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Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel

Along with J. G. Fichte and F. W. J. Schelling, Hegel (1770-1831) belongs to the period of "German idealism" in the decades following Kant. The most systematic of the post-Kantian idealists, Hegel attempted, throughout his published writings as well as in his lectures, to elaborate a comprehensive and systematic ontology from a "logical" starting point. He is perhaps most well-known for his teleological account of history, an account which was later taken over by Marx and "inverted" into a materialist theory of an historical development culminating in communism. In the twentieth century, the "logical" side of Hegel's thought has been largely forgotten, but his political and social philosophy has continued to find interest and support. However, in the last decades of the century, a degree of more general philosophical interest in Hegel has also been revived.

Life and Work

Born in 1770 in Stuttgart, Hegel spent the years 1788-1793 as a theology student in nearby Tübingen, forming friendships there with fellow students, the future great romatic poet Friedrich Hölderlin and F. D. E. Schelling, who, like Hegel, would become one of the major figures of the German philosophical scene in the first half of the nineteenth century. These friendships clearly had a major influence on Hegel's philosophical development, and for a while the intellectual lives of these three were closely intertwined.

After graduation Hegel worked as a tutor for families in Bern then Frankfurt, where he wrote early works on religious themes. In 1801 he moved to Jena, the university town in the cultural hot-house of Weimar, to which Schelling had earlier moved. There he was "habilitated" and up until 1804 collaborated with Schelling. During this time Hegel's philosophy was strongly influenced by that of Schelling who in turn had been influenced by but was in the process of breaking away from J. G. Fichte. In 1802 Hegel published his first philosophical work, The Difference between Fichte's and Schelling's System of Philosophy in which he argued that Schelling's approach succeeded where Fichte's failed in the project of systematising and thereby completing Kant's transcendental idealism.

In 1807 Hegel published his Phenomenology of Spirit which showed a divergence from his earlier more Schellingian thought. Schelling, who had left Jena in 1803, interpreted a barbed criticism in the Phenomenology's preface as aimed at him, and their friendship abruptly ended. The occupation of Jena by Napoleon's troops closed the university and Hegel left, working for a short time as an editor of a newspaper in Bamberg, and then from 1808-1816 as the headmaster and philosophy teacher at a "gymnasium" in Nuremberg, during which time he wrote and published his Science of Logic. In 1816 he took up a chair in philosophy at the University of Heidelberg, then in 1818 the chair of philosophy at the University of Berlin, the most prestigious position in the German philosophical world. While in Heidelberg he published the Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences, a systematic work in which an abbreviated version of the earlier Science of Logic (the "lesser logic") was followed by the application of its principles to the Philosophy of Nature and the Philosophy of Spirit. In 1821 in Berlin Hegel published an expanded and developed version of a section of the encyclopaedia Philosophy of Spirit dealing with political philosophy, Elements of the Philosophy of Right. During the following ten years up to his death from cholera in 1831 he continued to teach at Berlin, and published subsequent versions of the Encyclopaedia. After his death versions of his lectures on philosophy of history, philosophy of religion, aesthetics, and the history of philosophy were published.

After Hegel's death, Schelling, whose reputation had long since been eclipsed by that of Hegel, was invited to take up the chair at Berlin, reputedly because the government of the day had wanted to counter the influence that Hegelian philosophy had developed among a generation of students. Since the early period of his collaboration with Hegel, Schelling had become more religious in his philosophising and criticised the "rationalism" of Hegel's philosophy. During this time of Schelling's tenure at Berlin, important forms of later critical reaction to Hegelian philosophy developed. Hegel supporters divided into "left-" and "right-wing" factions; from out of the former circle, Karl Marx was to develop his own "scientific" approach to society and history which appropriated many Hegelian ideas into a materialistic outlook. (Later, especially in reaction to orthodox Soviet versions of Marxism, many "Western Marxists" re-incorporated further Hegelian elements back into their forms of Marxist philosophy.) Many of Schelling's own criticisms of Hegel's rationalism found their way into subsequent "existentialist" thought, via thinkers such as Kierkegaard (who attended Schelling's lectures). Furthermore, the interpretation Schelling offered of Hegel during these years itself helped to shape subsequent generations' understanding of Hegel, contributing to the orthodox or traditional understanding of Hegel as a "metaphysical" thinker in the pre-Kantian "dogmatic" sense.

In academic philosophy, Hegelian idealism underwent a revival in both Great Britain and the United States towards the end of the nineteenth century. In Britain, where philosophers like T. H Green and F. H. Bradley developed metaphysical ideas which they related back to Hegel's thought, Hegel was seen as one of the main targets of attack by the founders of the emerging "analytic" movement around the turn of the twentieth century, Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore. For most of the twentieth century, interest in Hegel has been limited to his relation to other more popular philosophical movements like existentialism or Marxism, or to Hegel's social and political thought. In France, a version of Hegelianism came to influence a generation of thinkers, including Jean-Paul Sartre and the psychoanalyst, Jaques Lacan, through the lectures of Alexandre Kojève, an important precursor to the later "post-modern" movement. A later generation of philosophers coming to prominence in the late 1960s and after, tended to react against Hegel in an analogous way to that in which early analytic philosophers had reacted against the Hegel who had influenced their predecessors. In Germany, important Hegelian elements were incorporated into the approach of thinkers of the Frankfurt School, such as Theodor Adorno, and later, Jürgen Habermas, and that of "hermeneutic" thinkers like H. G. Gadamer. In the 1960s the philosopher Klaus Hartmann developed what was termed a non-metaphysical interpretation of Hegel which has played an important role in the revival of Hegelian philosophy over the subsequent period.

Hegel's Philosophy

Hegel's own pithy account of the nature of philosophy given in the "Preface" to his Elements of the Philosophy of Right captures a characteristic tension in his philosophical approach and, in particular, in his approach to the nature and limits of human cognition. "Philosophy", he says there, "is its own time raised to the level of thought".

On the one hand we can clearly see in the phrase "its own time" the suggestion of a historical or cultural conditionedness and variability which applies even to the highest form of human cognition, philosophy itself -- the contents of philosophical knowledge, we might suspect, will come from the historically changing contents of contemporary culture. On the other, there is the hint that with such contents being "raised" to some higher level, presumably higher than the more everyday levels of cognitive functioning -- those based in everyday perceptual experience, for example. This higher level takes the form of "thought" -- a type of cognition commonly taken as capable of having "eternal" contents (think of Plato and Frege, for example).

This antithetical combination within human cognition of the temporally-conditioned and the eternal, a combination which reflects a broader conception of the human being as what Hegel describes elsewhere as a "finite-infinite", has led to Hegel being regarded in different ways by different types of philosophical readers. For example, towards the end of our century, an historically-minded " anti-realist" like Richard Rorty, distrustful of all claims or aspirations to the "God's-eye view", could praise Hegel as a philosopher who had introduced this historically reflective dimension into philosophy (and setting it on the characteristically "hermeneutic" path which has predominated in modern continental philosophy) but who had unfortunately still become bogged down in the remnants of the Platonistic idea of the search for ahistorical truths. Those adopting such an approach to Hegel tend to have in mind the (relatively) young author of the Phenomenology of Spirit and have tended to dismiss as "metaphysical" later and more systematic works like the Science of Logic. In contrast, the British Hegelian movement at the end of the nineteenth century, for example, tended to ignore the Phenomenology and the more historicist dimensions of his thought, and found in Hegel a systematic metaphysician whose Logic provided a systematic and definitive philosophical ontology of an idealist type. This latter traditional, "metaphysical" view of Hegel had dominated Hegel reception for most of this century, but has over the last few decades been contested by many Hegel scholars who have offered an alternative, "post-Kantian" view of Hegel.

The traditional "metaphysical" view of Hegel's philosophy

Given the understanding of Hegel that predominated at the time of the birth of analytic philosophy together with the fact that early analytic philosophers were rebelling precisely against "Hegelianism" so understood, the "Hegel" encountered in discussions within analytic philosophy is often that of the late nineteenth-century interpretation. In this picture, Hegel is seen as offering a metaphysico-religious view of "Absolute Spirit" which draws on pantheistic ideas of the identity of the universe and God, together with theistic ideas concerning the necessary "self-consciousness" of God. The peculiarity of Hegel's view, on this account, lies in his idea that the mind of God is actual only via the minds of his creations which serve as its vehicle. It is as bearers of this developing self-consciousness of God that those finitely-embodied inhabitants of the universe -- ourselves -- can be such "finite-infinites".

An important consequence of Hegel's metaphysics, so understood, concerns history and the idea of historical development or progress, and it is as advocate of an idea concerning the logically-necessitated teleological course of history that Hegel is most often decried. To many critics Hegel not only was an advocate of a disastrous political conception of the state and the relation of its citizens to it, a conception prefiguring twentieth-century totalitarianism, but had tried to underpin such advocacy with dubious logico-metaphysical speculations. With his idea of the development of "Spirit" in history, Hegel is seen as literalising a way of talking about different cultures in terms of their "spirits", of constructing a developmental sequence of epochs characteristic of nineteenth-century ideas of linear progress, and then enveloping this story of human progress in terms of one about the developing self-conscious of the universe/god itself.

As the bottom line of such an account concerned the evolution of states of a mind (God's), such an account is clearly an idealist one, but not in the sense, say, of Berkeley. The pantheistic legacy inherited by Hegel meant that he had no problem in considering an objective world beyond any particular subjective mind. But this objective world itself had to be understood as conceptually informed, as it were -- it was objectified spirit. Thus in contrast to Berkeleian "subjective idealism" it became common to talk of Hegel as incorporating the "objective idealism" of views, especially common among German historians, in which social life and thought were understood in terms of the conceptual or "spiritual" structures that informed them. But in contrast to both forms of idealism, Hegel, according to this reading, postulated a form of absolute idealism by including both subjective life and the objective cultural practices on which subjective life depends within the dynamics of the development of the self-consciousness and self-actualisation of God, the "Absolute Spirit".

It is hardly surprising, given the more secular character of much twentieth-century philosophy, that Hegel, so understood, would be generally regarded as of merely historical interest. Nevertheless, Hegel was still seen by many as an important precursor of other more characteristically modern strands of thought such as existentialism and Marxist materialism. Existentialists were thought of as taking the idea of the finitude and historical and cultural dependence of individual subjects from Hegel and leaving out all pretensions to the "absolute", while Marxists were thought of as taking the historical dynamics of the Hegelian picture but understanding this in materialist rather than idealist categories. But while the traditional view of Hegel has remained a commonplace throughout this century it has become increasingly questioned as an accurate account of Hegel's philosophy within Hegel scholarship itself. In the last quarter of the twentieth century, an increasing number of Hegel interpreters have argued that such an understanding was seriously flawed, and while various quite different philosophical interpretations of Hegel have emerged which attempt to acquit him of implausible metaphysico-theological views, one common tendency has been to stress the continuity of his ideas with the "critical philosophy" of Immanuel Kant.

The non-traditional or "post-Kantian" view of Hegel

Least controversially, it has been claimed that either particular works such as the Phenomenology of Spirit, or particular areas of Hegel's philosophy, especially his ethical and political philosophy, can be understood as standing independently of the type of unacceptable metaphysical system sketched above. Somewhat more controversially, it has also been argued that the traditional picture is simply wrong at a more general "metaphysical" level and that Hegel is in no way committed to the bizarre "spirit monism" that has been traditionally attributed to him. While these latter views often differ among themselves and continue to take exception to various aspects of Hegel's actual work, they commonly agree in regarding Hegel as being a "post-Kantian" philosopher who had accepted that aspect of Kant's critical philosophy which has been the most influential, his critique of traditional metaphysics. Thus while the traditional view sees Hegel as exemplifying the very type of metaphysical speculation that Kant successfully criticised, the post-Kantian view of Hegel sees him as both accepting and extending Kant's critique, even of turning it against the residual "dogmatically metaphysical" aspects of Kant's own philosophy.

To see Hegel as a post-Kantian is to see him as extending that "critical" turn that Kant saw as setting his philosophy on a scientific footing in a way analogous to the work of Copernicus in cosmology. With his Copernican analogy Kant was comparing the way that the positions of the sun and earth were reversed in Copernicus' transformation of cosmology to the way that the positions of knowing subject and known object were reversed in his own transcendental idealism. Objectivity should be thought of not as a matter of mental contents "corresponding" to the object which cannot be independently known; but rather in terms of the justification of mental contents, or judgments, in terms of criteria which are subjective, in the sense of possessed by the mind, but objective in the sense of possessed universally and necessarily by finite intelligences.

No sooner had Kant's philosophy appeared then many objections were raised, among which were complaints about the apparently irreducible gap between the mind qua universal discursive intelligence and the mind as individual psychological reality. Kantian ideas were quickly assimilated with extant Spinozist ideas concerning mind and body as different aspects of an underlying substance to give yield a type of philosophical biology and with philological ideas relativising the structure of mind to the structures of historically variable languages. Other critics pointed to internal inconsistencies in Kant's picture in which the world in itself seemed to be thought of on the one hand as the cause of its appearance, and on the other, as beyond knowledge and its constituent categories such as "cause". Among the ambitions of many of Kant's successors, including Hegel, was that of somehow "completing" Kant. In Hegel especially, so many argue, one can see the ambition to bring together the universalist dimensions of Kant's transcendental program with the culturally particularist conceptions of his more historically and relativistically-minded contemporaries. This resulted in his controversial conception of "spirit", as developed in his Phenomenology of Spirit. With this notion, it has been argued, Hegel was pursing the Kantian question of the conditions of rational human "mindedness" rather than being concerned with giving an account of the developing self-consciousness of God. But while Kant had limited such conditions to "formal" structures of the mind, Hegel extended them to include aspects of historically and socially determined forms of embodied existence.

Hegel's Works

Phenomenology of Spirit

It is clear that Hegel considers the Phenomenology of Spirit not so much as an exercise in philosophy as a type of induction or education of the reader to the standpoint of philosophical thought itself. As such, its structure has been compared to that of an "educational novel", having an abstractly conceived protagonist -- the bearer of an evolving set of "shapes of consciousness" -- whose progress and set backs the reader follows. At least this is how the work sets out, but in the later sections the earlier "shapes of consciousness" become replaced with what seems more to be shapes of human social existence, and the work comes to look like a type of evolution of interlinked forms of existence and thought characterising the history of western European civilization from the Greeks to the end of the nineteenth century. The fact that it ends in the attainment of "Absolute Knowing" seems to support the traditionalist reading in which a "triumphalist" narrative of the growth of western civilization is combined with the theological interpretation of God's self-manifestation and self-comprehension. Supporters of the non-metaphysical Hegel, however, have argued that what this history tracks is the development of a type of society in which all dogmatic bases of thought have been gradually replaced with demands for conceptually-articulated justifications.

Something of Hegel's phenomenological method may be conveyed by the first few chapters, which are perhaps among the more conventionally philosophical parts. Chapters 1 to 3 effectively follow a developmental series of "shapes of consciousness" which are based on different implicit criteria for epistemic certainty. Chapter 1, "Sense-certainty" considers an epistemological attitude involving an appeal to some immediately given mental content -- the sort of role played by "sense data" in some twentieth-century approaches to philosophy, for example. By following the protagonist's attempts to make these implicit criteria explicit we are meant to appreciate that any mental content, even the apparently most "immediate", in fact contain implicit concepts, and so, in Hegel's terminology, are "mediated". (In more recent terminology one might talk of the "concept-" or "theory-ladenness" of all experience.)

By the end of this chapter our protagonist consciousness (and by implication, we the audience to this drama) has learnt that the structure of consciousness cannot be as originally thought, rather its contents must have some implicit universal (conceptual) aspect to them. Consciousness thus now commences anew with its new implicit criterion -- the assumption that since the contents of consciousness are "universal" they must be publicly graspable by others as well. Hegel's name for this type of direct perceptual realism in which any individual's private apprehension will always be correctable by the group is "perception". As with the case for "sense-certainty", here again, by following the protagonist consciousness's efforts to make this implicit criterion explicit, we see how the criterion generates contradictions which eventually undermine it as a criterion for certainty. In fact, such collapse into a type of self-generated scepticism is typical of all the "shapes" we follow in the work -- there seems something inherently skeptical about such mental processes. But Hegel's point is equally that there has always been something that has been learned in such processes, and this learning is more than the that which consists in the mere elimination of dead-ends such that we are left free to pursue some alternative (a type of philosophical equivalent to Popperian falsification in science). Rather, as in the way that the internal contradictions that emerged from sense-certainty had generated a new shape, perception, the collapse of any given attitude always involves the emergence of some new implicit criterion which will be the basis of a new emergent attitude. With "perception" the emergent shape of consciousness is that Hegel calls "understanding" -- a shape which he identifies with scientific cognition rather than that of everyday intersubjective "perception".

The transition from chapter 3 to 4 "The Truth of Self-Certainty", also marks a more general transition from "consciousness" to "self-consciousness". It is in the course of chapter 4 that we find what is perhaps the most well-known part of the Phenomenology, the account of the "struggle of recognition" in which Hegel examines the intersubjective conditions which he sees as among the necessary conditions for any form of "consciousness".

Like Kant, Hegel thinks that the "consciousness" of something as being other than the self requires self-reflexivity, that is, requires the conscious subject to be aware of itself as a subject for whom something other, an object, is presented as something known. Hegel goes beyond Kant, however, in making this requirement dependent on the recognition of other consciousnesses. In short, one's self-consciousness comes about only indirectly via recognising another conscious subject's recognition of oneself! It is in this way the Phenomenology now changes course, the earlier tracking of "shapes of consciousness" being effectively replaced by the tracking of distinct patterns of mutual recognition.

It is in this way that Hegel has effected the transition from a phenomenology of "subjective spirit" to one of objective spirit -- culturally distinct patterns of social interaction analysed in terms of the patterns of recognition they embody. But this is only worked out in the text gradually. We, the reading "phenomenological we" can see how the type of religious self-consciousness ("unhappy consciousness") with which ch 4 ends, is a form of consciousness that depends on certain sorts of cultural institutions. the protagonist consciousness has to undergo further learning, however, in chapter 5, "Reason" before objective spirit can become the explicit subject of chapter 6, (Spirit).

Hegel's discussion of spirit starts from what he calls "Sittlichkeit", translated as "ethical order" or "ethical substance", a nominalisation from the adjectival (or adverbial) sittlich, "customary", from the stem "Sitte" -- "custom" or "convention". Thus Hegel might be seen as adopting the viewpoint that as social life is ordered by customs we can approach it in terms of the patterns of those customs or conventions themselves -- the rule-governed practices, as it were, of specific forms of life. It is not surprising then that his account of spirit here starts with a discussion of religious and civic law. Undoubtedly it is this tendency to use such renominalisations of abstract concepts in attempt to capture something concrete such as actual patterns of conventional life, together with the tendency to personify, as in talking about "spirit" becoming "self-conscious" that gives plausibility to the traditionalist understanding of Hegel. But for non-traditionalists it is not obvious that Hegel is committed to any metaphysical supra-individual conscious beings. In the second section of the chapter on spirit Hegel discusses "culture" as the "world of self-alienated spirit". That is, human in societies not only act and interact, they create relatively enduring cultural products (stories, dramas, and so forth) within which they can see their own patterns of life reflected. We might find intelligible the idea that such products "hold up a mirror to society" within which "the society can regard itself", without thinking we are thereby committed to some supra-individual social "mind" achieving self-consciousness. In the final section of Spirit, Hegel discusses forms of moral life. From Hegel's point of view, the capacity to adopt the type of objective viewpoint demanded by Kantian morality, for example, depends on the ability to see things, as it were, from a "universal" point of view, that is, a point of view akin to that hitherto implicitly adopted in engaging with spirit's "alienations".

We might think that if Kant had written the Phenomenology, he would have ended it at chapter 6 with the moral subject as the telos of the story. For Kant, the practical knowledge of morality exceeds the scope of theoretical knowledge which had been limited to appearances. Hegel, however, thought that philosophy had to unify theoretical and practical knowledge. Again, this is seen differently by traditionalists and revisionists. For traditionalists, Chapters 7, "Religion" and 8, "Absolute Knowing" (philosophy), testify to Hegel's disregard for Kant's critical limitation of theoretical knowledge to empirical experience. Revisionists, on the other hand, tend to see Hegel as furthering the Kantian critique into the very meaningfulness of a conception of an "in-itself" reality theoretical (but not practical) knowledge of which is denied. Rather than understand "absolute knowing" as an account of the recipe for the acquisition of some ultimate "God's-eye view" of the everything, the philosophical analogue to the knowledge of God sought in religion, revisionists see it as the accession to a mode of self-critical thought that has finally abandoned all non-questionable givens but which will only countenance reason-giving argument as justifications. However we understand this, absolute knowing is the standpoint that Hegel has hoped to bring the reader to in this complex work. This is the "standpoint of science", the standpoint from which philosophy proper commences, and it commences in Hegel's next book, the Science of Logic.

Science of Logic

Hegel's Science of Logic, the three constituent "books" of which appeared in 1812, 1813, and 1816 respectively, is a work that few contemporary logicians would recognise as a work of logic. It is rather more within the line of investigation found in the "transcendental deduction of the categories" in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason in which Kant attempted to "deduce" a list of those concepts, the "categories" which are universal and necessary for the thought of finite, discursive knowers.

A glance at the table of contents of Science of Logic reveals the same triadic structuring noted in the Phenomenology. At the highest level of its branching structure there are three "books", devoted to the doctrines of "being", "essence", and "concept" respectively. In turn, each book has three sections, each section containing three chapters, and so on. In general each of these nodes deals with some particular category or "thought determination", sometimes the first subheading under a higher node having the same name as the node itself. (To some extent, the treatment of the syllogism found in book three is meant to provide a retrospective justification for this structuring, Hegel's idea being that all rigorous thought about anything must grasp it in terms of the fundamental thought determinations of "singularity", "particularity", and "universality". This pattern, then, will be reproduced in rigorous thought about thought itself -- the science of logic.)

Reading into the first chapter of book one, "Being", it is quickly seen that the Logic repeats the movements of the first chapters of the Phenomenology, now, however, at the level of "thought" rather than conscious experience. Thus "being" is the thought determination that the work commences with because it at first seems to be the most "immediate", fundamental determination characterising any possible thought content at all. It has no internal structure (in the way that "bachelor" say has a structure containing further concepts "male" and "unmarried") nor reference to anything beyond itself (in the way that "male", say, has an external contrast with "female"). Again parallel to the Phenomenology, it is the effort of thought to make such a contents explicit that both undermines it and brings about a new content. "Being" seems "immediate" but reflection reveals that it itself is only meaningful in opposition to another concept, "nothing". In fact, the attempt to think "being" as immediate and so as deprived of all determinacy that it might receive by reference to opposing concepts (like "nothing") so empties it that it becomes nothing. Being and nothing seem both absolutely distinct and yet the same, but out of this puzzle a third category suggests itself, "becoming" which seems to save thinking from collapse. When something "becomes" it is, as it were, moving between nothingness and being.

In general this is how the text proceeds: seeking its most basic and universal determination, thought raises a presupposed category to become an object or content of thought itself, finds then that it collapses due to some contradiction generated, but then finds a further category which makes retrospective sense of that contradiction. This new category is more complex as it has internal structure in the way that "being" and "nothing" are "moments" of becoming. But it in turn generates contradictions which bring about some further concept of which it is revealed to be a moment. In this way the categorial infrastructure to thought is unpacked with the resources available to thought itself, its capacity to make its contents determinate and its refusal to tolerate contradiction.

But Hegel's logic is not a formal logic, it does not simply reveal the form of our thoughts about some separate content, is also an ontology, it is the science of that content, "actuality", as well. (Thus it is not just about the concepts "being", "nothing", "becoming" and so on, but about being, nothing becoming and so on.) What we must recognise here is Hegel's radically non-representationalist (and in some sense "direct realist") understanding of thought. The world is not represented in thought, but rather presented or made manifest in it. To think that what is manifest in thought is only an appearance "for us" of some separate "in itself" reality is to fall back into the well-known contradictions of Kant's dichotomy. (We might think here of Kant affirming of the "in itself" its simple "being" because nothing more can be known of it; but this very affirmation would immediately "suck" the in-itself into the Hegelian categorial holism.)

This coincidence of logic and ontology is, of course, regarded by the traditionalists as being at the heart of Hegel's metaphysical idealism. Reality is ultimately made up of thought determinations because it is ultimately mental: it is the reality of a self-conceiving absolute spirit -- God. Nothing looks more like confirming this picture than the treatment of "syllogisms" in the third book, "the doctrine of concept".

The thought determinations of book one had eventually led into those of book two, "The Doctrine of Essence". Naturally the structures implicit in "essence" thinking are more developed than those of "being" thinking. (Crucially, the contrasting pair "essence" and "appearance" allow the thought of some underlying reality which manifests itself through a different overlying appearance, a relation not captureable in the simpler "being" structures.) As Hegel's logic is ontological its various stages are meant to coincide roughly with actual theories encountered in a history of metaphysics. Thus the metaphysics of Parmenides and Heraclitus, for example, line up with the thought determinations "being" and "becoming" at the beginning of Being-logic while Essence-logic culminates concepts bound up with modern forms of substance metaphysics as is found in Spinoza and Leibniz.

Book three "The Doctrine of Concept" effects a shift from the "Objective Logic" of books 1 and 2, to "Subjective Logic", and metaphysically represents a shift to modern subject-based ontologies such as are found after Kant. Just as Kantian philosophy is founded on conceptually generated objectivity, Concept-logic commences with the concept of concept itself! While in the two books of objective logic, the movement was between particular concepts, "being", "nothing", "becoming" etc., in the subjective logic, the conceptual relations are grasped at a meta-level, such that the concept "concept" treated in chapter one of section one ("Subjectivity") passes over into that of "judgment" in chapter two, as judgments are the larger wholes in which concepts themselves get related to each other. When Hegel's anti-foundationalism and holism of the Phenomenology is recalled, it will come as no surprise that the concept of judgment passes over into that of "syllogism": for Hegel just as a concept gains its determinacy in the context of judgments within which it is applied, so too do judgements gain their determinacy within larger patterns of inference.

With the discussion of syllogistic inference, the reader might think that Hegel has finally started to address logical issues, but after a discussion of various types of syllogism loosely modelled on Aristotle's approach, Hegel asserts that the syllogism has become concrete and "pregnant with content" and has necessary existence, and Section 1 of book 3 passes over into Section 2, dealing with "objectivity". Traditionalists will here see something akin to the "ontological argument" in that the existence of something seems to have been necessitated by its concept, in Hegel's version the objective existence of God being necessitated by his essential self-consciousness. But even here non-traditional readings might be put forward bound up with Hegel's rigorous anti-representationalism. Like recent "externalists" on mental content, Hegel, it might be argued, simply sees the contents of judgments and syllogisms as configurations of worldly things. In fact, Hegel had used the concept of "syllogism" to capture the structure of those recognitive interactions he was concerned with in the Phenomenology. In section 3 ("The Idea") of the third book of the Logic, we might see Hegel trying to grapple with the notion of rational objectivities, that is, conceptualising, judging and inferring human beings within those recognitive forms of community which constitute the conditions of such activities.

Philosophy of Right

Like the Science of Logic, the Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences is itself divided into three parts: the first, an abbreviated version of the Logic (the so-called "lesser Logic"); the second, Hegel's Philosophy of Nature; and the third, his Philosophy of Spirit. The same triadic pattern in the Philosophy of Spirit results in the philosophies of subjective spirit, objective spirit, and absolute spirit. The first of these constitutes Hegel's philosophy of mind, the last, his philosophy of art, religion, and philosophy itself. The philosophy of objective spirit concerns the objective patterns of social interaction and the cultural institutions within which "spirit" is objectified. The book entitled Elements of the Philosophy of Right which Hegel published as a textbook for his lectures at Berlin essentially corresponds to a more developed version of the section on "Objective Spirit" in the Philosophy of Spirit.

The Philosophy of Right (as it is more commonly called) can and has been read as a political philosophy which stands independently of the system, but it is clear that Hegel intended it to be read against the background of the developing conceptual determinations of the Logic. The text proper starts from the conception of a singular willing subject (grasped from its own first- person point of view) as the bearer of an "abstract right". While this conception of the individual willing subject with some kind of fundamental right is in fact the starting point of many modern political philosophies (such as that of Locke, for example) the fact that Hegel commences here does not testify to any ontological assumption that the consciously willing and right-bearing individual is the basic atom from which all society can be understood as constructed -- an idea at the heart of standard "social contract" theories. Rather, this is merely the most "immediate" starting point of Hegel's presentation and corresponds to analogous starting places of the "Logic". Just as the categories of the Logic develop in a way meant to demonstrate that what had at the start been conceived as simple is in fact only made determinate in virtue of its being part of some larger structure or process, here too it is meant to be shown that any simple willing and right-bearing subject only gains its determinacy in virtue of a place it finds for itself in a larger social structure or process. Thus even a contractual exchange (the minimal social interaction for contract theorists) will not to be thought simply as an occurence consequent upon the existence of two beings with natural wants and some natural calculative rationality; rather, the system of interaction within which individual exchanges take place (the economy) will be treated holistically as a culturally-shaped form of social life within which the actual wants of individuals as well as their reasoning powers are made determinate.

That here too the notion of recognition plays a crucial role in Hegel's general conception of the relation of individuals to each other and to society as a whole becomes apparent in his treatment of property and the exchange contract. A contractual exchange of commodities between two individuals itself amounts to each's recognition of the other as a proprietor of an inalienable value attaching to their (alienable) possessions. (By contrast, such proprietorship would be denied rather than recognised in fraud or theft.) Thus what differentiates property from mere possession is that it is grounded in a relation of reciprocal recognition between two willing subjects. Moreover, it is in this relation that we can see what it means for Hegel for individual subjects to share a "common will" -- an idea which will have important implications with respect to the difference of Hegel's conception of the state to that of Rousseau. Such an interactive constitution of the common will means that for Hegel such an identity of will is achieved because of not in spite of a co-existing difference between the particular wills of the subjects involved: while contracting individuals both "will" the same exchange, at a more concrete level, they do with different ends in mind. Each wants something different from the exchange.

Hegel passes from the abstract individualism of "Abstract Right" to the social determinacies of "Sittlichkeit" or "Ethical Life" via considerations first of "wrong" and its punishment, and then "morality". In his analysis of Sittlichkeit the type of sociality found in the market-based "civil society" is to be understood in contrastive opposition to the more immediate form found in the institution of the family -- a form of sociality mediated by a quasi- natural inter-subjective recognition rooted in sentiment and feeling: love. In the family the particularity of each individual tends to be absorbed into the social unit, giving this manifestation of Sittlichkeit a one-sidedness that is the inverse of that found in market relations in which participants grasp themselves in the first instance as separate individuals who enter into relationships that are external to them.

These two opposite but interlocking principles of social existence provide the basic structures in terms of which the component parts of modern state are articulated and understood. As both contribute particular characteristics to the subjects involved in them, part of the problem for the rational state will be to ensure that each of these two principles mediate the one-sideness of the other. Thus, individuals who encounter each other in the "external" relations of the market place and who have their subjectivity shaped by such relations also belong to families where they are subject to opposed influences. Moreover, even within the ensemble of production and exchange mechanisms of civil society individuals will belong to particular "estates" (the agricultural estate, that of trade and industry, and the "universal estate" of civil servants), whose internal forms of sociality will show family-like features.

Although the actual details of Hegel's "mapping" of the categorial structures of the Logic onto the Philosophy of Right are far from clear, the general motivation is apparent. If we regard the various "syllogisms" of Hegel's Subjective Logic as attempts to chart the skeletal structures of those different types of recognitive inter-subjectivity necessary to sustain various aspects of rational cognitive and conative functioning ("self-consciousness"), we might see his "logical" schematisation of the modern "rational" state as a way of displaying those sorts of institutions that a state must provide if it is to answer Rousseau's question of the form of association needed for the formation and expression of the "general will".

Concretely, for Hegel it is representation of the estates within the leglislative bodies that is to achieve this. As the estates of civil society group their members according to their common interests, and as the deputies elected from the estates to the legislative bodies give voice to those interests within the deliberative processes of legislation, we might see how the outcome of this process might be considerred to give expression to the general interest. But Hegel's "republicanism" is here cut short by his invocation of the familial principle: such representative bodies can only provide the content of the legislation to a constitutional monarch who must add to it the form of the royal decree -- an individual "I will ...". To declare that for Hegel the monarch plays only a "symbolic" role here is to miss the fundamentally idealist complexion of his political philosophy. The expression of the general will in legislation cannot be thought of as an outcome of some quasi- mechanical process: it must be "willed". If legislation is to express the general will, citizens must recognize it as expressing their will; and this means, recognising it as willed. The monarch's explicit "I will" is thus needed to close this recognitive circle, lest legislation look like a compromise resulting from a clash of interests and so as "willed" by nobody.

Perhaps one of the most influential parts of Hegel's Philosophy of Right concerns his analysis of the contradictions of the unfettered capitalist economy. On the one hand, Hegel agreed with Adam Smith that the interlinking of productive activities allowed by the modern market meant that "subjective selfishness" turned into a "contribution towards the satisfaction of the needs of everyone else". But this did not mean that he accepted Smith's idea that this "general plenty" produced thereby diffused (or "trickled down") though the rest of society. From within the type of consciousness generated within civil society, in which individuals are grasped as "bearers of rights" abstracted from the particular concrete relationships to which they belong, Smithean optimism may seem justified. But this simply attests to the one-sidedness of this type of abstract thought, and the need for it to be mediated by the type of consciousness based in the family in which individuals are grasped in terms of the way they belong to the social body. In fact, the unfettered operations of the market produces a class caught in a spiral of poverty. Starting from this analysis, Marx later used it as evidence of the need to abolish the individual proprietorial rights at the heart of Hegel's "civil society" and socialise the means of production. Hegel, however, did not draw this implication. Rather, the economy was to be contained by an over-arching institutional framework of the state, and its social effects offset by welfarist state intervention.


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First published: February 13, 1997
Content last modified: October 20, 1997