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Ontological Arguments

Ontological arguments are arguments, for the conclusion that God exists, from premisses which are supposed to derive from some source other than observation of the world -- e.g. from reason alone. In other words, ontological arguments are arguments from analytic, a priori or necessary premises to the conclusion that God exists.

The first, and best-known, ontological argument was proposed by St. Anselm of Canterbury in the 11th. century A.D. In his Proslogion, St. Anselm claims to derive the existence of God from the concept of a being than which no greater can be conceived. St. Anselm reasoned that, if such a being fails to exist, then a greater being -- namely, a being than which no greater can be conceived, and which exists -- can be conceived. But this would be absurd: nothing can be greater than a being than which no greater can be conceived. So a being than which no greater can be conceived -- i.e. God -- exists.

Other famous ontological arguments were developed by Rene Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz, and, more recently, by Charles Hartshorne, Alvin Plantinga and Kurt Gödel.

Immanuel Kant developed a famous criticism of ontological arguments, namely, that they appeal to the questionable premise that "existence" is a predicate. However, as Bertrand Russell observed, it is much easier to be persuaded that ontological arguments are no good than it is to say exactly what is wrong with them. This helps to explain why ontological arguments have fascinated philosophers for almost a thousand years.

While the foregoing captures the traditional philosophical definition of an ontological argument, there are ways in which this rough account could be improved upon. For example, there are ontological arguments for the conclusion that God does not exist. More generally, there are ontological arguments for and against the existence of all kinds of gods, and, indeed, for and against the existence of all manner of other kinds of entities. For further problems, see the discussion in the following sections.

History of Ontological Arguments

1078:St. Anselm Proslogion. Followed soon after by Gaunilo's critique In Behalf of the Fool.

1264: Aquinas Summa. Criticises an argument which somehow descends from St. Anselm.

1637: Descartes Meditations. The Objections -- particularly those of Caterus and Gassendi -- and the Replies contain much valuable discussion of the Cartesian arguments.

c1680: Spinoza Ethics. Intimations of a defensible mereological ontological argument, albeit one whose conclusion is not (obviously) endowed with religious significance.

1709: Leibniz New Essays Concerning Human Understanding. Contains Leibniz's attempt to complete the Cartesian argument by showing that the Cartesian conception of God is not inconsistent.

1776: Hume Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Part IX is a general attack on a priori arguments (both analytic and synthetic). Includes a purported demonstration that no such arguments can be any good.

1787: Kant Critique of Pure Reason. Contains famous attack on traditional theistic arguments. Three objections to "the ontological argument", including the famous objection based on the dictum that existence is not a predicate.

1831: Hegel Lectures of 1831. Famous assertion -- uncontaminated by argument -- of the correctness of ontological arguments.

1884: Frege Foundations of Arithmetic. Existence is a second-order predicate. First-order existence claims are meaningless. So ontological arguments -- whose conclusions are first-order existence claims -- are doomed.

1941: Hartshorne Man's Vision of God. Defence of modal ontological arguments, allegedly derived from Proslogion 3.

1960: Malcolm "Anselm's Ontological Argument". Defence of modal ontological arguments by a famous ordinary philosopher.

1970: Lewis "Anselm and Actuality". The key critique of ontological arguments. All ontological arguments are either invalid or question-begging; moreover, in many cases, they have two closely related readings, one of which falls into each of the above categories.

1974: Plantinga The Nature of Necessity. Plantinga's "victorious" modal ontological argument.

1995: Gödel Collected Works Volume III. Gödel's ontological argument.

Taxonomy of Ontological Arguments

According to the taxonomy of Oppy (1995), there are seven major kinds of ontological arguments, viz:

(1) definitional ontological arguments;
(2) conceptual (or hyperintensional) ontological arguments;
(3) modal ontological arguments;
(4) Meinongian ontological arguments;
(5) experiential ontological arguments;
(6) mereological ontological arguments; and
(7) `Hegelian' ontological arguments.

Examples of each follow. These are mostly toy examples. But they serve to highlight the deficiencies which more complex examples also share.

(1) By definition, God is a being which has every perfection. Existence is a perfection. Hence God exists.

(2) I conceive of a being than which no greater can be conceived. If a being than which no greater can be conceived does not exist, then I can conceive of a being greater than a being than which no greater can be conceived -- namely, a being than which no greater can be conceived that exists. I cannot conceive of a being greater than a being than which no greater can be conceived. Hence, a being than which no greater can be conceived exists.

(3) It is possible that it is necessary that God exists. Hence, God exists.

(4) [It is analytic, necessary and a priori that] For any F, the FG is F. Hence, the existent God is existent. Hence, God exists.

(5) The word `God' has a meaning that is revealed in religious experience. The word `God' has a meaning only if God exists. Hence, God exists.

(6) I exist. Therefore something exists. Whenever a bunch of things exist, their mereological sum also exists. Therefore the sum of all things exists. Therefore God -- the sum of all things -- exists.

(7) God must exist.

Of course, this taxonomy is not exclusive: an argument can belong to several categories at once. Moreover, an argument can be ambiguous between a range of readings, each of which belongs to different categories. This latter fact may help to explain part of the curious fascination of ontological arguments. Finally, the taxonomy can be further specialised: there are, for example, at least four importantly different kinds of modal ontological arguments which should be distinguished.

Characterisation of Ontological Arguments

It is not easy to give a good characterisation of ontological arguments. The traditional characterisation involves the use of problematic notions -- analyticity, necessity, and a prioricity -- and also fails to apply to many arguments to which defenders have affixed the label "ontological". (Consider, for example, the claim that I conceive of a being than which no greater can be conceived. This claim is clearly not analytic (its truth doesn't follow immediately from the meanings of the words used to express it), nor necessary (I might never have entertained the concept), nor a priori (except perhaps in my own case, though even this is unclear -- perhaps even I don't know independently of experience that I have this concept.)) However, it is unclear how that traditional characterisation should be improved upon.

Perhaps one might resolve to use the label "ontological argument" for any argument which gets classified as "an ontological argument" by its proponent(s). This procedure would make good sense if one thought that there is a natural kind -- ontological arguments -- which our practice carves out, but for which is hard to specify defining conditions. Moreover, this procedure can be adapted as a pro tem stop gap: when there is a better definition to hand, that definition will be adopted instead. On the other hand, it seems worthwhile to attempt a more informative definition.

Focus on the case of ontological arguments for the conclusion that God exists. The characteristic feature of these arguments is that, in order to be successful, they rely upon the use of referential vocabulary (names, definite descriptions, quantified noun phrases, etc.) whose ontological commitments non-theists do not accept.

Theists and non-theists alike (can) agree that there is spatio-temporal, or causal, or nomic, or modal structure to the world (the basis for cosmological arguments); and that there are certain kinds of complexity of organisation, structure and function in the world (the basis for teleological arguments); and so on. But theists and non-theists are in dispute about whether there are perfect beings, or beings than which no greater can be conceived, or ....; thus, theists and non-theists are in dispute about the indirect subject matter of the premises of ontological arguments.

Of course, the premises of ontological arguments often do not deal directly with perfect beings, beings than which no greater can be conceived, etc.; rather, they deal with descriptions of, or ideas of, or concepts of, or the possibility of the existence of, these things. However, the basic point remains: ontological arguments require the use of vocabulary which non-theists should certainly find problematic when it is used in ontologically committing contexts (i.e not inside the scope of prophylactic operators -- such as "according to the story" or "by the lights of theists" or "by the definition" -- which can be taken to afford protection against unwanted commitments).

Note that this characterisation does not beg the question against the possibility of the construction of a successful ontological argument -- i.e. it does not lead immediately to the conclusion that all ontological arguments are question-begging (in virtue of the ontologically committing vocabulary which they employ). For it may be that the vocabulary in question only gets used in premises under the protection of prophylactic operators (which ward off the unwanted commitments.) Of course, there will then be questions about whether the resulting arguments can possibly be valid -- how could the commitments turn up in the conclusion if they are not there in the premises? -- but those are further questions, which would remain to be addressed.

Objections to Ontological Arguments

Many philosophers believe that ontological arguments are either invalid or question-begging. Their argument for this is a general one, based upon semantic considerations. In the premises of an ontological argument, the expressions with ontological commitment either appear in the scope of operators which cancel ontological commitment or they do not. If they do not, then the argument is question-begging (since the ontological commitment is presupposed by the premises); if they do, then the argument is simply invalid (one cannot validly eliminate operators which cancel ontological commitment). In general, then, the problem with ontological arguments is that their conclusion cannot involve expressions with ontological commitment unless those commitments were introduced by expressions used in the premises; they are therefore bound to be question-begging or invlaid.

This general argument can be applied more specifically to each of the kinds of ontological arguments found in our taxonomy.

(1) Definitional arguments: These are arguments in which ontologically committing vocabulary is introduced solely via a definition. The problem is that claims involving that vocabulary cannot then be non-question-beggingly detached from the scope of that definition. (The inference from `By definition, God is an existent being' to `God exists' is patently invalid; while the inference to `By definition, God exists' is valid, but uninteresting.)

(2) Conceptual arguments: These are arguments in which ontologically committing vocabulary is introduced solely within the scope of hyperintensional operators (e.g. `believes that', `conceives of', etc.). Often, these operators have two readings, one of which can cancel ontological commitment, and the other of which cannot. On the reading which can give cancellation (as in the most likely reading of 'John believes in Santa Claus'), the inference to a conclusion in which the ontological commitment is not cancelled will be invalid. On the reading which cannot cancel ontological commitment (as in that reading of "John thinks about God' which can only be true if there is a God to think about), the premises are question-begging: they incur ontological commitments which non-theists reject.

(3) Modal arguments: These are arguments in which ontologically committing vocabulary is introduced solely within the scope of modal operators (e.g. `necessarily', `possibly', `actually', and iterated sequences thereof). Again, the important point concerns the ontological commitments incurred via the acceptance of these premises: since non-theists do not accept the existence of god(s), they will naturally reject premises which incur ontological commitment to the existence of such beings. (Theists and non-theists may have quite different conceptions of the nature of logical space. Modal ontological arguments all depend upon disputed assumptions about the nature of this space.)

(4) Meinongian arguments: These are arguments which depend somehow or other on Meiniongian theories of objects. Consider the schema `The F G is F'. Naive Meinongians will suppose that if F is instantiated with any property, then the result is true (and, quite likely, necessary, analytic and a priori). So, for example, the round square is round; the bald current King of France is bald; and so on. However, more sophisticiated Meinongians will insist that there must be some restriction on the substitution instances for F, in order to allow one to draw the obvious and important ontological distinction between the following two groups: {Bill Clinton, the sun, the Eiffel Tower} and {Santa Claus, Mickey Mouse, the round square}. Choice of vocabulary here is controversial: I shall suppose (for the sake of example) that the right thing to say is that the former things exist and the latter do not. Under this supposition, `exists' will not be a suitable substitution instance for F -- obviously, since I want to deny that there is an existent Santa Claus. Of course, nothing hangs on the choice of `exists' as the crucial vocabulary. The point is that non-theists are not prepared to include god(s) in the former group of objects -- and hence will be unpersuaded by any argument which tries to use whatever vocabulary is used to discriminate between the two classes as the basis for an argument that god(s) belong to the former group. (Cognoscenti will recognise that the crucial point is that Meinongian ontological arguments fail to respect the distinction between nuclear (assumptible, characterising) properties and non-nuclear (non-assumptible, non-characterising) properties.)

(5) Experiential arguments: These are arguments which try to make use of `externalist' or `object-involving' accounts of content. It should not be surprising that they fail. After all, those accounts of content need to have something to say about expressions which fail to refer ('Santa Claus', `phlogiston', etc.). But, however the account goes, non-theists will insist that expressions which purport to refer to god(s) should be given exactly the same kind of treatment.

(6) Mereological arguments: Those who dislike mereology will not be impressed by these arguments. However, even those who take the view that mereology is an ontological free lunch need not be perturbed by them: for it is plausible to think that the conclusions of these arguments have no religious significance whatsoever -- they are merely arguments for, e.g., the existence of the physical universe.

(7) `Hegelian arguments': Since these are not strictly speaking arguments -- but merely unsupported assertions -- there is nothing to refute.

Many other objections to (some) ontological arguments have been proposed. All of the following have been alleged to be the key to the explanation of the failure of (at least some) ontological arguments: (1) existence is not a predicate; (2) the concept of god is meaningless/incoherent/ inconsistent; (3) ontological arguments are ruled out by "the missing explanation argument"; (4) ontological arguments all trade on mistaken uses of singular terms; (5) existence is not a perfection; (6) ontological arguments presuppose a Meinongian approach to ontology. There are many things to say about these objections: the most important point is that they all require far more controversial assumptions than non-theists require in order to be able to reject ontological arguments with good conscience. Trying to support one of these claims in order to beat up on ontological arguments is like using a steamroller to crack a nut (in circumstances in which one is unsure that one can get the steamroller to move!).

Of course, all of the above discussion is directed merely to the claim that ontological arguments are not dialectically efficacious -- i.e. they give reasonable non-theists no reason to change their views. It might be wondered whether there is some other use which ontological arguments have -- e.g., as Plantinga claims, in establishing the reasonableness of theism. This seems unlikely. After all, at best these arguments show that certain sets of sentences (beliefs, etc.) are incompatible -- one cannot reject the conclusions of these arguments while accepting their premises. But the arguments themselves say nothing about the reasonableness of accepting the premisses. So the arguments themselves say nothing about the (unconditional) reasonableness of accepting the conclusions of these arguments. Those who are disposed to think that theism is irrational need find nothing in ontological arguments to make them change their minds (and those who are disposed to think that theism is true should take no comfort from them either).

Is Existence a Predicate?

Yes. (It is, however, non-nuclear; and it may be this point which Kant had in mind. The problem is that only Meinongian ontological arguments are damaged by this observation.)

Parodies of Ontological Arguments

Positive ontological arguments -- i.e. arguments FOR the existence of god(s) -- invariably admit of various kinds of parodies, i.e. parallel arguments which seem at least equally acceptable to non-theists, but which establish absurd or contradictory conclusions. For many positive ontological arguments, there are parodies which purport to establish the non-existence of god(s); and for many positive ontological arguments there are lots (usually a large infinity!) of similar arguments which purport to establish the existence of lots (usally a large infinity) of distinct god-like beings. Here are some modest examples:

(1) By definition, God is a non-existent being who has every (other) perfection. Hence God does not exist.

(2) I conceive of a being than which no greater can be conceived except that it only ever creates N universes. If such a being does not exist, then we can conceive of a greater being -- namely, one exactly like it which does exist. But I cannot conceive of a being which is greater in this way. Hence, a being than which no greater can be conceived except that it only ever creates N universes exists.

(3) It is possible that it is necessary that God does not exist. Hence God does not exist.

(4) It is analytic, necessary, and a priori that the FG is F. Hence, the existent God who creates exactly N universes is existent. Hence the God who creates exactly N universes exists.

There are many kinds of parodies on Ontological Arguments. The aim is to construct arguments which non-theists can reasonably claim to have no more reason to accept than the original Ontological Arguments themselves. Of course, theists may well be able to hold that the originals are sound, and the parodies not -- but that is an entirely unrelated issue. (All theists -- and no non-theists -- should grant that the following argument is sound, given that the connectives are to be interpretted classically: "Either 2+2=5, or God exists. Not 2+2=5. Hence God exists." It should be completely obvious that this argument is useless.)

There are some very nice parodic discussions of Ontological Arguments in the literature. A particularly pretty one is due to Raymond Smullyan, in 5000 BC and Other Philosophical Fantasies, in which the argument is attributed to "the unknown Dutch theologian van Dollard". In addition, there is the following song Ballad of St. Anselm.




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Related Entries

St. Anselm | a priori | argument | Descartes, Rene | existence | God | Gödel, Kurt | Hegel, G. W. F. | Kant, Immanuel | logic, modal | Meinong, Alexius

Copyright © 1996 by
Graham Oppy
Monash University

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First published: February 8, 1996
Content last modified: March 13, 1996