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LOTH can now be formulated more exactly as a hypothesis about the nature of propositional attitudes. It can be characterized as the conjunction of the following three theses (A), (B) and (C):
(A) Representational Theory of Mind (RTM): (cf. Field 1978: 37, Fodor 1987: 17)
(1) Representational Theory of Thought: For all subjects S, for all propositional attitudes A there is a (psychological) relation R, and for all propositions P there is a mental representation #P# such that S As that P if and only if(B) Mental representations, which, as per (A1), constitute the direct "objects" of propositional attitudes, belong to a representational or symbolic system which is such that (cf. Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988:12-3)
(a) S bears R to #P#, and(2) Representational Theory of Thinking: Mental processes, thinking in particular, consists of causal sequences of tokenings of mental representations.
(b) #P# means that P.
(1) representations of the system have a combinatorial syntax and semantics: structurally complex (molecular) representations are systematically built up out of structurally simple (atomic) constituents, and the semantic content of a molecular representation is a function of the semantic content of its atomic constituents together with its syntactic/formal structure, and(C) Functionalist Materialism. Mental representations so characterized are, at some suitable level, functionally characterizable entities that are realized by the physical properties of the subject having propositional attitudes (if the subject is an organism, then the realizing properties are presumably the neurophysiological properties in the brain or the central nervous system of the organism).
(2) the operations on representations (constituting, as per (A2), the domain of mental processes, thinking) are causally sensitive to the syntactic/formal structure of representations defined by this combinatorial syntax.
The relation R in (A1), when RTM is combined with (B), is meant to be understood as a computational/functional relation. The idea is that each attitude is identified with a characteristic computational/functional role played by the mental sentence that is the direct "object" of that kind of attitude. (Scare quotes are necessary because it is more appropriate to reserve `object' for a proposition as we have done above, but as long as we keep this in mind, it is harmless to use it in this way for LOT sentences.) For instance, what makes a certain mental sentence an (occurrent) belief might be that it is characteristically the output of perceptual output systems and input to an inferential system that interacts decision-theoretically with desires to produce further sentences or actions. Or equivalently, we may think of belief sentences as those that are accessible only to certain sorts of computational operations appropriate for beliefs, but not to others. Similarly, desire-sentences (and sentences for other attitudes) may be characterized by a different set of operations that define a characteristic computational role for them. In the literature it is customary to use the metaphor of a "belief-box" (cf. Schiffer 1981) as a blanket term to cover whatever specific computational role belief sentences turn out to have in the mental economy of their possessors. (Similarly for "desire-box", etc.)
The Language of Thought Hypothesis is so-called because of (B): token mental representations are like sentences in a language in that they have a syntactically and semantically regimented constituent structure. Put differently, mental representations that are the direct "objects" of attitudes are structurally complex symbols whose complexity lends itself to a syntactic and semantic analysis. This is also why the LOT is sometimes called Mentalese.
It is (B2) that makes LOTH a species of the so-called Computational Theory of Mind (CTM). This is why LOTH is sometimes called the Computational/Representational Theory of Mind or Thought (CRTM/CRTT) (cf. Rey 1991, 1997). Indeed, LOTH seems to be the most natural product when RTM is combined with a view that would treat mental processes or thinking as computational when computation is understood traditionally or classically (this is a recent term emphasizing the contrast with connectionist processing, which we will discuss later).
When someone believes that P, there is a trivial sense in which the immediate "object" of her belief, what she believes, can be said to be a complex symbol, according to LOTH, a sentence in her LOT physically realized in the neurophysiology of her brain, that has both syntactic structure and a semantic content, namely the proposition that P. So, contrary to the orthodox view that takes the belief relation as a dyadic relation between an agent and a proposition, LOTH takes it to be a triadic relation among an agent, a Mentalese sentence, and a proposition. The Mentalese sentence can then be said to have the proposition as its semantic/intentional content. It is only in this (perhaps indirect) sense can it be said that what is believed is a proposition, and thus the object of the attitude in more common philosophical parlance.
This triadic view seems to have an advantage over the orthodox dyadic view in that it is a puzzle in the dyadic view how what are thought to be purely physical organisms can stand in direct relation to abstract objects like propositions in such a way as to influence their causal powers. According to folk psychology, it is because those states have the propositional content they do that they have the causal powers they do. LOTH makes this relatively non-mysterious by introducing a physical intermediary that is capable of having the relevant causal powers in virtue of its syntactic structure that encodes its semantic content. Another advantage of this is that the thought processes can be causally guided by the syntactic forms of the sentences in a way that respect their semantic contents. This is the virtue of (B) to which we'll come back below. Mainly because of these features, LOTH is said to scientifically vindicate folk psychology if it turns out to be true.
When viewed this way, LOTH is not, strictly speaking, committed to preserving the folk taxonomy of the mental states in any very exact way. Notions like belief, desire, hope, fear, etc. are folk notions and, as such, it may not be utterly plausible to expect (eliminativist arguments aside) that a scientific psychology will preserve the exact contours of these concepts. On the contrary, there is every reason to believe that scientific counterparts of these notions will carve the mental space somewhat differently. For instance, it has been noted that the folk notion of belief harbors many distinctions. It is noted for example that it has both a dispositional and an occurrent sense. In the occurrent sense, it seems to mean something like consciously entertaining and accepting a thought (proposition) as true. There is quite a bit of literature and controversy on the dispositional sense. Beliefs are also capable of being explicitly stored in long term memory as opposed to being merely dispositional or tacit. Compare, for instance: I believe that there was a big surprise party for my 24th birthday vs. I have always believed that lions don't eat their food with forks and knives, or that 13652/4=3413, even though until now these latter two thoughts had never occurred to me. There is furthermore the issue of degree of belief: while I may believe that George will come to dinner with his new girlfriend even though I wouldn't bet on it, you, thinking that you know him better than I do, may nevertheless go to the wall for it. It is unlikely that there will be one single construct of scientific psychology that will exactly correspond to the folk notion of belief in all these ways.
For LOTH to vindicate folk psychology it is sufficient that a scientific psychology with a LOT architecture come up with scientifically grounded psychological states that are recognizably like the propositional attitudes of folk psychology, and that play more or less similar roles in psychological explanations.
LOTH is an hypothesis about the nature of thought and thinking with propositional content. As such, it may or may not be applicable to other aspects of mental life. Officially, it is silent about the nature of some mental phenomena such as experience, qualia, sensory processes, mental images, visual and auditory imagination, sensory memory, perceptual pattern-recognition capacities, dreaming, hallucinating, etc. To be sure, many LOT theorists hold views about these aspects of mental life that make it seem that they are also to be explained by something similar to LOTH.
For instance, Fodor seems to think that many modular input systems (Fodor 1983) have their own LOT to the extent to which they can be explained in representational and computational terms. Indeed, many contemporary psychological models treat perceptual input systems in just these terms. There is indeed some evidence that this kind of treatment is appropriate for many perceptual processes. But it is to be kept in mind that a system may employ representations and be computational without necessarily satisfying any or both of the clauses in (B) above in any full-fledged way. Just think of finite automata theory where there are plenty of examples of a computational process defined over states or symbols which lack full-blown syntactic and/or semantic structural complexity. Whether sensory or perceptual processes are to be treated within the framework of full-blown LOTH is again an open empirical question. It may well be that the answer to this question is affirmative. If so, there may be more than one LOT realized in different subsystems or mechanisms in the mind/brain. So LOTH is not committed to there being a single representational system realized in the brain, nor is it committed to the claim that all mental representations are complex or language-like, nor would it be falsified if it turns out that most aspects of mental life other than the ones involving propositional attitudes don't require a LOT.
Similarly, there is strong evidence that the mind also exploits an image-like representational medium for certain kinds of mental tasks. LOTH is non-committal about the existence of an image-like representational system for many mental tasks other than the ones involving propositional attitudes. But it is committed to the claim that propositional thought and thinking cannot be successfully accounted for in its entirety in purely imagistic terms. It claims that a combinatorial sentential syntax is necessary for propositional attitudes and a purely imagistic medium is not an adequate medium to capture that.
There are in fact some interesting and difficult issues surrounding these claims. The adequacy of an imagistic system seems to turn on the nature of syntax at the sentential level. For instance, Fodor, in Chapter 4 of his (1975) book, allows that many lexical items in one's LOT may be image-like; he introduces the notion of a mental image/picture under description to avoid some obvious inadequacies of pictures (e.g., what makes a picture a picture of a fat woman rather than a pregnant one, or vice versa, etc.). This is an attempt to combine discursive and imagistic representational elements at the lexical level. There may even be a well defined sense in which pictures can be combined to produce structurally complex pictures (as in British Empiricism: image-like simple ideas are combined to produce complex ideas, e.g., the idea of a unicorn) But what is absolutely essential for LOTH, and what Fodor insists on, is the claim that there is no adequate way in which a purely image-like system can capture what is involved in making judgments, i.e., in judging propositions to be true. This seems to require a discursive syntactic approach at the sentential level. The general problem here is the inadequacy of pictures or image-like representations to express propositions. I can judge that the blue box is on top of the red one without judging that the red box is under the blue one. I can judge that Mary kisses John without judging that John kisses Mary, and so on for indefinitely many such cases, concrete as well as abstract. It is hard to see how images or pictures can do that without using any syntactic structure or discursive elements, to say nothing of judging, e.g., conditionals, disjunctive or negative propositions, quantifications, negative existentials, etc.
Moreover, there are difficulties with imagistic representations arising from demands on processing representations . As we will see below, (B2) turns out to provide the foundations for one of the most important arguments for LOTH: it makes it possible to mechanize thinking understood as a semantically coherent thought process, which, as per (A2), consists of a causal sequence of tokenings of mental representations. It is not clear, however, how an equivalent of (B2) could be provided for images or pictures in order to accommodate operations defined over them, even if something like an equivalent of (B1) could be given. On the other hand, there are truly promising attempts to integrate discursive symbolic theorem-proving with reasoning with image-like symbols. They achieve impressive efficiency in theorem-proving or in any deductive process defined over the expressions of such an integrated system. Such attempts, if they prove to be generalizable to psychological theorizing, are by no means threats to LOTH; on the contrary, such systems have every features to make them a species of a LOT system: they satisfy (B).
However, it should be emphasized that LOTH is not committed to such a strong version of nativism, especially about concepts. It is certainly plausible to assume that LOTH will turn out to have some empirically (as well as theoretically/a priori) motivated nativist commitments about the structural organization and dynamic management of the entire representational system. But this much is to be expected especially in the light of recent empirical findings and trends. This, however, does not constitutes a reductio. It is an open empirical question how much nativism is true about concepts, and LOTH should be so taken as to be capable of accommodating whatever turns out to be true in this matter. LOTH, therefore, when properly conceived, is independent of any specific proposal about conceptual nativism.
How could anything material have conscious states? How could anything material have semantical properties? How could anything material be rational? (where this means something like: how could the state transitions of a physical system preserve semantical properties?). (1991: 285, Reply to Devitt)LOTH is a full-blown attempt to give a naturalist answer to the third question, an attempt to solve at least part of the problem underlying the second one, and is almost completely silent about the first.
According to RTM, propositional attitudes are relations to meaningful mental representations whose tokenings constitute the domain of thinking. This much can, in principle, be granted by an intentional realist who would nevertheless reject LOTH. Indeed, there are plenty of theorists who accept RTM in some suitable form (and also happily accept (C) in many cases) but reject LOTH either by explicitly rejecting (B) or simply by remaining neutral about it. Among some of the prominent people who choose the former option are Searle (1984, 1990, 1992), Stalnaker (1984), Lewis (1972), Barwise and Perry (1983). Some who opt for the latter include Loar (1982a, 1982b), Dretske (1981); Armstrong (1980), and many contemporary functionalists.
But RTM per se doesn't so much propose a naturalistic solution to intentionality and mechanization of thinking as simply assert a framework to emphasize intentional realism and, perhaps, with (C), a declaration of a commitment to naturalism or physicalism at best. How, then, is the addition of (B) supposed to help? Let us first try to see in a bit more detail what the problem is supposed to be in the first place to which (B) is proposed as a solution. So let us start by reflecting on thinking and see what it is about thinking that makes it a mystery in Fodor's list. This will give rise to one of the most powerful (albeit still nondemonstrative) arguments for LOTH.
Computers are environments in which symbols are manipulated in virtue of their formal features, but what is thus preserved are their semantic properties, hence the semantic coherence of symbolic processes. Slightly paraphrasing Haugeland (cf. 1985: 106), who puts the same point nicely in the form of a motto:
THE FORMALIST MOTTO:This is in virtue of the mimicry or mirroring relation between the semantic and formal properties of symbols. As Dennett once put it in describing LOTH, we can view the thinking brain as a syntactically driven engine preserving semantic properties of its processes, i.e. driving a semantic engine. What is so nice about this picture is that if LOTH is true we have a naturalistically adequate causal treatment of thinking that respect the semantic properties of the thoughts involved: it is in virtue of the physically coded syntactic/formal features that thoughts cause each other while the coherence of their semantic properties is preserved precisely in virtue of this.
If you take care of the syntax of a representational system, its semantics will take care of itself.
Whether or not LOTH actually turns out to be empirically true in the details or in its entire vision of rational thinking, this picture of a syntactic engine driving a semantic one can at least be taken to be an important philosophical demonstration of how Descartes' challenge can be met (cf. Rey 1997: chp.8). Descartes claimed that rationality in the sense of having the power "to act in all the contingencies of life in the way in which our reason makes us act" cannot possibly be possessed by a purely physical device: "The rational soul ... could not be in any way extracted from the power of matter ... but must ... be expressly created" (1637/1970: 117-18). Descartes was completely puzzled by just this rational character and semantic coherence of thought processes so much so that he failed to even imagine a possible mechanistic explication of it. He thus was forced to appeal to Divine creation. But we can now see/imagine at least a possible mechanistic/naturalistic scenario.
As characterized at the beginning, RTM contains a clause (A1b) that says that the immediate object of a propositional attitude that P is a mental representation #P# that means that P. Again, (B1) attributes a compositional semantics to the syntactically complex symbols belonging to one's LOT that are, as per (C), physically realized in the brain of a thinking organism. According to LOTH, the semantic content of propositional attitudes is inherited from the semantic content of the mental symbols. So Brentano's questions for a LOT theorist becomes: how do the symbols in one's LOT get their meanings in the first place? There are two levels or stages at which this question can be raised and answered:
(1) At the level of atomic (simple) symbols: how do the atomic symbols represent what they do?There have been at least two major lines LOT theorists have taken regarding these questions. The one that is least committal might perhaps be usefully described as the official position regarding LOTH's treatment of intentionality. Most LOT theorists seem to have taken this line. The official line doesn't propose any theory about the first stage, but simply assumes that the first question can be answered in a naturalistically acceptable way. In other words, officially LOTH simply assumes that the atomic symbols/expressions in one's LOT have whatever meanings they have.
(2) At the level of molecular (phrasal complexes or sentences) symbols: how do molecular symbols represent what they do?
But, the official line continues, LOTH has a lot to say about the second stage, the stage where the semantic contents are computed or assigned to complex (molecular) symbols on the basis of their combinatorial syntax or grammar together with whatever meanings atomic symbols are assumed to have in the first stage. This procedure is familiar from a Tarski-style definition of truth conditions of sentences. The truth-value of complex sentences in propositional logic are completely determined by the truth-values of the atomic sentences they contain together with the rules fixed by the truth-tables of the connectives occurring in the complex sentences. Example: `P and Q' is true just in case both `P' and `Q' are true, but false otherwise. This process is similar but more complex in first-order languages, and even more so for natural languages -- in fact, we don't have a completely working compositional semantics for the latter at the moment. So, if we have a semantic interpretation of atomic symbols (if we have symbols whose reference and extension are fixed at the first stage by whatever naturalistic mechanism turns out to govern it), then the combinatorial syntax will take over and effectively determine the semantic interpretation (truth-conditions) of the complex sentences they are constituents of. So officially LOTH would only contribute to a complete naturalization project if there is a naturalistic story at the atomic level.
Early Fodor (1975, 1978, 1978a, 1980), for instance, envisaged a science of psychology which, among other things, would reasonably set for itself the goal of discovering the combinatorial syntactic principles of LOT and the computational rules governing its operations, without worrying much about semantic matters, especially about how to fix the semantics of atomic symbols (he probably thought that this was not a job for LOTH). Similarly, Field (1978) is very explicit about the combinatorial rules for assigning truth-conditions to the sentences of the internal code. In fact, Field's major argument for LOTH is that, given a naturalistic causal theory of reference for atomic symbols, about which he is optimistic (Field 1972), it is the only naturalistic theory that has a chance of solving Brentano's puzzle. For the moment, this is not much more than a hope, but, according to the LOT theorist, it is a well-founded hope based on a number of theoretical and empirical assumptions and data. Furthermore, it is a framework defining a naturalistic research program in which there have been promising successes.
As I said, this official and, in a way, least committal line has been overall the more standard way of conceiving LOTH's role in the project of naturalizing intentionality. But some have gone beyond it and explored the ways in which the resources of LOTH can be exploited even in answering the first question (1) about the semantics of atomic symbols.
Now, there is a weak version of an answer to (1) on the part of LOTH and a strong version. On the weak version, LOTH may be untendentiously viewed as inevitably providing some of the resources in giving the ultimate naturalistic theory in naturalizing the meaning of atomic symbols. The basic idea is that whatever the ultimate naturalistic theory turns out to be true about atomic expressions, computation as conceived by LOTH will be part of it. For instance, it may be that, as with nomic covariation theories of meaning (Fodor 1987, 1990a; Dretske 1981), the meaning of an atomic predicate may consist in its potential to get tokened in the presence of (or, in causal response to) something that instantiates the property the predicate is said to express. A natural way of explicating this potential may partly but ultimately rely on certain computational principles the symbol may be subjected to within a LOT framework, or principles that in some sense govern the "behavior" of the symbol. Insofar as computation is naturalistically understood in the way LOTH proposes, a complete answer to the first question about the semantics of atomic symbols may plausibly involve an explicatory appeal to computation within a system of symbols. This is the weak version because it doesn't see LOTH as proposing a complete solution to the first question (1) above, but only helping it.
A strong version would have it that LOTH provides a complete naturalistic solution to both questions: given the resources of LOTH we don't need to look any further to meet Brentano's challenge. The basic idea lies in so-called functional or conceptual role semantics, according to which a concept is the concept it is precisely in virtue of the particular causal/functional potential it has in interacting with other concepts. Each concept may be thought of as having a certain distinctive set of epistemic/semantic relations or liaisons to other concepts. We can conceive of this set as determining a certain "conceptual role" for each concept. We can then take these roles to determine the semantic identity of concepts: concepts are the concepts they are because they have the conceptual roles they have; that is to say, among other things, concepts represent whatever they do precisely in virtue of these roles. The idea then is to reduce each conceptual role to causal/functional role of atomic symbols (now conceived as primitive terms in LOTH), and then use the resources of LOTH to reduce it in turn to computational role. Since computation is naturalistically well-defined, the argument goes, and since causal interactions between thoughts and concepts can be understood completely in terms of computation, we can completely naturalize intentionality if we can successfully treat meanings as arising out of thoughts/concepts' internal interactions with each other. In other words, the strong version of LOTH would claim that atomic symbols in LOT have the content they do in virtue of their potential for causal interactions with other tokens, and cashing out this potential in mechanical/naturalistic terms is what, among other things, LOTH is for. LOTH then comes as a naturalistic rescuer for conceptual role semantics.
It is not clear whether any one holds this strong version of LOTH in this rather naive form. But certainly some people have elaborated the basic idea in quite subtle ways, for which Cummins (1989: chp.8) is perhaps the best example. (But also see Block 1986 and Field 1978.) But even in the best hands, the proposal turns out to be very problematic and full of difficulties nobody seems to know how to straighten out. In fact, some of the most ardent critics of taking LOTH as incorporating a functional role semantics turn out to be some of the most ardent defenders of LOTH understood in a weak, non-committal sense we have explored above -- see Fodor (1987: chp.3), Fodor and Lepore (1991), Fodor's attack (1978b) on AI's way of doing procedural semantics is also relevant here. Haugeland (1981), Searle (1980, 1984), and Putnam (1988) quite explicitly take LOTH to involve a program for providing a complete semantic account of mental symbols, which they then attack accordingly.
As indicated previously, LOTH is almost completely silent about consciousness and the problem of qualia, the third mystery in Fodor's list in the quote above. But the naturalist's hope is that this problem too will be solved, if not by LOTH, then by something else. On the other hand, it is important to emphasize that LOTH is neutral about the naturalizability of consciousness/qualia. If it turns out that qualia cannot be naturalized, this would by no means show that LOTH is false or defective in some way. In fact, there are people who seem to think that LOTH may well turn out to be true even though qualia can perhaps not be naturalized (e.g., Block 1980, Chalmers 1996, McGinn 1991).
Finally, it should be emphasized that LOTH has no particular commitment to every symbolic activity's being conscious. Conscious thoughts and thinking may be the tip of a computational iceberg. Nevertheless, there are ways in which LOTH can be helpful for an account of state consciousness that seeks to explain a thought's being conscious in terms of a higher order thought which is about the first order thought. So, to the extent to which thought and thinking are conscious, to that extent LOTH can perhaps be viewed as providing some of the necessary resources for a naturalistic account of state consciousness -- for elaboration see Rosenthal (1997) and Lycan (1997).
In Fodor's (1975), the arguments for different aspects of LOTH are diffused and the emphasis, with the book's slogan "no computation without representation", is put on the RTM rather than on (B) or (C). But all the elements are surely there.
People seem to be capable of entertaining an infinite number of thoughts, at least in principle, although they in fact entertain only a finite number of them. Indeed adults who speak a natural language are capable of understanding sentences they have never heard uttered before. Here is one: there is a big lake of melted gold on the dark side of the moon. I bet that you never heard this sentence before, and yet, you have no difficulty in understanding it: it is one you're in fact likely to believe false. But this sentence was arbitrary, there are infinitely many such sentences I can in principle utter and you can in principle understand. But understanding a sentence is to entertain the thought/proposition it expresses. So there are in principle infinitely many thoughts you are capable of entertaining. This is sometimes expressed by saying that we have an unbounded competence in entertaining different thoughts, even though we have a bounded performance. But this unbounded capacity is to be achieved by finite means. For instance, storing an infinite number of representations in our heads is out of the question: we are finite beings. If human cognitive capacities (capacities to entertain an unbounded number of thoughts, or to have attitudes towards an unbounded number of propositions) are productive in this sense, how is this to be explained on the basis of finitary resources?
The explanation LOTH offers is straightforward: postulate a representational system that satisfies at least (B1). Indeed, recursion is the only known way to produce an infinite number of symbols from a finite base. In fact, given LOTH, productivity of thought as a competence mechanism seems to be guaranteed.
Fodor and Pylyshyn bring out the force of this psychological fact by comparing learning languages the way we actually do with learning a language by memorizing a huge phrase book. In the phrase book model, there is nothing to prevent someone learning how to say `John loves the girl' without learning how to say `the girl loves John.' In fact, that is exactly the way some information booklets prepared for tourists help them to cope with their new social environment. You might, for example, learn from a phrase book how to say `I'd like to have a cup of coffee with sugar and milk' in Turkish without knowing how to say/understand absolutely anything else in Turkish. In other words, the phrase book model of learning a language allows arbitrarily punctate linguistic capabilities. In contrast, a speaker's knowledge of her native language is not punctate, it is systematic. Accordingly, you do not find, by nomological necessity, native speakers whose linguistic capacities are punctate.
Now, how is this empirical truth (in fact, a law-like generalization) to be explained? Obviously if this is a general nomological fact, then learning one's native language cannot be modeled on the phrase book model. What is the alternative? The alternative is well known. Native speakers master the grammar and vocabulary of their language. But this is just to say that sentences are not atomic, but have syntactic constituent structure. If you have a vocabulary, the grammar tells you how to combine systematically the words into sentences. Hence, in this way, if you know how to construct a particular sentence out of certain words, you automatically know how to construct many others. If you view all sentences as atomic, then, as Fodor and Pylyshyn say, the systematicity of language production/understanding is a mystery, but if you acknowledge that sentences have syntactic constituent structure, systematicity of linguistic capacities is what you automatically get; it is guaranteed. This is the orthodox explanation of linguistic systematicity.
From here, according to Fodor and Pylyshyn, establishing the systematicity of thought as a nomological fact is one step away. If it is a law that the ability to understand a sentence is systematically connected to the ability to understand many others, then it is similarly a law that the ability to think a thought is systematically connected to the ability to think many others. For to understand a sentence is just to think the thought/proposition it expresses. Since, according to RTM, to think a certain thought is just to token a representation in the head that expresses the relevant proposition, the ability to token certain representations is systematically connected to the ability to token certain others. But then, this fact needs an adequate explanation too. The classical explanation LOTH offers is to postulate a system of representations with combinatorial syntax exactly as in the case of the explanation of the linguistic systematicity. This is what (B1) offers. This seems to be the only explanation that does not make the systematicity of thought a miracle, and thus argues for the LOT hypothesis.
However, thought is not only systematic but also compositional: systematically connected thoughts are also always semantically related in such a way that the thoughts so related seem to be composed out of the same semantic elements. For instance, the ability to think `John loves the girl' is connected to the ability to think `the girl loves John' but not to, say, `protons are made up of quarks' or to `2+2=4.' Why is this so? The answer LOTH gives is to postulate a combinatorial semantics in addition to a combinatorial syntax, where an atomic constituent of a mental sentence makes (approximately) the same semantic contribution to any complex mental expression in which it occurs. This is what Fodor and Pylyshyn call `the principle of compositionality'.
In brief, it is an argument for LOTH that it offers a cogent and principled solution to the systematicity and compositionality of cognitive capacities by postulating a system of representations that has a combinatorial syntax and semantics, i.e., a system of representations that satisfies at least (B1).
As we have seen, the explanation LOTH offers depends on the exploitation of the notion of logical form or syntactic structure determined by the combinatorial syntax postulated for the representational system. The combinatorial syntax not only gives us a criterion of well-formedness for mental expressions, but it also defines the logical form or syntactic structure for each well-formed expression. The classical solution to inferential systematicity is to make the mental operations on representations sensitive to their form or structure, i.e. to insist on (B2). Since, from a syntactic view point, similarly formed expressions will have similar forms, it is possible to define a single operation which will apply to only certain expressions that have a certain form, say, only to conjunctions, or disjunctions. This allows the LOT theorist to give homogeneous explanations of what appear to be homogeneous classes of inferential capacities. This is one of the greatest virtues of LOTH, hence provides an argument for it.
The solution LOTH offers for what I called the problem of thinking, above, is connected to the argument here because the two phenomena are connected in a deep way. Thinking requires that the logico-semantic properties of a particular thought process (say, inferring that John is happy from knowing that if John is at the beach then John is happy and coming to realize that John is indeed at the beach) be somehow causally implicated in the process. The systematicity of inferential thought processes then is based on the observation that if the agent is capable of making that particular inference, then she is capable of making many other somehow similarly organized inferences. But the idea of similar organization in this context seems to demand some sort of classification of thoughts independently of their particular content. But what can the basis of such a classification be? The only basis seems to be the logico-syntactic properties of thoughts, their form. Although it feels a little uneasy to talk about syntactic properties of thoughts common-sensically understood, it seems that they are forced upon us by the very attempt to understand their semantic properties: how, for instance, could we explain the semantic content of the thought that if John is at the beach then he is happy without somehow appealing to its being a conditional? This is the point of contact between the two phenomena. Especially when the demands of naturalism are added to this picture, inferring a LOT (= a representational system satisfying B) realized in the brain becomes almost irresistible. Indeed Rey (1995) doesn't resist and claims that, given the above observations, LOTH can be established on the basis of arguments that are not "merely empirical". I leave it to the reader to evaluate whether mere critical reflection on our concepts of thought and thinking could, all by itself, establish LOTH.
The basic complaint is that in each of these cases, either the explanations generate a regress because the same sort of explanations ought to be given for how the LOT is learned, understood or can be meaningful, or else they are gratuitous because if a successful explanation can be given for LOT that does not generate a regress then it could and ought to be given for the natural language phenomena without introducing a LOT (see, e.g. Blackburn 1984). Fodor's response in (1975) is (1) that LOT is not learned, it's innate, (2) that it's understood in a different sense than the sense involved in natural language comprehension, and (3) that LOT sentences acquire their meanings not in virtue of another meaningful language but in a completely different way, perhaps by standing in some sort of causal relation to what they represent (see above) or by having certain computational profiles. For many who have a Wittgensteinian bent, these replies are not likely to be very convincing. But here the issues tend to concern RTM rather than (B).
Laurence and Margolis (1997) point out that the regress arguments depend on the assumption that LOTH is introduced only to explain (1)-(3). If it can be shown that there are lots of other empirical phenomena for which the LOTH provides good explanations, then the regress arguments fail because LOTH then would not be gratuitous. In fact, as we have seen above, there are plenty of such phenomena. But still it is important to realize that the sort of explanations proposed for the understanding of one's LOT (computational use/activity of LOT sentences with certain meanings) and how LOT sentences can be meaningful (computational roles and/or nomic relations with the world) cannot be given for (1)-(3): it's unclear, for example, what it would be like to give a computational role and/or nomic relation account for the meanings of natural language utterances.
In a recent conversation with the designer of a chess-playing program I heard the following criticism of a rival program: "it thinks it should get its queen out early." This ascribes a propositional attitude to the program in a very useful and predictive way, for as the designer went on to say, one can usefully count on chasing that queen around the board. But for all the many levels of explicit representation to be found in that program, nowhere is anything roughly synonymous with "I should get my queen out early" explicitly tokened. The level of analysis to which the designer's remark belongs describes features of the program that are, in an entirely innocent way, emergent properties of the computational processes that have "engineering reality." I see no reason to believe that the relation between belief-talk and psychological talk will be any more direct. (Dennett 1981: 107)The objection, as Fodor (1987: 22) points out, isn't that the program has a dispositional, or potential, belief that it will get its queen out early. Rather, the program actually operates on this belief. There appear to be lots of other examples: e.g. in reasoning we pretty often follow certain inference rules like modus ponens, disjunctive syllogism, etc. without necessarily explicitly representing them.
The standard reply to such objections is to draw a distinction between rules on the basis of which Mentalese data-structures are manipulated, and the data-structures themselves (intuitively, the program/data distinction). LOTH is not committed to every rule's being explicitly represented. In fact, as a point of nomological fact, in a computational device not every rule can be explicitly represented: some have to be hard-wired and, thus, implicit in this sense. In other words, LOTH permits but doesn't require that rules be explicitly represented. On the other hand, data structures have to be explicitly represented: it is these that are manipulated formally by the rules. No causal manipulation is possible without explicit tokening of these structures. According to Fodor, if a propositional attitude is an actual episode in one's reasoning that plays a causal role, then LOTH is committed to explicit representation of its content, which is as per (A2 and B2) causally implicated in the physical process realizing that reasoning. Dispositional propositional attitudes can then be accounted for in terms of an appropriate principle of inferential closure of explicitly represented propositional attitudes (cf. Lycan 1986).
Dennett's chess program certainly involves explicit representations of the chess board, the pieces, etc. and perhaps some of the rules. Which rules are implicit and which are explicit depend on the empirical details of the program. Pointing to the fact that there may be some rules that are emergent out of the implementation of explicit rules and data-structures does not suffice to undermine LOTH.
They are ruled out by an appropriate reading of (A1) and (B1): (A1) says that the person herself must stand in an appropriate computational relation to a Mentalese sentence, which, as per (B1), has a suitable syntax and semantics. Only then, will the sentence constitute the person's having a propositional attitude. Not all explicit symbols in one's LOT will satisfy this. In other words, not every computational routine will correspond to a processing appropriately described as storage in, e.g., the "belief-box". Furthermore, as pointed out by Fodor (1987), LOTH would vindicate the common sense view of propositional attitudes if they turn out to be computational relations to Mentalese sentences. It may not be further required that every explicit representation correspond to a propositional attitude.
There have been many other objections to LOTH in recent years raised especially by connectionists: that LOT systems cannot handle certain cognitive tasks like perceptual pattern recognition, that they are too brittle and not sufficiently damage resistant, that they don't exhibit graceful degradation when physically damaged or as a response to noisy or degraded input, that they are too rigid, deterministic, so are not well-suited for modeling humans' capacity to satisfy multiple soft-constraints so gracefully, that they are not biologically realistic, and so on. For useful discussions of these and many similar objections, see Rumelhart, McClelland and the PDP Research Group (1986), Fodor and Pylyshyn (1988), Bechtel and Abrahamsen (1991), Horgan and Tienson (1996), and McLaughlin and Warfield (1994).
In the early 1980's, however, Fodor's claim that LOTH was the only game in town was beginning to be challenged by some people who were working on so-called connectionist networks. They claimed that connectionism offered a new and radically different alternative to classicism in modeling cognitive phenomena. The name `classicism' has since then become to be applied to the LOTH framework. On the other hand, many classicists like Fodor thought that connectionism was nothing but a slightly more sophisticated way with which the old and long dead associationism, whose roots could be traced back to early British empiricists, was being revived. In 1988 Fodor and Pylyshyn (F&P) published a long article, "Connectionism and Cognitive Architecture: A Critical Analysis", in which they launched a formidable attack on connectionism, which largely set the terms for the ensuing debate between connectionists and classicists.
F&P's forceful criticism consists in posing a dilemma for connectionists: They either fail to explain the law-like cognitive regularities like systematicity and productivity in an adequate way or the connectionist models are nothing but mere implementation models of classical architectures; hence, they fail to provide a radically new paradigm as connectionists claim. This conclusion was also meant to be a challenge: Explain the cognitive regularities in question without postulating a LOT architecture.
First, let me present F&P's argument against connectionism in a somewhat reconstructed fashion. It will be helpful to characterize the debate by locating the issues according to the reactions many connectionists had to the premises of the argument.
F&P's Argument against Connectionism in their (1988):
(i) Cognition essentially involves representational states and causal operations whose domain and range are these states; consequently, any scientifically adequate account of cognition should acknowledge such states and processes.The notion of cognitive architecture assumes special importance in this debate. F&P's characterization of the notion goes as follows:
(ii) Higher cognition (specifically, thought and thinking with propositional content) conceived in this way, has certain scientifically interesting properties: in particular, it is a law of nature that cognitive capacities are productive, systematic, and inferentially coherent.
(iii) Accordingly, the architecture of any proposed cognitive model is scientifically adequate only if it guarantees that cognitive capacities are productive, systematic, etc. This would amount to explaining, in the scientifically relevant and required sense, how it could be a law that cognition has these properties.
(iv) The only way (i.e. necessary condition) for a cognitive architecture to guarantee systematicity (etc.) is for it to involve a representational system for which (B) is true (see above). (Classical architectures necessarily satisfy (B).)
(v) Either the architecture of connectionist models does satisfy (B), or it does not.
(vi) If it does, then connectionist models are implementations of the classical LOT architecture and have little new to offer (i.e., they fail to compete with classicism, and thus connectionism does not constitute a radically new way of modeling cognition).
(vii) If it does not, then (since connectionism does not then guarantee systematicity, etc., in the required sense) connectionism is empirically false as a theory of the cognitive architecture.
(viii) Therefore, connectionism is either true as an implementation theory, or empirically false as a theory of cognitive architecture.
The architecture of the cognitive system consists of the set of basic operations, resources, functions, principles, etc. (generally the sorts of properties that would be described in a "user's manual'' for that architecture if it were available on a computer) whose domain and range are the representational states of the organism. (1988: 10)Also, note that (B1) and (B2) are meta-architectural properties in that they are themselves conditions upon any proposed specific architecture's being classical. They define classicism per se, but not any particular way of being classical. Classicism as such simply claims that whatever the particular cognitive architecture of the brain might turn out to be (whatever the specific grammar of Mentalese turns out to be), (B) must be true of it. F&P claim that this is the only way an architecture can be said to guarantee the nomological necessity of cognitive regularities like systematicity, etc. This seems to be the relevant and required sense in which a scientific explanation of cognition is required to guarantee the regularities -- hence the third premise in their argument.
Connectionist responses have fallen into four classes:
(1) Deny premise(i). The rejection of (i) commits connectionists to what is sometimes called radical or eliminativist connectionism. Premise (i), as F&P point out, draws a general line between eliminativism and representationalism (or, intentional realism). There has been some controversy as to whether connectionism constitutes a serious challenge to the fundamental tenets of folk psychology. It is too early to assess the potential of connectionism in this regard. On the other hand, many connectionists do in fact advance their models as having causally efficacious representational states, and explicitly endorse F&P's first premise. So they seem to accept intentional realism.Much of the recent debate between connectionists and classicists has focused on this option, so let's see how it is possible to reject premise (vi), which seems true by definition of classicism. The connectionists' answer, roughly put, is that when you devise a representational system whose satisfaction of (B) relies on a non-concatenative realization of structural/syntactic complexity of representations, you have a non-classical system. (See especially Smolensky 1990a and van Gelder 1990.) Interestingly, some classicists like Fodor and McLaughlin (1990) (F&M) seem to agree. F&M stipulate that you have a classical system only if the syntactic complexity of representations is realized concatenatively, or as it is sometimes put, explicitly:
(2) Accept the conclusion. This group may be seen as more or less accepting the cogency of the entire argument, and characterizes itself as implementationalist: they hold that connectionist networks will implement a classical architecture or language of thought. According to this group, the appropriate niche for neural networks is closer to neuroscience than to cognitive psychology. They seem to view the importance of the program in terms of its prospects of closing the gap between the neurosciences and high-level cognitive theorizing. In this, many seem content to admit premise (vi).
(3) Deny premise (ii) or (iv). Some connectionists reject (ii) or (iv), holding that there are no lawlike cognitive regularities such as systematicity (etc.) to be explained, or that such regularities do not require a (B)-like architecture for their explanation. Those who question (ii) often question the empirical evidence for systematicity (etc.) and tend to ignore the challenge put forward by F&P. Those who question (iv) also often question (ii), or they argue that there can be very different sort of explanations for systematicity and the like (e.g. evolutionary explanations, see Braddon-Mitchell and Fitzpatrick 1990), or they question the very notion of explanation involved (e.g. Matthews 1994). There are indeed quite a number of different kinds of arguments in the literature against these premises. For a sampling, see Aydede (1995 and 1998) and McLaughlin (1993b), who partitions the debate similarly. The debate on the issues raised by these connectionists and their sympathizers is still very lively.
(4) Deny premise (vi). The group of connectionists who have taken F&P's challenge most seriously has tended to reject premise (vi) in their argument, while accepting, on the face of it, the previous five premises (sometimes with reservations on the issue of productivity). They think that it is possible for connectionist representations to be syntactically structured in some sense without being classical. Prominent in this group are Smolensky (1990a, 1990b, 1995), van Gelder (1989, 1990, 1991), Chalmers (1990, 1993). Some connectionists whose models give support to this line include Elman (1989), Hinton (1990), Touretzky (1990), Pollack (1990).
We ... stipulate that for a pair of expression types E1, E2, the first is a Classical constituent of the second only if the first is tokened whenever the second is tokened. (F&M 1990: 186)The issues about how connectionists propose to obtain constituent sructure non-concatenatively tend to be complex and technical. But they propose to exploit so called distributed representations in certain novel ways. The essential idea behind most of them is to use vector (and tensor) algebra (involving superimposition, multiplication, etc. of vectors) in composing and decomposing connectionist representations which consist in coding patterns of activity across neuron-like units which can be modeled as vectors. The result of such techniques is the production of representations that have in some interesting sense a complexity whose constituent structure is largely implicit in that the constituents are not tokened explicitly when the representations are tokened, but can be recovered by further operations upon them. The interested reader should consult some of the pioneering work by Elman (1989), Hinton (1990), Smolensky (1989, 1990, 1995), Touretzky (1990), Pollack (1990).
F&M's criticism, more specifically stated, however, is this. Connectionists with such techniques only satisfy (B1) in some "extended sense", but they are incapable of satisfying (B2), precisely because their way of satisfying (B1) is committed to a non-concatenative realization of syntactic structures.
Some connectionists disagree (e.g. Chalmers 1993): they claim that you can have structure-sensitive transformations or operations defined over representations whose syntactic structure is non-concatenatively realized. So given the apparent agreement that non-concatenative realization is what makes a system non-classical, connectionists claim that they can and do perfectly satisfy (B) in its entirety with their connectionist models without implementing classical models.
The debate is still intense and there is a fast growing literature built around the many issues raised by it. Aydede (1997) offers an extensive analysis of the debate between classicists and this group of connectionists with special attention to the conceptual underpinnings of the debate. He argues that both parties are wrong in assuming that concatenative realization is relevant to the characterization of LOTH. He specifies what minimally needs to be the case for the LOTH to be true, and why.
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First published: May 28, 1998
Content last modified: April 27, 1999