Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Mental imagery is experience that resembles perceptual experience, but
which occurs in the absence of the appropriate stimuli for the
relevant perception (c.f. Finke, 1989; McKellar, 1957). Very often
these experiences are understood by their subjects as echoes or
reconstructions of actual perceptual experiences from their past; at
other times they may seem to anticipate possible, often desired or
feared, future experiences. Thus imagery has often been believed to
play a very large, even pivotal, role in both memory (Yates, 1966;
Paivio, 1986) and motivation (McMahon, 1973). It is also commonly
understood as centrally involved in visuo-spatial reasoning and
inventive or creative thought. Indeed, it has usually been regarded as
crucial for all thought processes, although, during the 20th
century in particular, this has been called into question.
We have defined mental imagery as a form of experience, but, of
course, evidence for the occurrence of any experience is necessarily
subjective. Because of this, some authors, most notably the
arch-behaviorist J.B. Watson (1913a), have cast doubt on the
scientific status and even the existence of imagery. However, if
imagery serves certain functions in our mental life (as suggested
above) then perhaps some objective validation and study of it might be
possible through the study of the performance of these functions. In
the light of this, some authors (notably the psychologist Stephen
Kosslyn, who is probably the most influential contemporary imagery
theorist) prefer an alternative definition of "imagery" to that given
above. Instead of understanding it primarily as a sort of experience,
they prefer to view the term as referring to the particular type of
cognitive process or "underlying representation" (Kosslyn, 1983) that
is involved in these functions. These representations or processes are
generally understood to be such that their presence or activity can
(but need not always) be consciously experienced as imagery in our
However, characterizing imagery in this way (as explanans rather than
explanandum) begs important questions about the nature of the mind and
about the causes of imagery experiences (conceivably they are
not experiences of cognitive processes or underlying
representations). On the other hand, it should be admitted that
defining imagery as a form of experience, is also problematic, and
might deflect attention away from the possibility that importantly
similar underlying representations or mechanisms may be operative both
when we experience imagery and during certain unconscious
mental processes (some evidence suggests that this is so). To avoid
such problems we might replace "imagery" with some special jargon: we
could speak of "quasi-perceptual experiences" on the one hand and
"image representations (or processes)" on the other. However, this is
not an established convention, and using these terms exclusively
throughout this entry would seriously complicate discussion of the
views of those thinkers (probably the vast majority) who fail to
disentangle these notions. Thus, the (more or less) ordinary language
term "imagery" will continue to be used where appropriate.
But our initial definition of "imagery" may well be thought
unsatisfactory even in its own terms. Not only does it duck the
difficult task of specifying what dimensions and degrees of similarity
to perception are necessary for an experience to count as imagery; it
also elides the controversial question of whether imagery is a sui
generis phenomenon, conceptually quite distinct from true
perceptual experience despite the surface resemblance, or whether it
is more appropriately regarded as lying at one end of a continuum
stretching from ordinary veridical perception at one end, to 'pure'
imagery, where the character of the experience seems to be quite
independent of any current stimulus input, at the other. In between
would come cases, often held to be due to the effects of imagination,
where the character of the experience seems to be only
partially determined by the character of the current
stimulus: both mistaken or illusive perception and non-deceptive
seeing as (such as seeing the notorious duck-rabbit figure
as a duck [or rabbit], or, for example, "seeing" the shapes
of animals, or whatever, in the clouds or constellations). Many
philosophers and cognitive theorists implicitly take this line,
treating percepts as, essentially, special cases of imagery,
differing only in causal history and, perhaps, "vivacity". For
example: for Descartes (in the Treatise on Man) both images
and percepts are ultimately embodied as pictures picked out on the
surface of the pineal gland by the flow of animal spirits; for Kosslyn
(1994) both are depictive representations in the brain's "visual
buffer; for Hinton (1979) both are "structural descriptions" in
working memory. However, other theorists (e.g. Sartre, 1936) try to
draw a sharp conceptual and phenomenological distinction between
perceptual and imaginal experience.
But in the absence of consensus about such issues, or about the
underlying mechanisms and the psychological functions of imagery, our
initial rough characterization is probably about the best we can do
without begging important questions. Perhaps it is sufficient. Imagery
is a common, everyday phenomenon that is indicated by a whole range of
colloquial expressions: "having a picture in the head", "picturing",
"visualizing", "having/seeing a mental image/picture", "seeing in the
mind's eye", and, in some contexts, simply "imagining". Although a
small percentage of people seem inclined to deny ever experiencing it,
for the vast majority of us, our imagery, like our consciousness
itself, is something with which we seem to be thoroughly familiar and
However, the term "mental imagery", and all the colloquial
equivalents mentioned above, may be potentially misleading in
itself. For one thing, all these expressions suggest, more or less
strongly, a purely visual phenomenon. In fact, most discussions of
imagery, in the past and today, have indeed focused upon the visual
mode. Nevertheless, there is every reason to believe that other modes
of quasi-perceptual experience are just as common and important
(Newton, 1982), and "imagery" has come to be the accepted scientific
term for referring to them too: interesting studies of "auditory
imagery", "kinaesthetic imagery", "haptic (touch) imagery", and so
forth, can be found in the contemporary psychological literature.
A related, and perhaps a more serious problem with the term "imagery"
and with most of the colloquial alternatives is that they strongly
suggest that the phenomenon involves some sort of
picture (the image) entering into or being
created in the mind. Indeed, this theoretical story seems to have gone
virtually unquestioned during past ages (which may explain how the
terminology in question became entrenched), and probably remains the
majority, lay and expert, view today. Nevertheless, during this
century it has come under strong challenge, and can no longer be
regarded as uncontroversial. The confusions arising from this (as well
as the other ambiguities of the term "imagery" that we have mentioned)
continue to bedevil discussions of the topic. In particular, people
who deny the existence of mental pictures seem frequently to
be misunderstood as (implausibly) denying the occurrence of
quasi-perceptual experiences, and in some cases they may themselves
come to believe that the first denial commits them to the second
(Thomas, 1989). Indeed, there is some reason to think (although it is
certainly not established) that that minority of people (about 10% of
the population by some estimates) who deny ever experiencing imagery,
or who deny that it plays any significant role in their mental lives,
may simply be understanding the terminology in a somewhat
idiosyncratic fashion: what they intend to deny may not be so much
that they have quasi-perceptual experience, but, rather, that
what they do have is predominantly visual, or that it involves inner
pictures, or that it resembles perceptual experience to the extent
that they (perhaps wrongly) understand other people to be claiming for
their imagery (or some combination of these claims). This is
a theoretically important issue because if it is true that some people
really do not experience any imagery then imagery (understood as
experience rather than representation) cannot play the vital
role in mental life that has very often been attributed to it.
On a more consensual note, with only rare exceptions (e.g. Wright,
1983) nearly all serious discussions of imagery take it for granted
(explicitly or implicitly) that it exhibits intentionality
(i.e. imagery is normally of something or other, in the same
sense that perception is perception of something), and that
it is, for the most part, subject to conscious control. Although
images often come into the mind unbidden, and sometimes it is hard to
shake off unwanted imagery (say, of the horrible accident that one
cannot get out of one's mind) in general one can conjure-up,
manipulate, and dismiss images at will. In this regard, imagery
appears as an unequivocally mental phenomenon, quite distinct
from other quasi-perceptual experiences, such as after-images and
phosphenes (Oster, 1970), that are not subject to direct
conscious control, and which are probably best explained in
straightforwardly physiological terms. It is also distinguished from
cognitive and representational, but nevertheless unconscious and
automatic functions such as the postulated high capacity but very
short term visual memory store known as "iconic memory" (Neisser,
1967). On the other hand, so called eidetic imagery, if,
indeed, it exists at all as a distinct phenomenon (see Haber, 1979,
and the appended commentaries), is probably best understood as a
species of mental imagery proper, despite the fact that it is
characterized by a vividness, detailed articulation, and stability
that far exceed what most normal subjects seem to want to claim for
their imagery experiences.
It may also be worth pointing out that mental imagery should be
distinguished from "imagery" as the term has come to be used in a
literary context, where it seems to refer to a linguistic trope that
employs highly concrete, perceptually specific language in order to
evoke certain emotions or otherwise convey some more abstract and
elusive underlying sense. Very likely, literary imagery originally got
its name from a supposed power of the words in question to induce
mental imagery in a reader, but it is surely not the case that the
expression is now universally understood in this way.
[Particularly seminal or influential contributions to the
imagery literature are marked with a *.
Items that are cited but that say little or nothing directly about
mental imagery are marked with a #. Some items are
Descartes, Rene |
mental representation |
- *Anderson, J.R. (1978). Arguments
Concerning Representations for Mental Imagery. Psychological
Review (85) 249-77.
[Argues that the "analog
vs.propositional" (picture vs. description) question is ill
- Anderson, J.R. (1979). Further Arguments Concerning
Representations for Mental Imagery: A Response to Hayes-Roth and
Pylyshyn. Psychological Review (86) 395-406.
- Audi, R. (1978). The Ontological Status of Mental Images.
Inquiry (21) 348-361.
- Baars, B.J. (Ed.) (1996). Special issue on mental imagery
of Consciousness and Cognition (5-iii).
- Basso, A., Bisiach, E., & Luzzatti, C. (1980). Loss of
Mental Imagery: A Case Study. Neuropsychologia (18)
- *Baylor, G.W. (1972). A Treatise
on the Mind's Eye: An Empirical Investigation of Visual Mental
Imagery. Unpublished Ph.D. thesis, Carnegie-Mellon University,
Pittsburgh, PA. (University Microfilms 72-12, 699.)
[The first serious attempt to simulate
imagery computationally. The major inspiration for the description
theory of Pylyshyn (1973).]
- Baylor, G.W. (1973). Modelling the Mind's Eye. In
A. Elithorn & D. Jones (Eds.), Artificial and Human
Thinking. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
[A brief sketch of the model detailed
in Baylor (1972).]
- Bexton, W.H., Heron, W., & Scott,
T.H. (1954). Effects of Decreased Variation in the Sensory
Environment. Canadian Journal of Psychology (8)
[Sensory deprivation discovered to
give rise to spontaneous and bizarre imagery.]
- Bisiach, E. & Berti, A. (1990). Waking Images and Neural
Activity. In R.G. Kunzendorf & A.A. Sheikh (Eds.) The
Psycophysiology of Mental Imagery: Theory, Research and
Application. Amityville, NY: Baywood.
- *Bisiach, E. & Luzzatti,
C. (1978). Unilateral Neglect of Representational
Space. Cortex (14) 129-133.
[But see Coslett (1997).]
- Bisiach, E., Luzzatti, C., & Perani,
D. (1979). Unilateral Neglect, Representational Schema and
Consciousness. Brain (102) 609-618.
- Blachowicz, J. (1997). Analog Representation Beyond
Mental Imagery. Journal of Philosophy (94) 55-84.
- *Block, N. (Ed.)
(1981a). Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
[Widely read collection.]
- Block, N. (Ed.) (1981b). Readings in Philosophy of
Psychology, Vol. 2. London: Methuen.
[Section on imagery complements the
- Block, N. (1983a). Mental Pictures and Cognitive
Science. Philosophical Review (92) 499-539.
- Block, N. (1983b). The Photographic Fallacy and the
Debate about Mental Imagery. Noûs (17) 651-661.
- Blumenthal, H.J. (1977-8). Neoplatonic Interpretations of
Aristotle on Phantasia. Review of Metaphysics
- Bower, K.J. (1984). Imagery: From Hume to Cognitive
Science. Canadian Journal of Philosophy (14) 217-234.
- *Brann, E.T.H. (1991). The World
of the Imagination: Sum and Substance. Savage, MD: Rowman &
[An ambitious philosophical history of
conceptions of imagination and imagery, from ancient to contemporary
- Brodie, A. (1986-7). Medieval Notions and the Theory of
Ideas. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (86)
- Bugelski, B.R. (1977). Mnemonics. In
International Encyclopedia of Psychiatry, Psychology,
Psychoanalysis, and Neurology, Vol. 7. New York: Van Nostrand
- Bugelski, B.R. (1984). Imagery. In
R.J. Corsini (Ed.). Encyclopedia of Psychology,
Vol. 2. New York: Wiley.
- Candlish, S. (1975). Mental Images and Pictorial
Properties. Mind (84) 260-262.
[A critique of Hannay's (1971) defense
- Candlish, S. (1975). The Incompatibility of Perception
and Imagery: A Contemporary Orthodoxy, American Philosophical
Quarterly (13) 63-68.
- Carpenter, P.A. & Eisenberg, P. (1978). Mental
Rotation and the Frame of Reference in Blind and Sighted
Individuals. Perception and Psychophysics (23) 117-124.
[Mental rotation effect demonstrated in
congenitally blind subjects.]
- Casey, E.S. (1971). Imagination: Imagining and the
Image. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (31) 475-90.
- Casey, E.S. (1976). Imagining: A Phenomenological
Study. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Casey, E.S. (1977-8). Imagining and
Remembering. Review of Metaphysics (31) 187-209.
- *Chambers, D. & Reisberg,
D. (1985). Can Mental Images be Ambiguous?, Journal
of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance
[A very striking experiment; but see
Peterson et al. (1992), Cornoldi et al, (1996) and
Slezak (1995) for related (and often conflicting) experimental
results, and competing interpretations.]
- Cohen, J. (1996). The Imagery Debate: A Critical
Assessment. Journal of Philosophical Research (21) 149-182.
- Cornoldi, C., Logie, R.H., Brandimonte, M.A., Kaufmann,
G., & Reisberg, D. (1996). Stretching the Imagination:
Representation and Transformation in Mental Imagery. Oxford:
Oxford University Press.
- Coslett, H.B. (1997). Neglect in Vision and Visual
Imagery: A Double Dissociation. Brain (120) 1163-1171.
- Currie, G. (1995). Visual Imagery as the Simulation of
Vision. Mind and Language (10) 25-44.
- Danto, A.C. (1958). Concerning Mental
Pictures. Journal of Philosophy (55) 12-20.
- Denis, M., Engelkamp, J., & Richardson, J.T.E. (Eds.)
(1988). Cognitive and Neuropsychological Approaches to Mental
Imagery. Dordrecht, Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
- Denis, M. & Carfantan, M. (1985). People's Knowledge
About Images. Cognition (20) 49-60.
[An empirical study of the folk
psychology of imagery.]
- Dennett, D.C. (1969). Content and
Consciousness. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
[Argues that the inherent vagueness of
images suggests that they are more like descriptions than
pictures. (See, e.g. Hannay, 1971, Block, 1983b, and Tye, 1991, for
- Dennett, D.C. (1978). Two Approaches to Mental
Imagery. In his: Brainstorms. Montgomery, VT: Bradford Books.
- Dennett, D.C. (1991). Consciousness
Explained. Boston, MA: Little, Brown.
[Chapter 10 attempts to integrate
Kosslyn's quasi-pictorial theory of imagery into Dennett's
- Dunlap, K. (1914). Images and Ideas. Johns Hopkins
University Circular (3 - March 1914) 25-41.
[A "motor" theory of imagery. See
Washburn (1916) for a related view, and Thomas (1989) for
- Ellis, R.D. (1995). Questioning Consciousness: The
Interplay of Imagery, Cognition, and Emotion in the Human
Brain. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
[Gives an imagery based theory of
thought and semantics. See Thomas (1997b) for discussion.]
- Farah, M.J. (1984). The Neurological Basis of Mental
Imagery: A Componential Analysis. Cognition (18) 245-72.
- Farah, M.J. (1988). Is Visual Imagery Really Visual?
Overlooked Evidence from Neuropsychology. Psychological
Review (95) 307-317.
- Farley, A.M. (1974). VIPS: A Visual Imagery
Perception System; the Result of Protocol Analysis. Unpublished
Ph.D. thesis, Carnegie-Mellon University, Pittsburgh, PA.
[Computer model of imagery based on the
"perceptual activity" theory of Hochberg (1968).]
- Farley, A.M. (1976). A Computer Implementation of
Constructive Visual Imagery and Perception. In R.A. Monty J.W. Senders
(Eds.) Eye Movements and Psychological
Processes. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
- Ferguson, E.S. (1977). The Mind's Eye: Nonverbal Thought
in Technology. Science (197) 827-836.
- Ferguson, E.S. (1992). Engineering and the Mind's
Eye. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Finke, R.A. (1980). Levels of Equivalence in Imagery and
Perception. Psychological Review (87) 113-132.
- Finke, R.A. (1985). Theories Relating Imagery to
Perception. Psychological Bulletin (98) 236-259.
- Finke, R.A. (1986). Mental Imagery and the Visual
System. Scientific American (245 #iii, March) 76-83.
- Finke, R.A. (1989). Principles of Mental
Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
[Useful textbook of the experimental
cognitive psychology of imagery.]
- Finke, R.A., Pinker, S., & Farah,
M.J. (1989). Reinterpreting Visual Patterns in Mental
Imagery. Cognitive Science (13) 51-78.
- Finke, R.A. & Shepard, R.N. (1986). Visual Functions
of Mental Imagery. In K.R. Boff, L. Kaufman, & J.P. Thomas
(Eds.). Handbook of Perception and Human Performance,
Vol. 2. New York: Wiley-Interscience.
- Finke, R.A., Ward, T.B., & Smith,
S.M. (1992). Creative Cognition: Theory, Research, and
Applications. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
[Gives imagery a large role in
- Flew, A. (1953). Images, Supposing and
Imagining. Philosophy (28) 246-254.
- Fodor, J.A. (1975). The Language of
Thought. New York: Thomas Crowell. (Paperback edition: Harvard
University Press, 1980)
[Argues that imagery representations
must be semantically dependent on representations that are linguistic
- Freyd, J.J. (1987). Dynamic Mental
Representations. Psychological Review (94) 427-38.
- Furlong, E.J. (1953). Abstract Ideas and
Images. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society
(Supplementary volume 27) 121-136. I> Furlong,
E.J. (1961). Imagination. London: Allen & Unwin.
- *Galton, F. (1880). Statistics of Mental
Imagery. Mind (5) 301-318.
[Pioneering individual differences
- *Galton, F. (1883). Inquiries
into Human Faculty and its Development. London: Macmillan.
[Summarizes and discusses results of
- Georgopoulos, A.P., Lurito, J.T., Petrides, M., &
Schwartz, A.B. (1989). Mental Rotation of the Neuronal Population
Vector. Science (243) 234-236.
[A neuroscientific study of the mental
rotation effect (in monkeys) which links it to motor control.]
- Giaquinto, M. (1992). Visualizing as a Means of
Geometrical Discovery. Mind and Language (7) 382-401.
- Giaquinto, M. (1993). Visualizing in Arithmetic.
Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (53) 385-396.
- Gibson, J.J. (1970). On the Relation Between
Hallucination and Perception. Leonardo (3) 425-7.
- Gibson, J.J. (1974). Visualizing Conceived as Visual
Apprehending Without Any Particular Point of
Observation. Leonardo (7) 41-42.
- Glasgow, J.I. (1993). The Imagery Debate Revisited: A
Computational Perspective. Computational Intelligence (9)
[Printed with numerous peer
commentaries and author's reply.]
- Glasgow, J. & Papadias, D. (1992). Computational
Imagery. Cognitive Science (16) 355-394.
- Goldenberg, G. (1989). The Ability of Patients with Brain
Damage to Generate Mental Visual Images. Brain (112)
- Gray, C.R. & Gummerman, K. (1975). The Enigmatic
Eidetic Image: A Critical Examination of Methods, Data, and
Theories. Psychological Bulletin (82) 383-407.
- Haber, R.N. (1979). Twenty Years of Haunting Eidetic
Imagery: Where's the Ghost? Behavioral and Brain
Sciences (2) 583-629.
[With appended commentaries.]
- Hampson, P.J. (1979). The Role of Imagery in
Cognition. Unpublished Ph.D. thesis, University of Lancaster,
- Hampson, P.J., Marks, D.F., & Richardson,
J.T.E. (Eds.) (1990). Imagery: Current
Developments. London: Routledge.
- Hampson, P.J. & Morris, P.E. (1979). Cyclical
Processing: A Framework for Imagery Research. Journal of Mental
Imagery (3) 11-22.
- Hannay, A. (1971). Mental Images - A
Defence. London: Allen & Unwin.
[Argues for the reality of inner
- Hannay, A. (1973). To See a Mental
Image. Mind (82) 161-262.
- Harrison, B. (1962-3). Meaning and Mental
Images. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (63)
- Harvey, E.R. (1975). The Inward Wits: Psychological
Theory in the Middle Ages and the Renaissance. London: Warburg
Institute, University of London.
- Hayes, J.R. (1973). On the Function of Visual Imagery in
Elementary Mathematics. In W.G. Chase (Ed.) Visual Information
Processing. New York: Academic Press.
- Hayes-Roth, F. (1979). Distinguishing Theories of Mental
Representation: A Critique of Anderson's 'Arguments Concerning Mental
Imagery'. Psychological Review (86) 376-382.
- Hebb, D.O. (1968). Concerning
Imagery. Psychological Review (75) 466-477.
- Hebb, D.O. (1969). The Mind's Eye. Psychology
Today (2) 54-57 & 67-68.
- Heil, J. (1982). What Does the Mind's Eye Look At?
Journal of Mind and Behavior (3) 143-149.
[An "adverbial" theory of
- Hilgard, E.R. (1981). Imagery and Imagination in American
Psychology, Journal of Mental Imagery (5) 5-66.
[With appended commentaries.].
- Hinton, G. (1979). Some Demonstrations of the Effects of
Structural Descriptions in Mental Imagery. Cognitive
Science (3) 231-250.
- Hochberg, J. (1968). In the Mind's Eye. In R.N. Haber
(ed.). Contemporary Theory and Research in Visual
Perception. Holt Rinehart & Winston. New York. pp. 309-331.
[Argues for a "perceptual activity"
- *Holt, R.R. (1964). Imagery: The Return
of the Ostracised. American Psychologist (19) 254-266.
[Influential account of the history of
imagery in scientific psychology.]
- Horne, P.V. (1993). The Nature of
Imagery. Consciousness and Cognition (2) 58-82.
- Humphrey, G. (1951). Thinking. London:
[Contains what is probably still the
best account in English of the views of the influential "imageless
thought" school of German introspective psychology.]
- Intons-Peterson, M.J. (1983). Imagery Paradigms: How
Vulnerable are They to Experimenter's Expectations? Journal of
Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (9)
[Shows that results of some imagery
experiments may be seriously distorted by experimenters'
- Intons-Peterson, M.J. & Roskos-Ewoldsen,
B.B. (1989). Sensory Perceptual Qualities of Images. Journal of
Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (15)
- Ishiguro, H. (1967). Imagination. Proceedings of
the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume (41) 37-56.
[Images as intentional
objects. (Strongly influenced by Wittgenstein and Ryle.)]
- Jaensch, E.R. (1930). Eidetic Imagery and
Typological Methods of Investigation. (Translated from the
German by O.A. Oeser.) London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
[A seminal study of eidetic imagery,
but widely considered to be tainted by the racist assumptions of its
- Janssen, W. (1976). On the Nature of Mental
Imagery. Soesterburg, Netherlands: Institute for Perception TNO.
- Jonides, J., Kahn, R., & Rozin, P. (1975). Imagery
Instructions Improve Memory in Blind Subjects. Bulletin of the
Psychonomic Society (5) 424-6.
- Kaufmann, G. (1980). Imagery, Language and
Cognition. Oslo, Norway: Universitetsforlaget.
- Keilkopf, C.F. (1968). The Pictures in the Head of a Man
Born Blind. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (28)
- Kerr, N.H. (1983). The Role of Vision in 'Visual Imagery'
Experiments: Evidence from the Congenitally Blind. Journal of
Experimental Psychology: General (112) 265-77.
[Many "classic" experimental effects
attributed to imagery can be reproduced in blind subjects.]
- Kessel, F.S. (1972). Imagery: a dimension of mind
rediscovered. British Journal of Psychology (63) 149-62.
- Kolers, P.A. (1987). Imaging. In R.L. Gregory &
O.L. Zangwill (Eds.). The Oxford Companion to the
Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kolers, P.A. & Smythe, W.E. (1979). Images, Symbols,
and Skills. Canadian Journal of Psychology (33) 158-184.
- *Kosslyn, S.M. (1980). Image and
Mind. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
[Seminal statement and defence of the
computational "quasi-pictorial" theory of imagery, which has become
the dominant view in cognitive science.]
- Kosslyn, S.M. (1981). The Medium and the Message in
Mental Imagery: A Theory. Psychological Review (88) 46-66.
- Kosslyn, S.M. (1987). Seeing and Imagining in the
Cerebral Hemispheres: A Computational Approach. Psychological
Review (94) 148-75.
- *Kosslyn, S.M. (1983). Ghosts in
the Mind's Machine: Creating and Using Images in the Brain. New
[A popularization of the
- *Kosslyn, S.M. (1994). Image and
Brain: The Resolution of the Imagery Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT
[Updates the "quasi-pictorial" theory
with an account of how imagery might be neurologically embodied.]
- Kosslyn, S.M. & Hatfield, G. (1984). Representation
Without Symbol Systems. Social Research (51) 1019-1045.
- *Kosslyn, S.M., Pinker, S., Smith,
G.E., & Shwartz, S.P. (1979). On the Demystification of Mental
Imagery. Behavioral & Brain Sciences (2) 535-581.
[With appended commentaries.]
- *Kosslyn, S.M. & Pomerantz,
J.R. (1977). Imagery, Propositions and the Form of Internal
Representations. Cognitive Psychology (9) 52-76.
[A defence of pictorial theory against
- *Kosslyn, S.M. & Shwartz,
S.P. (1977). A Simulation of Visual Imagery. Cognitive
Science (1) 265-295.
[Computer model of "quasi-pictorial"
- Kunzendorf, R.G. & Sheikh, A.A. (Eds.)
(1990). The Psycophysiology of Mental Imagery: Theory, Research
and Application. Amityville, NY: Baywood.
- Lawrie, R. (1970). The Existence of Mental
Images. Philosophical Quarterly (20) 253-7.
- Long, A.A. (1986). Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics,
Epicureans, Sceptics. Berkeley, CA: University of California
[Recounts the central role of imagery
(phantasia) in Stoic and Epicurean epistemology.]
- Loverock, D.S. & Modigliani, V. (1995). Visual
Imagery and the Brain: A Review. Journal of Mental
Imagery (19) 91-132.
- Lowe, E.J. (1996). Subjects of
Experience. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[Contains a sophisticated philosophical
defense of the Lockean view that the meanings of linguistic utterences
are rooted in imagery.]
- *Luria, A.R. (1968). The Mind of
a Mnemonist. (Trans. L. Solotaroff.) New York: Basic Books.
[Seminal case study of a
- Marks, D.F. (1973). Visual Imagery Differences in the
Recall of Pictures. British Journal of Psychology (64)
[Introduces the VVIQ questionaire, used
for measuring individual differences in imagery vividness.]
- Marks, D.F. (Ed.) (1986). Theories of Image
Formation. New York: Brandon House.
- Marks, D.F. (1983). Mental Imagery and Consciousness: A
Theoretical Review. In A.A. Sheikh (Ed.) Imagery: Current
Theory, Research, and Application. New York: Wiley.
- Matthews, G.B. (1969). Mental Copies. Philosophical
Review (78) 53-73.
- McKellar, P. (1957). Imagination and
Thinking. London: Cohen & West.
- McMahon, C.E. (1973). Images as Motives and Motivators: A
Historical Perspective. American Journal of Psychology
- Mel, B.W. (1986). A Connectionist Learning Model for 3-
Dimensional Mental Rotation, Zoom, and Pan. In Program of the
Eighth Annual Conference of the Cognitive Science
Society. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
- Mel, B.W. (1990). Connectionist Robot Motor
Planning. San Diego, CA: Academic Press.
[A connectionist account of imagery,
that links it to action plans.]
- Miller, A.I. (1984). Imagery in Scientific Thought:
Creating 20th Century Physics. Boston MA: Birkhäuser.
[Argues for an essential role for
imagery in modern physical thought (and scientific thought in
- Modrak, D.K.W. (1987). Aristotle: The Power of
Perception. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Moran, T.P. (1973). The Symbolic Imagery
Hypothesis: A Production System Model. Unpublished
Ph.D. thesis. Carnegie-Mellon University, Pittsburgh, PA. (University
- Morris, P.E. & Hampson, P.J. (1983). Imagery
and Consciousness. Academic Press. London.
[Usefully summarizes much experimental
evidence and attempts a theoretical synthesis.]
- Nadaner, D. (1988). Visual Imagery, Imagination, and
Education. In K. Egan & D. Nadaner (Eds.). Imagination and
Education. Milton Keynes, U.K.: Open University Press.
- Narayanan, N.H. (1993). Imagery: Computational and
Cognitive Perspectives. Computational Intelligence (9)
- Neisser, U. (1967). Cognitive
Psychology. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
- Neisser, U. (1970). Visual Imagery as Process and as
Experience. In J.S. Antrobus (Ed.). Cognition and
Affect. Boston, MA: Little, Brown & Co.
- Neisser, U. (1972a). Changing Conceptions of Imagery. In
P.W. Sheehan (Ed.). The Function and Nature of
Imagery. London: Academic Press.
- Neisser, U. (1972b). A Paradigm Shift in
Psychology. Science (176) 628-30.
[A major player in the cognitive
revolution places the revival of imagery research at its
- *Neisser, U. (1976). Cognition
and Reality. San Francisco, CA: W.H. Freeman.
[Proposes a perceptual activity theory
of imagery, an alternative to both pictorial and
- Neisser, U. (1978a). Anticipations, Images and
Introspection. Cognition (6) 167-174.
- Neisser, U. (1978b). Perceiving, Anticipating and
Imagining. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science
- Newton, N. (1982). Experience and Imagery. The
Southern Journal of Philosophy (21) 475-487.
[Argues the importance of non-visual
modes of imagery in human experience.]
- Newton, N. (1989). Visualizing is Imagining Seeing: a
reply to White. Analysis (49) 77-81.
- Nicholas, J.M. (Ed.) (1977). Images, Perception and
Knowledge, (Western Ontario Studies in the Philosophy of
Science, #8). Dordrecht/Boston: Reidel.
- Nussbaum, M.C. (1978). The Role of Phantasia in
Aristotle's Explanation of Action. In her Aristotle's De Motu
Animalium: Text with Translation, Commentary, and Interpretative
Essays. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- #Oster, G. (1970, February). Phosphenes. Scientific
American (222-ii) 82-87.
[Phosphenes should not be confused with
- *Paivio, A. (1971). Imagery and
Verbal Processes. New York: Holt, Rinehart and
Winston. [Reprinted in 1979 - Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum]
[Classic statement of the "dual coding"
(imaginal and linguistic) theory of mental representation, with much
empirical evidence on the mnemonic effects of imagery. Paivio's work
(together with Shepard's "mental rotation" experiments) probably
played the key role in making imagery a scientifically respectable
topic of investigation in cognitive science.]
- Paivio, A. (1977). Images, Propositions and Knowledge. In
J.M. Nicholas (ed.). Images, Perception and
Knowledge. Dordrecht/Boston, MA: Reidel.
- Paivio, A. (1986). Mental Representations: A Dual
Coding Approach. New York: Oxford University Press.
[A major restatement and defense of
- Paivio, A. (1991). Dual Coding Theory: Retrospect and
Current Status. Canadian Journal of Psychology (45)
- Palmer, S.E. (1978). Fundamental Aspects of Cognitive
Representation. In E. Rosch & B.B. Lloyd (Eds.), Cognition
and Categorization. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
[Argues that the "analog/propositional"
debate over imagery misses the point about the nature of
representation in computational theories of mind.]
- *Perky, C.W. (1910) An Experimental
Study of Imagination. American Journal of Psychology (21)
[A famous study that showed that images
could be confused with (faint) percepts under certain conditions. Now
primarily of historical interest.]
- Peterson, M.A., Kihlstrom, J.F., Rose, P.M., &
Glisky, M.L. (1992). Mental Images Can be Ambiguous: Reconstruals and
Reference Frame Reversals. Memory and Cognition (20),
[See the comment on Chambers &
- Piaget, J. & Inhelder, B. (1971). Mental
Imagery in the Child. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Pinker, S. (1980). Mental Imagery and the Third
Dimension. Journal of Experimental Psychology: General
- Pinker, S. (1988). A Computational Theory of the Mental
Imagery Medium. In M. Denis, J. Engelkamp, & J.T.E. Richardson
(eds.). Cognitive and Neuropsychological Approaches to Mental
Imagery. Dordrecht, Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
- Price, H.H. (1953). Thinking and
Experience. London: Hutchinson.
[Contains a defense of an imagery based
account of thinking and meaning.]
- *Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1973). What the Mind's
Eye Tells the Mind's Brain: A Critique of Mental
Imagery. Psychological Bulletin (80) 1-25.
[A seminal attack on pictorial accounts
of imagery. This was the opening salvo of the infamous
- Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1978). Imagery and Artificial
Intelligence. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of
Science (9) 19-55.
[Pylyshyn argues that images are best
conceived of as as propositional descriptions within a general
computational account of mental representation.]
- *Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1981). The Imagery
Debate: Analogue Media Versus Tacit Knowledge. Psychological
Review (88) 16-45.
[A restatement of the
"propositional/descriptional" account of imagery that squarely
confronts the empirical arguments brought by pictorialists.]
- Rabb, J.D. (1975). Imaging: An Adverbial
Analysis. Dialogue (14) 312-318.
[An "adverbial" theory of
- Rees, D.A. (1971). Aristotle's Treatment of
Phantasia. In J.P. Anton & G.L. Kustas (Eds.)
Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy. Albany, NY: State
University of New York Press.
- Reisberg, D. (Ed.) (1992). Auditory
Imagery. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
- Rey, G. (1981). Introduction: What are Mental Images? In
N. Block (Ed.) Readings in the Philosophy of Psychology,
Vol. 2. London: Methuen.
- Richards, N. (1977). Depicting and
Visualising. Mind (82) 218-229.
- Richardson, A. (1969). Mental
Imagery. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Richardson, J.T.E. (1980). Mental Imagery and Human
Memory. London: Macmillan.
[Although the book is mainly concerned
with empirical issues, chapter two is a Wittgenstein influenced
philosophical discussion of the concept of imagery.]
- Robson, J. (1986). Coleridge's Images of Fantasy and
Imagination. In D.G. Russell, D.F. Marks, & J.T.E. Richardson
(Eds.) Imagery 2. Dunedin, New Zealand: Human Performance
[Imagery in Romantic psychological
- Roe, A. (1951). A Study of Imagery in Research
Scientists. Journal of Personality (19) 459-70.
- Roland, P.E. Gulyàs B. (1994). Visual Imagery and
Visual Representation. Trends in Neuroscience (17) 281-286.
- Rollins, M. (1989). Mental Imagery: On the Limits
of Cognitive Science. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
- Roskos-Ewoldsen, B., Intons-Peterson, M.J., &
Anderson, R.E. (Eds.) (1993). Imagery, Creativity and Discovery:
a Cognitive Perspective. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
- Roth, R.J. (1963). The Aristotelian Use of
Phantasia and Phantasma. The New
Scholasticism (37) 312-326.
- Russell, D.G., Marks, D.F., & Richardson
,J.T.E. (Eds.) Imagery 2. Dunedin, New Zealand: Human
[Proceedings of the Second
International Imagery Conference (Swansea, Wales, 1985).]
- Russow, L.-M. (1978). Some Recent Work on
Imagination. American Philosophical Quarterly (15) 57-66.
- Russow, L.-M. (1980). Towards a Theory of
Imagination. Southern Journal of Philosophy (28) 353-369.
- *Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of
Mind. London: Hutchinson.
[Chapter 8 contains a seminal critique
of pictorial accounts of imagery and questions the traditional concept
of imagination as the image producing faculty. It is suggested that
both imagination and imagery are conceptually related to
- Ryle, G. (1971). Phenomenology versus The Concept of
Mind. In his Collected Papers, Volume 1: Critical
Essays. London: Hutchinson.
[Some qualifications of the view
expressed in Ryle (1949).]
- Samuels, M. & Samuels, N. (1975). Seeing with
the Mind's Eye: The History, Techniques and Uses of
Visualization. New York/Berkeley, CA: Random House/The Bookworks.
[Not a scholarly work.]
- Sandbach, F.H. (1971). Phantasia Kataleptike. In
A.A. Long (ed.). Problems in Stoicism. London: Athlone
[Imagery in Stoic
- Sarbin, T.R. (1972). Imagination as Muted Role Taking. In
P.W. Sheehan (ed.). The Function and Nature of Imagery.
Academic Press. New York. pp. 333-354.
[A version of "perceptual activity"
imagery theory, strongly influenced by Ryle (1949).]
- *Sartre, J.-P. (1936/1962).
Imagination: A Psychological Critique. Ann Arbor, MI:
University of Michigan Press. (Translated by F. Williams from the
original French of 1936.)
[Useful historical material, as well
as the philosophical discussion.]
- *Sartre, J.-P. (1940/1948). The
Psychology of Imagination. New York: Philosophical
Library. (Translated by B. Frechtman from the original French of 1940.)
[Argues the intentionality of
imagery. Images are not inner objects.]
- Schofield, M. (1978). Aristotle on the Imagination. In
G.E.R. Lloyd & G.E.L. Owen (Eds.) Aristotle on the Mind and
the Senses. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Segal, S.J. (Ed.) (1971). Imagery: Current
Cognitive Approaches. New York: Academic Press.
- Sergent, J. (1990). The Neuropsychology of Visual Image
Generation: Data, Method, and Theory. Brain and Cognition
- Sheehan, P.W. (ed.), (1972). The Function and
Nature of Imagery. Academic Press. New York & London.
- Sheehan, P.W. (1978). Mental Imagery. In B.M. Foss (Ed.)
Psychology Survey. No.1. London: Allen & Unwin.
[Review article. Now dated.]
- Sheikh, A.A. (Ed.) (1983). Imagery: Current Theory,
Research, and Application. New York: Wiley.
[Useful, wide ranging
- Shepard, R.N. (1975). Form, Formation, and Transformation
of Internal Representations. In R.L. Solso (Ed.) Information
Processing and Cognition: the Loyola Symposium. Hillsdale, NJ:
[Defends "analog" account of
imagery. Introduces concept of "second order isomorphism".]
- Shepard, R.N. (1978a). Externalization of Mental Images
and the Act of Creation. In B.S. Randhawa & B.F. Coffman
(Eds.). Visual Learning, Thinking and
Communication. London: Academic Press.
- *Shepard, R.N. (1978b). The Mental
Image. American Psychologist (33) 125-137.
- Shepard, R.N. (1981). Psychophysical Complementarity. In
M. Kubovy & J.R. Pomerantz (Eds.) Perceptual
Organization. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
- Shepard, R.N. (1984). Ecological Restraints on Internal
Representation. Psychological Review (91) 417-447.
- *Shepard, R.N., Cooper, L.A., et
al. (1982). Mental Images and Their
Transformations. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
[A useful compendium of the seminal
work by Shepard and his students on the "mental rotation" of images
(and on related phenomena).]
- *Shepard, R.N. & Metzler,
J. (1971). Mental Rotaton of Three-Dimensional
Objects. Science (171) 701-703.
[A classic psychological
experiment. The first, most striking, and best known of the mental
rotation studies. Together with the work on the mnemonic effects of
imagery (see Paivio, 1971) this played a major role in re-establishing
the scientific respectability of imagery research.]
- Shepard, R.N. & Podgorny, P. (1978). Cognitive
Processes That Resemble Perceptual Processes. In W.K. Estes (Ed.)
Handbook of Learning and Cognitive Processes. Hillsdale,
- Shorter, J.M. (1952). Imagination. Mind (61)
[Perhaps the earliest suggestion that
imagining is more like describing than like seeing a picture (C.f. Dennett, 1969).]
- Simon, H.A. (1972). What is Visual Imagery? An
Information Processing Interpretation. In L.W. Gregg
(Ed.). Cognition in Learning and Memory. New York: Wiley.
[Early sketch of a computational model
- Slezak, P. (1995). The "Philosophical" Case Against
Visual Imagery. In P. Slezak, T. Caelli, & R. Clark (Eds.)
Perspectives on Cognitive Science: Theories, Experiments and
Foundations. Norwood, NJ: Ablex.
[A recent attempt to press the
cognitivist case against pictorialism by a psychologically
- Sober, E. (1976). Mental
Representations. Synthése (33) 101-148.
- Squires, J.E.R. (1968). Visualising. Mind
- Sterelny, K. (1986). The Imagery
Debate. Philosophy of Science (53) 560-583.
[A philosopher's take on the
- Taylor, J.G. (1973). A Behavioural Theory of
Images. South African Journal of Psychology (3) 1-10.
[A rare attempt to assimilate imagery
into Behaviorist theory.]
- Taylor, P. (1981). Imagination and
Information. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research
- Thomas, N.J.T. (1987). The Psychology of
Perception, Imagination and Mental Representation, and Twentieth
Century Philosophies of Science. Unpublished Ph.D. thesis,
Leeds University, Leeds, U.K. (A.S.L.I.B. Index to Theses 37-iii
- Thomas, N.J.T. (1989). Experience and Theory as
Determinants of Attitudes toward Mental Representation: The Case of
Knight Dunlap and the Vanishing Images of J.B. Watson. American
Journal of Psychology (102) 395-412.
[Discusses the historical
circumstances surrounding the "banishment" of imagery from
psychological theory in the Behaviorist tradition, and considers
certain conceptual confusions that may induce some people to discount
the psychological significance of imagery. Dunlap's (1914) theory is
- Thomas, N.J.T. (1997a). Imagery and the Coherence of
Imagination: a Critique of White. Journal of Philosophical
Research, (22) 95-127.
[Defends the traditional
(Aristotelian) view of the concept of imagination as derivative from
the concept of imagery. Traces resistance to this view to pictorialist
- Thomas, N.J.T. (1997b). A Stimulus to the
Imagination. Psyche (3) On-line serial. URL:
[An essay review of Ellis (1995),
which sets his work in a historical context and reviews some standard
objections to the sort of imagery based semantics he proposes.]
- Thomas, N.J.T. (1999). Imagination. In Dictionary
of Philosophy of Mind. (Editor, Chris Eliasmith). WWW document.
[Provides a brief sketch of the
history of the concept, from Aristotle to the present.]
- Titchener, E.B. (1909). Lectures on the
Experimental Psychology of the Thought-Processes. New York:
[A defense of an image centered
introspective psychology against the claims of the Wurzburg "imageless
thought" school of introspectors.]
- Trehub, A. (1977). Neuronal Models for Cognitive
Processes: Networks for Learning, Perception and
Imagination. Journal of Theoretical Biology (65) 141-169.
- Tweedale, M.M. (1990). Mental Representations in Later
Medieval Scholasticism. In J.-C. Smith (Ed.). Historical
Foundations of Cognitive Science. Dordrecht, Netherlands:
- Tweney, R.D., Doherty, M.E., & Mynatt, C.R. (Eds.)
(1981). On Scientific Thinking. New York: Columbia
[Contains anecdotal but very
suggestive extracts concerning the key role that imagery can play in
the thought processes of scientists.]
- Tye, M. (1984). The Debate About Mental
Imagery. Journal of Philosophy (81) 678-691.
[An "adverbial" theory of
- Tye, M. (1988). The Picture Theory of Mental
Images. Philosophical Review (97) 497-520.
[A persuasive defense of
"quasi-pictorial" theory against "descriptionist" criticisms.]
- *Tye, M. (1991). The Imagery
Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
[This fills out the argument of Tye (1988)
and gives an excellent philosophical account of the
"analog/propositional" debate and the conceptual basis of
(quasi-)pictorialism. However, it fails to look seriously beyond this
context, and is rather unreliable on historical and empirical
- von, Eckardt B. (1988). Mental Images and Their
Explanations. Philosophical Studies (53) 441-460.
- Warnock, M. (1976). Imagination. London:
Faber & Faber.
[Imagery and imagination in Hume and
Kant, in Romantic theory, and in Sartre and Wittgenstein.]
- Washburn, M.F. (1916). Movement and Mental
Imagery. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin.
[A "motor" theory of imagery. See
Dunlap (1914) for another version.]
- Watson, G. (1982). Phantasia in Aristotle,
De Anima 3.3. Classical Quarterly (32) 100-113.
- Watson G. (1988). Phantasia in Classical
Thought. Galway, Republic of Ireland: Galway University Press.
- Watson, J.B. (1913a). Psychology as the Behaviorist Views
It. Psychological Review (20) 158-177.
[The classic "Behaviorist
manifesto". Questions the very existence of imagery.]
- Watson, J.B. (1913b). Image and Affection in
Behavior. Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific
Methods (10) 421-8.
[A more careful and detailed version
of the anti-imagery position put forward in Watson (1913a).]
- Wekker, L.M. (1966). On the Basic Properties of the
Mental Image and a General Approach to their Analogue Simulation. In
Psychological Research in the U.S.S.R. Moscow: Progress
[Imagery theory in the Soviet
psychological tradition. Somewhat similar to the "motor" theories of
Dunlap (1914) and Washburn (1916).]
- *White, A.R. (1990). The Language
of Imagination. Oxford: Blackwell.
[Part one is an excellent, if
selective, concise history of the concept of imagination. Part 2
argues (in the teeth of the strong historical consensus detailed in
part 1) that there is no conceptual connection between
imagination and imagery. See Thomas (1997a) for a critique of this
- Wright, E. (1983). Inspecting
Images. Philosophy (58) 57-72.
- *Yates, F.A. (1966). The Art of
Memory. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
[A celebrated and seminal history of
mnemonic uses of imagery, from ancient to early modern times. Such
techniques are shown to have had a hitherto unrecognized importance in
the history of western thought.]
- Yuille, J.C. (Ed.) (1983). Imagery, Memory and
Cognition: Essays in Honour of Allan Paivio. Hillsdale, NJ:
- Zemach, E.M. (1969). Seeing, "Seeing", and
Feeling. Review of Metaphysics (23) 3-24.
- Zimler, J. & Keenan, J.M. (1983). Imagery in the
Congenitally Blind: How Visual are Visual Images? Journal of
Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (9)
Copyright © 1997, 1999 by
Nigel J. T. Thomas
Table of Contents
First published: November 18, 1997
Content last modified: April 8, 1999