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Mental Imagery

Mental imagery is experience that resembles perceptual experience, but which occurs in the absence of the appropriate stimuli for the relevant perception (c.f. Finke, 1989; McKellar, 1957). Very often these experiences are understood by their subjects as echoes or reconstructions of actual perceptual experiences from their past; at other times they may seem to anticipate possible, often desired or feared, future experiences. Thus imagery has often been believed to play a very large, even pivotal, role in both memory (Yates, 1966; Paivio, 1986) and motivation (McMahon, 1973). It is also commonly understood as centrally involved in visuo-spatial reasoning and inventive or creative thought. Indeed, it has usually been regarded as crucial for all thought processes, although, during the 20th century in particular, this has been called into question.

Terminological and Definitional Problems

We have defined mental imagery as a form of experience, but, of course, evidence for the occurrence of any experience is necessarily subjective. Because of this, some authors, most notably the arch-behaviorist J.B. Watson (1913a), have cast doubt on the scientific status and even the existence of imagery. However, if imagery serves certain functions in our mental life (as suggested above) then perhaps some objective validation and study of it might be possible through the study of the performance of these functions. In the light of this, some authors (notably the psychologist Stephen Kosslyn, who is probably the most influential contemporary imagery theorist) prefer an alternative definition of "imagery" to that given above. Instead of understanding it primarily as a sort of experience, they prefer to view the term as referring to the particular type of cognitive process or "underlying representation" (Kosslyn, 1983) that is involved in these functions. These representations or processes are generally understood to be such that their presence or activity can (but need not always) be consciously experienced as imagery in our original sense.

However, characterizing imagery in this way (as explanans rather than explanandum) begs important questions about the nature of the mind and about the causes of imagery experiences (conceivably they are not experiences of cognitive processes or underlying representations). On the other hand, it should be admitted that defining imagery as a form of experience, is also problematic, and might deflect attention away from the possibility that importantly similar underlying representations or mechanisms may be operative both when we experience imagery and during certain unconscious mental processes (some evidence suggests that this is so). To avoid such problems we might replace "imagery" with some special jargon: we could speak of "quasi-perceptual experiences" on the one hand and "image representations (or processes)" on the other. However, this is not an established convention, and using these terms exclusively throughout this entry would seriously complicate discussion of the views of those thinkers (probably the vast majority) who fail to disentangle these notions. Thus, the (more or less) ordinary language term "imagery" will continue to be used where appropriate.

But our initial definition of "imagery" may well be thought unsatisfactory even in its own terms. Not only does it duck the difficult task of specifying what dimensions and degrees of similarity to perception are necessary for an experience to count as imagery; it also elides the controversial question of whether imagery is a sui generis phenomenon, conceptually quite distinct from true perceptual experience despite the surface resemblance, or whether it is more appropriately regarded as lying at one end of a continuum stretching from ordinary veridical perception at one end, to 'pure' imagery, where the character of the experience seems to be quite independent of any current stimulus input, at the other. In between would come cases, often held to be due to the effects of imagination, where the character of the experience seems to be only partially determined by the character of the current stimulus: both mistaken or illusive perception and non-deceptive seeing as (such as seeing the notorious duck-rabbit figure as a duck [or rabbit], or, for example, "seeing" the shapes of animals, or whatever, in the clouds or constellations). Many philosophers and cognitive theorists implicitly take this line, treating percepts as, essentially, special cases of imagery, differing only in causal history and, perhaps, "vivacity". For example: for Descartes (in the Treatise on Man) both images and percepts are ultimately embodied as pictures picked out on the surface of the pineal gland by the flow of animal spirits; for Kosslyn (1994) both are depictive representations in the brain's "visual buffer; for Hinton (1979) both are "structural descriptions" in working memory. However, other theorists (e.g. Sartre, 1936) try to draw a sharp conceptual and phenomenological distinction between perceptual and imaginal experience.

But in the absence of consensus about such issues, or about the underlying mechanisms and the psychological functions of imagery, our initial rough characterization is probably about the best we can do without begging important questions. Perhaps it is sufficient. Imagery is a common, everyday phenomenon that is indicated by a whole range of colloquial expressions: "having a picture in the head", "picturing", "visualizing", "having/seeing a mental image/picture", "seeing in the mind's eye", and, in some contexts, simply "imagining". Although a small percentage of people seem inclined to deny ever experiencing it, for the vast majority of us, our imagery, like our consciousness itself, is something with which we seem to be thoroughly familiar and intimate.

However, the term "mental imagery", and all the colloquial equivalents mentioned above, may be potentially misleading in itself. For one thing, all these expressions suggest, more or less strongly, a purely visual phenomenon. In fact, most discussions of imagery, in the past and today, have indeed focused upon the visual mode. Nevertheless, there is every reason to believe that other modes of quasi-perceptual experience are just as common and important (Newton, 1982), and "imagery" has come to be the accepted scientific term for referring to them too: interesting studies of "auditory imagery", "kinaesthetic imagery", "haptic (touch) imagery", and so forth, can be found in the contemporary psychological literature.

A related, and perhaps a more serious problem with the term "imagery" and with most of the colloquial alternatives is that they strongly suggest that the phenomenon involves some sort of picture (the image) entering into or being created in the mind. Indeed, this theoretical story seems to have gone virtually unquestioned during past ages (which may explain how the terminology in question became entrenched), and probably remains the majority, lay and expert, view today. Nevertheless, during this century it has come under strong challenge, and can no longer be regarded as uncontroversial. The confusions arising from this (as well as the other ambiguities of the term "imagery" that we have mentioned) continue to bedevil discussions of the topic. In particular, people who deny the existence of mental pictures seem frequently to be misunderstood as (implausibly) denying the occurrence of quasi-perceptual experiences, and in some cases they may themselves come to believe that the first denial commits them to the second (Thomas, 1989). Indeed, there is some reason to think (although it is certainly not established) that that minority of people (about 10% of the population by some estimates) who deny ever experiencing imagery, or who deny that it plays any significant role in their mental lives, may simply be understanding the terminology in a somewhat idiosyncratic fashion: what they intend to deny may not be so much that they have quasi-perceptual experience, but, rather, that what they do have is predominantly visual, or that it involves inner pictures, or that it resembles perceptual experience to the extent that they (perhaps wrongly) understand other people to be claiming for their imagery (or some combination of these claims). This is a theoretically important issue because if it is true that some people really do not experience any imagery then imagery (understood as experience rather than representation) cannot play the vital role in mental life that has very often been attributed to it.

On a more consensual note, with only rare exceptions (e.g. Wright, 1983) nearly all serious discussions of imagery take it for granted (explicitly or implicitly) that it exhibits intentionality (i.e. imagery is normally of something or other, in the same sense that perception is perception of something), and that it is, for the most part, subject to conscious control. Although images often come into the mind unbidden, and sometimes it is hard to shake off unwanted imagery (say, of the horrible accident that one cannot get out of one's mind) in general one can conjure-up, manipulate, and dismiss images at will. In this regard, imagery appears as an unequivocally mental phenomenon, quite distinct from other quasi-perceptual experiences, such as after-images and phosphenes (Oster, 1970), that are not subject to direct conscious control, and which are probably best explained in straightforwardly physiological terms. It is also distinguished from cognitive and representational, but nevertheless unconscious and automatic functions such as the postulated high capacity but very short term visual memory store known as "iconic memory" (Neisser, 1967). On the other hand, so called eidetic imagery, if, indeed, it exists at all as a distinct phenomenon (see Haber, 1979, and the appended commentaries), is probably best understood as a species of mental imagery proper, despite the fact that it is characterized by a vividness, detailed articulation, and stability that far exceed what most normal subjects seem to want to claim for their imagery experiences.

It may also be worth pointing out that mental imagery should be distinguished from "imagery" as the term has come to be used in a literary context, where it seems to refer to a linguistic trope that employs highly concrete, perceptually specific language in order to evoke certain emotions or otherwise convey some more abstract and elusive underlying sense. Very likely, literary imagery originally got its name from a supposed power of the words in question to induce mental imagery in a reader, but it is surely not the case that the expression is now universally understood in this way.

Ancient, Medieval, and Modern Imagery

[In preparation]

The Fall and Rise of Imagery in the 20th Century

[In preparation]

Imagery in Cognitive Science

[In preparation]


[Particularly seminal or influential contributions to the imagery literature are marked with a *. Items that are cited but that say little or nothing directly about mental imagery are marked with a #. Some items are annotated.]

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Related Entries

consciousness | Descartes, Rene | intentionality | mental representation | perception

Copyright © 1997, 1999 by
Nigel J. T. Thomas

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First published: November 18, 1997
Content last modified: April 8, 1999