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On the first point, methodological conservatives such as F.A. Hayek and Michael Oakeshott would certainly be sceptical about the idea that legitimacy could be established discursively.
According to Hayek, this kind of approach embodies the `synoptic delusion', or, in other words, the idea that it is possible to survey adequately the full range of information that might be relevant to determinations of legitimacy, to manipulate this information as needed, and to arrive, via reasoning, at some conclusion one way or another. Furthermore, any such attempt would fail, as other approaches might not, to take adequate account of the `dispersed knowledge' of a large community. On Hayek's account, issues of legitimacy are largely responsible to processes of social evolution--that is, to make an assessment of legitimacy, you need to consider facts about the course of development of the institutions.
According to Oakeshott, a fully discursive treatment of complex political issues associated with legitimacy will fail on account of its inability to take adequate notice of the `tacit knowledge' of practitioners. There is, on this account, much more that is relevant to determining legitimacy than could be expressly articulated, and much more, hence, than could ever be made available as `input' to a justificatory course of reasoning.
These are, if you like, methodologically traditionalist alternatives to the rational, discursive, and intellectualized approach of the advocates of public justification.
Another point of contrast is with those approaches to politics which think that it is mistaken--perhaps corrupt--to seek the kind of stasis (however temporary) that seems to be implied in the idea that some determinate regime might be publicly justifiable and hence legitimate. On this account, the point of politics is not to resolve existing differences--which seems, at least in some sense, to be the point of attempting public justification; it is, rather, to keep alive those differences which are (i) fertile of edifying forms of controversy, and (ii) expressive of the irresolvable plurality of views, frameworks, and `life-styles' in any decently `free' and moderately diverse community.
Jean-Francois Lyotard seems to be an advocate of this position, and resistance to reduction to consensus is also implied by Michel Foucault's views on `normalization'; he says, for instance, that "The search for a form of morality acceptable to everyone ... seems catastrophic". On this account, the main mechanism for facilitating the achievement of public justification would have to be coercive; whether actually or from some normatively-loaded perspective that corrects for `ideological distortion', people's interests are irreconcilable and hence can be brought only by coercion into sufficient alignment to support a claim to public justification. The very demand for public justification is hence itself implicitly authoritarian.
A final point of contrast is with those approaches which see in Rawlsian, Habermasian, and other mechanisms of public justification some attempt to substitute allegedly but not actually politically-innocent notions of rationality for self-admittedly political negotiation of conflict. Benjamin Barber is representative of this school, which wants to seek legitimacy where it can be found, not in the theorist's discourse on justification, but, instead, in institutionally-embodied, public, `real-time' explorations of disputed issues. `We, the People' must do the work of legitimation ourselves, on this account; no theorist's claims to have discovered some `overlapping consensus' implicit in our public political culture can save us from this work. As with Lyotard and others of his ilk, members of this school see the theorist of public justification as a closet authoritarian.
On the normative reading, all this is reversed, at least at the limit. Some proposal is reasonable for a particular individual, on this reading, if it conforms to the beliefs and desires that individual would have if___; if it is supported to the degree that s/he would demand if___; if it was developed in accordance with the inferential procedures she would use if___. In each case, `if' s/he were ideally rational, at least up to the point at which, given fallibility and finitude, it makes sense to imagine h/er being.
A normative reading of the demands of public justification seems to recommend itself. Certainly, we don't have to embrace Marxist notions of ideology to realize that a purely empirical approach to legitimation is likely to fail in two opposed ways. (i) There are (pre-theoretically) illegitimate regimes that would be judged legitimate, on the empirical standard, on account of the population's believing and desiring what they shouldn't, and wouldn't if their thinking hadn't been corrupted--precisely by their membership of this community. (ii) There are (pre-theoretically) legitimate regimes that would be judged illegitimate, on the empirical standard, again on account of their population's believing and desiring what they shouldn't. Surely, a `normative' approach must be preferred in view of these possibilities.
On the other hand, a `normative' approach seems to be vulnerable on two counts. First, it presupposes an accessibly univocal reading of what it is reasonable to believe and desire and to infer from one's beliefs and desires with respect to public political arrangements. If there is `reasonable' disagreement about the demands of reason itself, then potentially--and if so reasonably--groups within a community may have different understandings of what is publicly justified within that community, and hence different notions of what institutions might be legitimate for that community. And, of course, it is arguable, at least, that reason does not pronounce univocally in disciplining our empirical beliefs, desires, and inferences, at least in the realm of human social arrangements. This, if you like, is the lesson of much philosophy of science and epistemology inspired by the work of Thomas Kuhn, who noted very clearly the possibilities (i) that different people might apply the standards of reason in different ways, and (ii) that their doing so was an important factor in the longer-term development of scientific understanding.
Secondly, a normative approach seems to abandon an important guiding principle of justificationist accounts of legitimacy--to wit, their responsiveness to broadly `voluntaristic' considerations. As Thomas Nagel has pointed out, a regime which is publicly justified, although inevitably employing coercion to enforce its primary rules of association, has, on account of its being reasonable from every point of view, some of the advantages of a purely voluntary association. A `normative' approach also seems to sever the historically important link between liberalism and anti-paternalistic thinking. If social arrangements are legitimately enforced against the actual `reasons' of the populace, then this is, within a `normative' framework, on account of the superiority of the theorist's understanding of the reasons for those people to embrace this regime. Obviously, this is a form of `patronage'.
Rawls's position on this matter is somewhat obscure. On the one hand, his preferred phrase, `overlapping consensus', might suggest the first, consensual reading. On the other hand, other statements of his seem to suggest that, for instance, the Kantian's legitimating reasons for some regime might differ quite markedly from the utilitarian's or the Christian's, thus suggesting that the convergence interpretation is more faithful to his intentions. Nevertheless, the consensual reading might be the right one. In his book Political Liberalism, Rawls appears to suggest that the overlapping consensus which he has in mind is one of `reasonable' doctrines. Roughly, these are doctrines which acknowledge or are at least compatible with the acknowledgement of (i) the `burdens of judgment' (roughly, the reasonableness of disagreement over high-level issues in ethico-political and scientific investigations), and (ii) an obligation not to `free ride' on working and mutually beneficial social arrangements. In fact, it is arguable that it is these constituents of `reasonableness' that do the work in the Rawlsian derivation of principles of justice, and, hence, that what makes a regime embodying those principles legitimate is its conformity with an individual's commitment to being `reasonable'. In this case, the mode of justification is consensual, as initial appearances would suggest.
These three ambiguities provide the basis for a typology of styles of public justification, and, certainly, different approaches to public justification can be observed. Rawls and Gauthier are both proponents of public justification, but their approaches could hardly be more different. The typology developed here helps foreground the ways in which they are different--and to provide pigeon-holes for the accommodation of numerous other perspectives.
Of course, there is a problem implicit in this variety of different approaches to public justification. Suppose that we wonder whether a regime S is legitimate. We want to know whether we should give our willing commitment to its demands or, instead, hold ourselves in readiness to oppose these demands when circumstances permit this. Suppose we accept that public justification--reasonableness from every perspective--is the basis for legitimacy. Suppose someone suggests that S is legitimate because there is an actual empirical convergence of maximizing reasons in favor of S. Do we know now whether to conform or resist? Not necessarily. Someone else might come along with the information that there is no hypothetical (i.e. normatively informed) consensus of universalizing reasons in favor of S. The question of legitimacy is--so far, anyway--indeterminate because the notion on which it depends is ambiguous.
Some mechanisms developed by Rawls and put by him to other uses may be relevant in resolving this ambiguity. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls considers a related problem--posed by the fact that there is, in our society and societies like it, no public conception of justice. Of course, there is a shared concept of justice, but this is too vague and abstract to serve as a practical guide. And while there are conceptions of justice which are sufficiently specific to have concrete practical implications, there is no agreement about which of these is the `right' one for the group as a whole. So far the analogy is obvious with the issue of public justification. There is widespread agreement on the concept, but a plurality of interpretations of that concept. What does Rawls suggest in this case? To determine which conception of X is best fitted to play the role of public conception of X, we ask which conception best embodies the ideal of X, where that is given by functional analysis of the concept and its role in collective life. (This method is most obvious at section 23 of A Theory of Justice, where Rawls sets out the "formal conditions that it seems reasonable to impose on the conceptions of justice".) A similar approach might be satisfactory in the case of public justification.
A functional analysis in relation to public justification reveals many different desiderata for any adequate public conception of that concept. In particular, it is reasonable, given the role of the idea of public justification, to expect that any public justification will capture the `double-sidedness' of that concept. On the one hand, public justification does seek some distance from people's actual `reasons', in search of genuine justification rather than specious rationalization. On the other hand, publicly justificatory arguments are meant to have an impact on the individuals which they target, and, in particular, to give them motives as well as reasons for conformity (or otherwise) to the demands they are subject to. (Stephen Macedo makes these points especially forcefully.) Unfortunately, there is prima facie incompatibility between these dual demands. To the extent that a given course of reasoning satisfies the demands for `normative distance', to that extent is it likely to fail to meet the demands for motivational impact. In fact, there is a catalogue of such incompatibilities. (See D'Agostino, Free Public Reason, chapter 6.)
Of course, prima facie means `at first glance'. Perhaps there is some canonical way of balancing these competing demands and hence some public conception of what's required for public justification to be achieved. For reasons which Kuhn has suggested in another context, and which have already been alluded to, and which perhaps reflect elements of Lyotard's preferred `heterology', it is hard to see how a `canonical trade-off' amongst the various desiderata can in fact be identified. (See D'Agostino, Free Public Reason, chapter 7.) This means that the prospects are poor for public justification--and hence for discursive redemption of legitimacy claims--in societies like ours. Perhaps the Foucauldians and post-modernists are right in claiming that notions of legitimacy are inherently and inescapably themselves instruments of power, rather than `rational' alternatives to force. Certainly, if there is no public conception of public justification, any regime is `legitimate' only given a conception of legitimacy that is itself controversial, and hence can be imposed only by force--not by the inducements of `reason'.
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First published: February 27, 1996
Content last modified: July 28, 1997