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Game Theory

Game theory is the mathematical theory of bargaining, the essentials of which were developed by John Von Neumann and Oskar Morgenstern in their book The Theory of Games and Economic Behavior (1947). Von Neumann and Morgenstern restricted their attention to zero-sum games, that is, to games in which no player can gain except at another's expense. However, this restriction was overcome by the work of John Nash during the 1950s. Contemporary game theorists search for so-called Nash equilibria, that is, sets of strategies used by the 1 to n players in a game such that, for each agent i, given the strategies of the other players, i has no incentive to change her strategy. Nash equilibria are stable, but not necessarily desirable; for example, in what is undoubtedly the best-known and most-discussed instance of a game, the Prisoner's Dilemma, the unique Nash equilibrium is a state in which both of the two players are as badly off, given their utility functions, as possible. The point of Game Theory, then, is not prescriptive but descriptive: analysis of a game permits us to locate the equilibria, and thus to predict those states of play which will be stable, barring exogenous interference. For stipulative purposes, it is usual to say that the intervention of such an exogenous force changes the game. Thus, if some social situation had the structure of a Prisoner's Dilemma, and the government passed a law prohibiting use by players of the strategies that lead to the sub-optimal (in the usual parlance, Pareto-dominated; see below for the intuitions behind this concept) outcomes, then we should not say that the society in question faced a Prisoner's Dilemma, but managed to find the Pareto-superior outcome; rather, we should say that the introduction of the government as a player changed the game, so that it was no longer an instance of the Prisoner's Dilemma.

Philosophical Motivation

Why are philosophers increasingly becoming interested in Game Theory? One answer is that it has provided us with a formal way of representing a type of logical difficulty which Plato noted in his discussion of justice in the Republic, but which received its first sustained treatment in Hobbes's Leviathan. Re-reading Hobbes through the lens of Game Theory, we can now reconstruct his argument for absolute monarchy as follows. If there are no external constraints on people's behavior, then achieving co-ordination is impossible unless everyone acts so as to maximize not their own welfare, but that of society as a whole. We may grant that there are such natural altruists, perhaps even many of them. However, if there are any narrowly self-interested agents about, then they will exploit the altruists' constraints, profiting from the unselfish behavior of the altruists while also profiting from their own absence of constraint. It would be psychologically un-natural, Hobbes argues, for the altruists to long put up with this. But their only way of responding is to abandon their own constraints. Thus, Hobbes concludes, moral dispositions are unstable enforcers of social cooperation: a mechanism of enforcement can only work if no one can escape from its bonds when it is convenient for them to do so. Hence Hobbes's conclusion that if people wish to live in social order, which appears to be a biological necessity, then they must entrust enforcement to a sovereign, who then operates with absolute power of enforcement.

Hobbes, of course, pushes his argument further, maintaining that sovreignty must be indivisble. He thus rejects democracy as a viable enforcement mechanism. We shall not concern ourselves with this further argument here, which appears partly to rest on a false dichotomy: when Hobbes speaks of democracy, he seems to have only the unregulated democracies of the ancient world before him as examples; the possibility that a constitution could bind government and governed alike appears (unsurprisingly) not to have occurred to him. But his central point continues to carry much force. Indeed, modern economics and game theory can help us to see that it has more force than Hobbes supposed. Hobbes's argument involves a questionable psychological premise to the effect that most people are narrowly self-interested. But this premise is unnecessarily strong. To see why, let us consider the notion of a utility function.

We begin with a preliminary concept, that of a preference-ordering. Following Paul Samuelson, we will regard preference-orderings as revealed by behavior. That is to say, imagine that each agent were presented with a set of possible states of the world, or bundles, and the opportunity to trade bundles with other agents. The agent would reveal her preferences among bundles by swapping some for others. Eventually, as evidence accumulates, we can construct, for each agent, an ordered list, placing her most preferred bundle at the top, and proceeding downwards to her least-preferred bundle. Note that she will likely be indifferent in her preferences amongst many bundles; these will be ranked together as indifference sets. Then the construction of an ordinal utility function is straightforward: we simply number her indifference-sets, from top to bottom, with real numbers 1 to n. We call this function ordinal because no properties of the numbers matter except their order; thus, an ordinal utility function does not capture relative intensities amongst preferences. However, we can cardinalize these functions, so that intensities are represented, by means of the following trick. Present the agent with choices of gambles over lotteries amongst the elements in her preference ordering, where each gamble must be purchased in a uniform currency (say, money). Then we may examine the ratios between the probabilities associated with her maximizing the acquisition of bundles high on her ordinal utility function and the amounts she is willing to pay for each gamble, and derive her cardinal utility function from these ratios.

Now let us return to the Hobbesian dilemma. Game Theory permits us to show, mathematically, that that dilemma can arise even in a population consisting entirely of altruists. Suppose that everyone's most-preferred bundle was one in which all of the world's surplus food went to the starving children of some impoverished country; that all favoured a different country's children; and that all preferred that some country should have its children fed rather than none. These agents are surely altruistic, in any normal sense of the word. But, having conflicting utility functions, they must bargain with one another. Suppose that all know that their own contribution alone would make no significant difference, and that all attach some value to consuming their own food. Then the Hobbesian nightmare is possible among these saintly agents, and Game Theory can prove it. As Nash showed in his series of papers (without specific reference to this scenario I invented) there exists an assignment of possible utility functions to these agents, consistent with the story as told, such that the only equilibrium strategy for each agent would be to threaten to withhold their own food unless others contributed to their preferred country. In that case, we would have an instance of a Hobbesian social dilemma: the only equilibrium in the game would be one in which all of the children starve, despite the fact that all of the agents prefer an outcome in which at least some children are saved (in the technical parlance, the unique Nash-equilibrium would be Pareto-dominated by another state of affairs).

The fascination of Game Theory emerges from the fact that it shows us how we cannot simply derive conclusions about outcomes in competitive settings from psychological facts about the competitors. The intuitive reason for this is straightforward. Our imagined agents are neither selfish nor irrational. But the choice of strategy for each agent is constrained by both scarcity - the basic insight on which all economics rests - and by the utility functions of the other agents with whom they are competing. The complete set of utility functions, along with specifications about the extent to which the agents are privy to one another's utility functions, determines the equilbrium strategies available to them. Our altruists in the scenario imagined above are trapped by the logic of the game in which they find themselves; only an external force - say, a UN decree that food shall go either and only to Mexico or to India - could get them out of their social dilemma, by changing the game in which they find themselves.

Defining a Game

Having provided motivation for a description of the basic point of Game Theory, we will now set out to define a game. We will begin by informally defining the elements of the formal definition, and then provide the formal definition itself.

First, then, the informal definition. Consider an initial allocation of resources distributed among a finite set of Dennettian agents. A Dennettian agent is a unit that acts, where an act is any move that potentially influences future allocations. The qualifier Denettian here is in acknowledgement of Daniel Dennett's careful separation, over a large body of work, of the concept of agency, on the one hand, and the concepts of deliberation and consciousness, on the other. (See the article by Don Ross, mentioned in the Bibliography below, which explains this fully.) A Dennettian agent, then, is an actor that is not necessarily presumed to be either deliberative or conscious. (This is important in order to respect the full range of applications of Game Theory; see below.) Now, then: a game is a set of acts by 1 to n rational Dennettian agents (with what is meant by rational to be specified below), and, possibly, an arational Dennettian agent (a random mechanism) called nature, where at least one Dennettian agent (henceforth, a DA) has control over the outcome of the set of acts, and where the DAs are potentially in conflict, in the sense that one DA could rank outcomes differently from the others. A strategy for a particular DA i is a vector that specifies the acts that i will take in response to all possible acts by other agents. A DA i is rational iff, for given strategies of other agents, the set of acts specified by i's strategy is such that it secures the available consequence which is most highly ranked by i. Nature is a generator of pobabilistic influences on outcomes; technically it is the unique DA in a game that is not rational. An outcome is an allocation of resources which results from the acts of the DAs. A DA i has control if a change in i's acts is sufficient to change the outcome for at least one vector of strategies for the other DAs. A consequence for i is the value for i of a function that maps outcomes onto the real numbers, interpreted as representing either an ordinal or a cardinal utility function for i.

Games may be represented either in extensive form, that is, using a "tree" structure of the sort that is familiar to decision theorists, where each player's strategy is a path through the tree, or in strategic form. The significance of this distinstion will be discussed below. A game in strategic form is a list:

G = {N, S, PO(s)}

Given that game outcomes are determined by the agents' acts, and given that these acts are specified by their strategies, it follows that specification of a function f(·) together with strategies implies the existence of the vector of payoff functions PO(s). The payoff functions provide, for each vector of strategies in S, a vector of n real numbers in Realn representing the consequences for all players.

Statics and Dynamics

The above definition leaves entirely open the dynamics of the game. That is, it abstracts from questions which are often of fundamental importance in applying Game Theory to actual situations. The most significant aspect of dynamics is information exchange: How much do particular players know about the strategies of other players? To incorporate imperfect information into a game, one must represent it in extensive form. An extensive-form game looks precisely like the familiar trees of decision theorists: branching structures through sets of nodes which converge to an upper apex, represetning the outcome. However, the interpretation of the tree is quite different from that applied to a decision tree. Nodes do not represent decision points, at which players estimate probabilities and then choose options; rather, they represent acts, as defined above. One has not fully specified a game in extensive form until one has completely identified each player's path through the tree, and indicating which at which nodes subsets of players share information. Ken Binmore's Fun and Games is an excellent manual on constructing extensive-form games; see Bibliography below. Following Binmore's technique, one isolates information-sets by drawing oblong boxes around the nodes where information is common. Again, note that such incorporation does not turn games into decision-trees, in the sense that agents' options at each node are open. One has not specified a game until one has specified the set of strategies; and since to specify an agent's strategy determines her path through the tree, the game itself remains a static object. The chief difference, then, between strategic-form and extensive-form representations of games is that in the latter cases, but not the former, retrospective dynamics are indicated. From an extensive-form representation of a game, a unique strategic-form representation follows, but a given strategic-form representation could have been generated from any one of several possible extensive forms. Whereas there is no controversy as to when different strategic forms represent tokens of the same game, the identity conditions on games in extensive form are not so clear. This is a philosophical and mathematical problem on which the present author is currently working; suggestions from interested readers would be most welcome!


Game theory has, of course, been extensively used in microeconomic analysis, where its record of accurate predictions has been impressive in areas such as industrial organization theory, the theory of the firm, and auction theory. In macroeconomics and political science its use has been more controversial, since in such applications it is often difficult to establish that the specified game is in fact an accurate representation of the empirical phenomenon being modelled. For example, it has been commonplace to suggest that the nuclear standoff between the United States and the Soviet Union during the Cold War was a case of the Prisoner's Dilemma. However, it is far from obvious that the leaderships in either country in fact attached the necessary payoffs in their utility functions - preferring the destruction of the world to their own unique destruction - that would have been required for their situation to have been an actual PD. (Indeed, since according to revealed preference theory utility functions are inferred from actual choice behaviour, the fact that we are still here is convincing evidence that this analysis was mistaken.) Game Theory has also been fruitfully applied in evolutionary biology, where species and/or genes are treated as players. (This is a particular instance of the general fact that agents in games are not necessarily assumed to be deliberators; this is another respect in which game theory differs from decision theory.) Evolutionary game-theorists search for evolutionary stable strategies (SSR's), that is, of behavioral and morphological dispositions among competing organisms that may facilitate predictions of the distribution of such dispositions in a given environment. The concept of an SSR is conceptually similar to that of a Nash equilibrium, but not mathematically identical; an important area of contemporary work involves trying to establish this relationship with greater precision. For a compendium of what has been achieved in this area, see J. Weibull (1995). Ideally, philosophers and scientists in many disciplines could profit from development of a truly general theory of informational dynamics that incorporated the aspect of competition treated by game theory. Philosophers are most likely to have encountered game-theoretic analysis as a result of its use by some moral philosophers, particularly David Gauthier (see the discussion of literature below), to attempt to show that morally constrained agents are more likely to escape Pareto-dominated outcomes in competitive games than are agents constrained only by rationality (in the strict economic sense of `rationality'). Relatively few philosophers, however, appear to be persuaded that this claim is true. Of course, players may try to avoid Pareto-dominated outcomes by constraining their available strategies through resort to a Hobbesian enforcement mechanism. The point of such a mechanism, however, is to allow groups of players to avoid Pareto-dominated outcomes despite their amorality, rather than because of it.


A reader looking for a tour of the most exciting conceptual issues and applications in Game Theory, which is not mathematically demanding, could not do better than Skyrms (1996), which is much more wide-ranging in the issues it covers than its title suggests. Binmore (1992) is an accessible, though slightly idiosyncratic, introduction to game theory. Fudenberg and Tirole (1991) is a very thorough mathematical text. For recent developments in fundamental theory, see Binmore, Kirman and Tani (1993). Ross (1994) explains the concept of a Dennettian agent, as used above. Evolutionary game theory owes its genesis to Maynard Smith (1982). Gauthier's application of game theory to moral philosophy occurs in Gauthier (1986), and is extended in Danielson (1992). For critical discussions of this enterprise, see Vallentyne (1991) and Danielson (forthcoming 1997). Many philosophers will also be interested in Binmore (1994), which attempts to show that application of game-theoretic analysis can underwrite a loosely Rawlsian theory of justice that does not require recourse to Kantian presuppositions about what rational agents would desire behind a veil of ignorance concerning their identities and social roles.

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Related Entries

prisoner's dilemma | rationality

Copyright © 1997 by
Don Ross
University of Cape Town

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First published: January 25, 1997
Content last modified: September 15, 1997