have been
extremely implausible that the telescope would create them so that
they would appear to be a small planetary system with eclipses and
other consistent motions. It would have been even more implausible to
believe that the created spots would satisfy Kepler's Third Law
(R3/T2 = constant). A similar argument was used
by Robert Millikan to support his observation of the quantization of
electric charge and his measurement of the charge of the
electron. Millikan remarked, "The total number of changes which we
have observed would be between one and two thousand, and in not
one single instance has there been any change which did not represent
the advent upon the drop of one definite invariable quantity of
electricity or a very small multiple of that quantity"(Millikan
1911, p. 360). In both of these cases one is arguing that there was no
plausible malfunction of the apparatus, or background, that would
explain the observations.
5) Using an independently well-corroborated theory of the phenomena
to explain the results. This was illustrated in the discovery of the
W±, the charged intermediate vector boson required
by the Weinberg-Salam unified theory of electroweak
interactions. Although these experiments used very complex apparatuses
and used other epistemological strategies (see (Franklin 1986,
pp. 170-72) for details) I believe that the agreement of the
observations with the theoretical predictions of the particle
properties helped to validate the experimental results. In this case
the particle candidates were observed in events that contained an
electron with high transverse momentum and in which there were no
particle jets, just as predicted by the theory. In addition, the
measured particle mass of 81 ± 5 GeV/c2 and
80+10-6, GeV/c2, found in
the two experiments (note the independent confirmation also), was in
good agreement with the theoretical prediction of 82 ± 2.4
GeV/c2. It was very improbable that any background effect,
which might mimic the presence of the particle, would be in agreement
6) Using an apparatus based on a well-corroborated theory. In this
case the support for the theory passes on to the apparatus based on
that theory. This is the case with both the electron microscope and
the radio telescope, whose proper operation is based on a
well-supported theory, although other strategies are also used to
validate the observations.
7) Using statistical arguments. An interesting example of this arose
in the 1960s when the search for new particles and resonances occupied
a substantial fraction of the time and effort of those physicists
working in experimental high-energy physics. The usual technique was
to plot the number of events observed as a function of the invariant
mass of the final-state particles and to look for bumps above a smooth
background. The usual informal criterion for the presence of a new
particle was that it resulted in a three standard-deviation effect
above the background, a result that had a probability of 0.27% of
occurring in a single bin. This criterion was later changed to four
standard deviations, which had a probability of 0.0064% when it was
pointed out that the number of graphs plotted each year by high-energy
physicists made it rather probable, on statistical grounds, that a three
standard-deviation effect would be observed.
Galison's view is that experiments end when the experimenters believe
that they have a result that will stand up in court. A result that I
believe will include, and has included, the use of the epistemological
strategies discussed earlier. Thus, David Cline, one of the weak
neutral current experimenters remarked, "At present I don't see how to
make these effects [the weak neutral current event candidates] go
away" (Galison, 1987, p. 235).
Galison emphasizes that, within a large experimental group, different
members of the group may find different pieces of evidence most
convincing. In the Gargamelle weak neutral current experiment, several
group members found the single photograph of a neutrino-electron
scattering event particularly important, whereas for others the
difference in spatial distribution between the observed neutral
current candidates and the neutron background was decisive. Galison
attributes this, in large part, to differences in experimental
traditions, in which scientists develop skill in using certain types
of instruments or apparatus. In particle physics, for example, there
is the tradition of visual detectors, such as the cloud chamber or the
bubble chamber, in contrast to the electronic tradition of Geiger and
scintillation counters and spark chambers. Scientists within the
visual tradition tend to prefer "golden events" that clearly
demonstrate the phenomenon in question, whereas those in the
electronic tradition tend to find statistical arguments more
persuasive and important than individual events. (For further
discussion of this issue see Galison (1997)).
Galison points out that major changes in theory and in experimental
practice and instruments do not necessarily occur at the same
time. This persistence of experimental results provides continuity
across these conceptual changes. The experiments on the gyromagnetic
ratio spanned classical electromagnetism, Bohr's old quantum theory,
and the new quantum mechanics of Heisenberg and Schrodinger. Robert
Ackermann has offered a similar view in his discussion of scientific
The advantages of a scientific instrument are that it cannot change
theories. Instruments embody theories, to be sure, or we wouldn't have
any grasp of the significance of their operation....Instruments create
an invariant relationship between their operations and the world, at
least when we abstract from the expertise involved in their correct
use. When our theories change, we may conceive of the significance of
the instrument and the world with which it is interacting differently,
and the datum of an instrument may change in significance, but the
datum can nonetheless stay the same, and will typically be expected to
do so. An instrument reads 2 when exposed to some phenomenon. After a
change in theory,\4/ it will
continue to show the same reading, even though we may take the reading
to be no longer important, or to tell us something other than what we
thought originally (Ackermann 1985, p. 33).
Galison also discusses other aspects of the interaction between
experiment and theory. Theory may influence what is considered to be a
real effect, demanding explanation, and what is considered
background. In his discussion of the discovery of the muon, he argues
that the calculation of Oppenheimer and Carlson, which showed that
showers were to be expected in the passage of electrons through
matter, left the penetrating particles, later shown to be muons, as
the problem. Prior to their work, physicists thought the showering
particles were the problem, whereas the penetrating particles seemed
to be understood.
The role of theory as an "enabling theory," one that allows
calculation or estimation of the size of the expected effect and also
the size of expected backgrounds is also discussed by Galison. (See
also (Franklin 1995b) and the discussion of the Stern-Gerlach
experiment below). Such a theory can help to determine whether or not
an experiment is feasible. He also emphasizes that elimination of
background that might simulate or mask an effect is central to the
experimental enterprise, and not a peripheral activity. In the case of
the weak neutral current experiments the existence of the currents
depended crucially on showing that the event candidates could not all
be due to neutron background.\5/
There is also a danger that the design of an experiment may preclude
observation of a phenomenon. Galison points out that the original
design of one of the neutral current experiments, which included a
muon trigger would not have allowed the observation of neutral
currents. In its original form the experiment was designed to observe
charged currents, which produced a high energy muon. Neutral currents
do not. Therefore, having a muon trigger precluded their
observation. Only after the theoretical importance of the search for
neutral currents was emphasized to the experimenters was the trigger
changed. Changing the design did not, of course, guarantee that
neutral currents would be observed.
Galison also shows that the theoretical presuppositions of the
experimenters may enter into the decision to end an experiment and
report the result. Einstein and de Haas ended their search for
systematic errors when their value for the gyromagnetic ratio of the
electron, g = 1, agreed with their theoretical model of
orbiting electrons. This effect of presuppositions might cause one to
be skeptical of both experimental results and their role in theory
evaluation. Galison's history shows, however, that, in this case, the
importance of the measurement led to many repetitions of the
measurement. This resulted in an agreed upon result that disagreed
with theoretical expectations. Scientists do not always find what
they are looking for.
Collins, Pickering, and others, have raised objections to the view
that experimental results are accepted on the basis of epistemological
arguments. They point out that "a sufficiently determined critic can
always find a reason to dispute any alleged `result'" (MacKenzie 1989,
p. 412). Harry Collins, for example, is well known for his skepticism
concerning both experimental results and evidence. He develops an
argument that he calls the "experimenters' regress" (Collins 1985,
chapter 4, pp. 79-111): What scientists take to be a correct result is
one obtained with a good, that is, properly functioning, experimental
apparatus. But a good experimental apparatus is simply one that gives
correct results. Collins claims that there are no formal criteria that
one can apply to decide whether or not an experimental apparatus is
working properly. In particular, he argues that calibrating an
experimental apparatus by using a surrogate signal cannot provide an
independent reason for considering the apparatus to be reliable.
In Collins' view the regress is eventually broken by negotiation
within the appropriate scientific community, a process driven by
factors such as the career, social, and cognitive interests of the
scientists, and the perceived utility for future work, but one that is
not decided by what we might call epistemological criteria, or
reasoned judgment. Thus, Collins concludes that his regress raises
serious questions concerning both experimental evidence and its use in
the evaluation of scientific hypotheses and theories. Indeed, if no
way out of the regress can be found then he has a point.
Collins strongest candidate for an example of the experimenters'
regress is presented in his history of the early attempts to detect
gravitational radiation, or gravity waves. (For more detailed
discussion of this episode see (Collins 1985; 1994; Franklin 1994;
1997a) In this case, the physics community was forced to compare
Weber's claims that he had observed gravity waves with the reports
from six other experiments that failed to detect them. On the one
hand, Collins argues that the decision between these conflicting
experimental results could not be made on epistemological or
methodological grounds. He claims that the six negative experiments
could not legitimately be regarded as
replications\6/ and hence
become less impressive. On the other hand, Weber's apparatus,
precisely because the experiments used a new type of apparatus to try
to detect a hitherto unobserved
phenomenon,\7/ could not be
subjected to standard calibration techniques.
The results presented by Weber's critics were not only more numerous,
but they had also been carefully cross-checked. The groups had
exchanged both data and analysis programs and confirmed their
results. The critics had also investigated whether or not their
analysis procedure, the use of a linear algorithm, could account for
their failure to observe Weber's reported results. They had used
Weber's preferred procedure, a nonlinear algorithm, to analyze their
own data, and still found no sign of an effect. They had also
calibrated their experimental apparatuses by inserting acoustic pulses
of known energy and finding that they could detect a signal. Weber, on
the other hand, as well as his critics using his analysis procedure,
could not detect such calibration pulses.
There were, in addition, several other serious questions raised about
Weber's analysis procedures. These included an admitted programming
error that generated spurious coincidences between Weber's two
detectors, possible selection bias by Weber, Weber's report of
coincidences between two detectors when the data had been taken four
hours apart, and whether or not Weber's experimental apparatus could
produce the narrow coincidences claimed.
It seems clear that the critics' results were far more credible than
Weber's. They had checked their results by independent confirmation,
which included the sharing of data and analysis programs. They had
also eliminated a plausible source of error, that of the pulses being
longer than expected, by analyzing their results using the nonlinear
algorithm and by explicitly searching for such long
pulses.\8/ They had also
calibrated their apparatuses by injecting pulses of known energy and
observing the output.
Contrary to Collins, I believe that the scientific community made a
reasoned judgment and rejected Weber's results and accepted those of
his critics. Although no formal rules were applied, i.e. if you make
four errors, rather than three, your results lack credibility; or if
there are five, but not six, conflicting results, your work is still
credible; the procedure was reasonable.
Pickering argues that the reasons for accepting results are the
future utility of such results for both theoretical and experimental
practice and the agreement of such results with the existing community
commitments. In discussing the discovery of weak neutral currents,
Quite simply, particle physicists accepted the existence of the
neutral current because they could see how to ply their trade more
profitably in a world in which the neutral current was real. (1984b,
The emphasis on future utility and existing commitments is clear.
These two criteria do not necessarily agree. For example, there are
episodes in the history of science in which more opportunity for
future work is provided by the overthrow of existing theory. (See, for
example, the history of the overthrow of parity conservation and of CP
symmetry discussed below and in (Franklin 1986, Ch. 1, 3)).
Pickering has recently offered a different view of experimental
results. In his view the material procedure including the experimental
apparatus itself along with setting it up, running it, and monitoring
its operation; the theoretical model of that apparatus, and the
theoretical model of the phenomena under investigation are all plastic
resources that the investigator brings into relations of mutual
support. (Pickering 1987; Pickering 1989). He says:
Scientific communities tend to reject data that conflict with group
commitments and, obversely, to adjust their experimental techniques to
tune in on phenomena consistent with those commitments. (1981,
Achieving such relations of mutual support is, I suggest, the
defining characteristic of the successful experiment. (1987,
His example is Morpurgo's search for free quarks, or fractional
charges of 1/3 e or 2/3 e, where e is the
charge of the electron. (See also (Gooding 1992)). Morpurgo used a
modern Millikan-type apparatus and initially found a continuous
distribution of charge values. Following some tinkering with the
apparatus, Morpurgo found that if he separated the capacitor plates he
obtained only integral values of charge. "After some theoretical
analysis, Morpurgo concluded that he now had his apparatus working
properly, and reported his failure to find any evidence for fractional
charges" (Pickering 1987, p. 197).
Pickering has made the important point that experimental apparatuses
rarely work properly when they are first operated, and that some
adjustment, or tinkering, is required before it does. He has also
correctly pointed out that the theory of the apparatus and the theory
of the phenomena can, and do, form part of the argument for the
validity of an experimental result. He has, I believe, overemphasized
theory. It was known, from Millikan onwards, that fractional charges,
if they exist at all, are very rare in comparison with integral
charges. The failure of Morpurgo's apparatus to find integral charges
indicated quite strongly that, despite his initial theoretical
analysis, it was not an accurate charge measuring device. Only after
tinkering, when the apparatus measured integral charges, and thus
passed a crucial experimental check, could one legitimately trust its
measurements of charge. Although the modified theoretical analysis may
have helped to clarify this, it was the experimental check that was
crucial. There is more to an experimental apparatus than its
Ackermann has offered a modification of Pickering's view. He suggests
that the experimental apparatus itself is a less plastic resource then
either the theoretical model of the apparatus or that of the
To repeat, changes in A [the apparatus] can often be seen (in real
time, without waiting for accommodation by B [the theoretical model of
the apparatus]) as improvements, whereas `improvements' in B don't
begin to count unless A is actually altered and realizes the
improvements conjectured. It's conceivable that this small asymmetry
can account, ultimately, for large scale directions of scientific
progress and for the objectivity and rationality of those directions.
(Ackermann 1991, p. 456)
Hacking (1992) has also offered a more complex version of Pickering's
later view. He suggests that the results of mature laboratory science
achieve stability and are self-vindicating when the elements of
laboratory science are brought into mutual consistency and
support. These are (1) ideas: questions, background knowledge,
systematic theory, topical hypotheses, and modeling of the apparatus;
(2) things: target, source of modification, detectors, tools, and data
generators; and (3) marks and the manipulation of marks: data, data
assessment, data reduction, data analysis, and interpretation.
Stable laboratory science arises when theories and laboratory
equipment evolve in such a way that they match each other and are
mutually self-vindicating. (1992, p. 56)
One might ask whether or not such mutual adjustment between theory
and experimental results can always be achieved? What happens when an
experimental result is produced by an apparatus on which several of
the epistemological strategies, discussed earlier, have been
successfully applied, and the result is in disagreement with our
theory of the phenomenon? Accepted theories can be refuted. Several
examples will be presented below.
We invent devices that produce data and isolate or create phenomena,
and a network of different levels of theory is true to these
phenomena. Conversely we may in the end count them only as phenomena
only when the data can be interpreted by theory. (pp. 57-8)
Hacking himself worries about what happens when a laboratory science
that is true to the phenomena generated in the laboratory, thanks to
mutual adjustment and self-vindication, is successfully applied to the
world outside the laboratory. Does this argue for the truth of the
science. In Hacking's view it does not. If laboratory science does
produce happy effects in the "untamed world,... it is not the truth of
anything that causes or explains the happy effects" (1992, p. 60).
There is a rather severe disagreement on the reasons for the
acceptance of experimental results. For some, like Galison and
myself, it is because of epistemological arguments. For others, like
Pickering, the reasons are utility for future practice and agreement
with existing theoretical commitments. Although the history of science
shows that the overthrow of a well-accepted theory leads to an
enormous amount of theoretical and experimental work, proponents of
this view seem to accept it as unproblematical that it is always
agreement with existing theory that has more future utility. Hacking
and Pickering also suggest that experimental results are accepted on
the basis of the mutual adjustment of elements which includes the
theory of the phenomenon.
Nevertheless, everyone seems to agree that a consensus does arise on
experimental results. The question then is how are these results used?
Although experiment often takes its importance from its relation to
theory, Hacking pointed out that it often has a life of its own,
independent of theory. He notes the pristine observations of Carolyn
Herschel's discovery of comets, William Herschel's work on "radiant
heat," and Davy's observation of the gas emitted by algae and the
flaring of a taper in that gas. In none of these cases did the
experimenter have any theory of the phenomenon under
investigation. One may also note the nineteenth century measurements
of atomic spectra and the work on the masses and properties on
elementary particles during the 1960s. Both of these sequences were
conducted without any guidance from theory.
In deciding what experimental investigation to pursue, scientists may
very well be influenced by the equipment available and their own
ability to use that equipment (McKinney 1992). Thus, when the
Mann-O'Neill collaboration was doing high energy physics experiments
at the Princeton-Pennsylvania Accelerator during the late 1960s, the
sequence of experiments was (1) measurement of the K+ decay
rates, (2) measurement of the K +e3 branching
ratio and decay spectrum, (3) measurement of the
K+e2 branching ratio, and (4) measurement of the
form factor in K+e3 decay. These experiments
were performed with basically the same experimental apparatus, but
with relatively minor modifications for each particular experiment. By
the end of the sequence the experimenters had become quite expert in
the use of the apparatus and knowledgeable about the backgrounds and
experimental problems. This allowed the group to successfully perform
the technically more difficult experiments later in the sequence. We
might refer to this as "instrumental loyalty" and the "recycling of
expertise" (Franklin 1997b). This meshes nicely with Galison's view of
experimental traditions. Scientists, both theorists and
experimentalists, tend to pursue experiments and problems in which
their training and expertise can be used.
Hacking also remarks on the "noteworthy observations" on Iceland Spar
by Bartholin, on diffraction by Hooke and Grimaldi, and on the
dispersion of light by Newton. "Now of course Bartholin, Grimaldi,
Hooke, and Newton were not mindless empiricists without an `idea' in
their heads. They saw what they saw because they were curious,
inquisitive, reflective people. They were attempting to form
theories. But in all these cases it is clear that the observations
preceded any formulation of theory" (Hacking 1983, p. 156). In all of
these cases we may say that these were observations waiting for, or
perhaps even calling for, a theory. The discovery of any unexpected
phenomenon calls for a theoretical explanation.
Nevertheless several of the important roles of experiment involve its
relation to theory. Experiment may confirm a theory, refute a theory,
or give hints to the mathematical structure of a theory.
Let us consider first an episode in which the relation between theory
and experiment was clear and straightforward. This was a "crucial"
experiment, one that decided unequivocally between two competing
theories, or classes of theory. The episode was that of the discovery
that parity, mirror-reflection symmetry or left-right symmetry, is not
conserved in the weak interactions. (For details of this episode see
Franklin (1986, Ch. 1) and
Appendix 1). Experiments showed that in the
beta decay of nuclei the number of electrons emitted in the same
direction as the nuclear spin was different from the number emitted
opoosite to the spin direction. This was a clear demonstartion of
parity vilation in the weak interactions.
After the discovery of parity and charge conjugation nonconservation,
and following a suggestion by Landau, physicists considered CP
(combined parity and particle-antiparticle symmetry), which was still
conserved in the experiments, as the appropriate symmetry. One
consequence of this scheme, if CP were conserved, was that the
K1o meson could decay into two pions, whereas
the K 2o meson could
not.\9/ Thus, observation of
the decay of K2o into two pions would indicate
CP violation. The decay was observed by a group at Princeton
University. Although several alternative explanations were offered,
experiments eliminated each of the alternatives leaving only CP
violation as an explanation of the experimental result. (For details
of this episode see Franklin (1986, Ch. 3) and Appendix 2.)
In both of the episodes discussed previously, those of parity
nonconservation and of CP violation, we saw a decision between two
competing classes of theories. This episode, the discovery of
Bose-Einstein condensation (BEC), illustrates the confirmation of a
specific theoretical prediction 70 years after the theoretical
prediction was first made. Bose (1924) and Einstein (1924; 1925)
predicted that a gas of noninteracting bosonic atoms will, below a
certain temperature, suddenly develop a macroscopic population in the
lowest energy quantum
state.\10/ (For details of
this episode see Appendix 3.)
In the three episodes discussed in the previous section, the relation
between experiment and theory was clear. The experiments gave
unequivocal results and there was no ambiguity about what theory was
predicting. None of the conclusions reached has since been
questioned. Parity and CP symmetry are violated in the weak
interactions and Bose-Einstein condensation is an accepted
phenomenon. In the practice of science things are often more
complex. Experimental results may be in conflict, or may even be
incorrect. Theoretical calculations may also be in error or a correct
theory may be incorrectly applied. There are even cases in which both
experiment and theory are wrong. As noted earlier, science is
fallible. In this section I will briefly discuss several episodes
which illustrate these complexities.
The episode of the fifth force is the case of a refutation of
an hypoothesis, but only after a disagreement between experimental results
was resolved. The "Fifth Force" was a proposed modification of
Newton's Law of Universal Gravitation. The initial experiments gave
conflicting results: one supported the existence of the Fifth Force
whereas the other argued against it. After numerous repetitions of the
experiment, the discord was resolved and a consensus reached that the
Fifth Force did not exist. (For details of this episode see
The Stern-Gerlach experiment was regarded as crucial at the time it
was performed, but, in fact, wasn't. In the view of the physics
community it decided the issue between two theories, refuting one and
supporting the other. In the light of later work, however, the
refutation stood, but the confirmation was questionable. In fact, the
experimental result posed problems for the theory it had seemingly
confirmed. A new theory was proposed and although the Stern-Gerlach
result initially also posed problems for the new theory, after a
modification of that new theory, the result confirmed it. In a sense,
it was crucial after all. It just took some time.
The Stern-Gerlach experiment provides evidence for the existence of
electron spin. These experimental results were first published in
1922, although the idea of electron spin wasn't proposed by Goudsmit
and Uhlenbeck until 1925 (1925; 1926). One might say that electron
spin was discovered before it was invented. (For details of this
In the last section we saw some of the difficulty inherent in
experiment-theory comparison. One is sometimes faced with the question
of whether the experimental apparatus satisfies the conditions
required by theory, or conversely, whether the appropriate theory is
being compared to the experimental result. A case in point is the
history of experiments on the double-scattering of electrons by heavy
nuclei (Mott scattering) during the 1930s and the relation of these
results to Dirac's theory of the electron, an episode in which the
question of whether or not the experiment satisfied the conditions of
the theoretical calculation was central. Initially, experiments
disagreed with Mott's calculation, casting doubt on the underlying
Dirac theory. After more than a decade of work, both experimental and
theoretical, it was realized that there was a background effect in the
experiments that masked the predicted effect. When the background was
eliminated experiment and theory agreed. (Appendix
Experiment can also provide us with evidence for the existence of the
entities involved in our theories. J.J. Thomson's experiments on
cathode rays provided grounds for belief in the existence of electrons.
(For details of this episode see Appendix 7).
Experiment can also help to articulate a theory. Experiments on beta
decay during from the 1930s to the 1950s detremined the precise
mathematical form of Fermi's theory of beta decay. (For details of
this episode see Appendix 8.)
In this essay varying views on the nature of experimental results have
been presented. Some argue that the acceptance of experimental results
is based on epistemological arguments, whereas others base acceptance
on future utility, social interests, or agreement with existing
community commitments. Everyone agrees , however, that for whatever
reasons, a consensus is reached on experimental results. These results
then play many important roles in physics and we have examined several
of these roles, although certainly not all of them. We have seen
experiment deciding between two competing theories, calling for a new
theory, confirming a theory, refuting a theory, providing evidence that determined the mathematical form of a theory, and providing evidence
for the existence of an elementary particle involved in an accepted
theory. We have also seen that experiment has a life of its own,
independent of theory. If, as I believe, epistemological procedures
provide grounds for reasonable belief in experimental results, then
experiment can legitimately play the roles I have discussed and can
provide the basis for scientific knowledge.
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Other Suggested Reading
- Ackermann, R. 1988. "Experiments as the Motor of Scientific
Progress". Social Epistemology 2: 327-335.
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Experiment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- Pickering, A., Ed. 1992. Science as Practice and
Culture. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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University of Chicago Press.
- Pinch, T. 1986. Confronting Nature. Dordrecht: Reidel.
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Philosophy of Science 24: 227-265.
- Shapere, D. 1982. "The Concept of Observation in Science and
Philosophy". Philosophy of Science 49: 482-525.
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