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The Predicate Calculus. In an attempt to realize Leibniz's ideas for a language of thought and a rational calculus, Frege developed a formal notation for regimenting thought and reasoning (see his Begriffsschrift ). Though we no longer use his notation, Frege's in effect developed the first predicate calculus. A predicate calculus is a formal system with two components: a formal language and a logic. The formal language Frege designed was capable of: (a) expressing predicational statements of the form `x falls under the concept F' and `x bears relation R to y', etc., (b) expressing complex statements such as `it is not the case that ...' and `if ... then ...', and (c) expressing `quantified' statements of the form `Some x is such that ...x...' and `Every x is such that ...x...'. The logic of Frege's calculus was a set of rules that govern when some statements of the language may be correctly inferred from others.
Frege's system was powerful enough to resolve the essential logic of mathematical reasoning. That was partly due to the fact that his predicate calculus was a `second-order' predicate calculus, allowing statements of the form `Some concept F is such that ...F...' and `Every concept F is such that ...F...'. However, the most important insight underlying Frege's calculus was his `function-argument' analysis of sentences. This freed him from the limitations of the `subject-predicate' analysis of sentences that formed the basis of Aristotelian logic and it made it possible for him him to develop a general treatment of quantification.
The Analysis of Atomic Sentences and Quantifier Phrases. In traditional Aristotelian logic, the subject of a sentence and the direct object of a verb are not on a logical par. The rules governing the inferences between statements with different but related subject terms are different from the rules governing the inferences between statements with different but related verb complements. For example, in Aristotelian logic, the rule which permits the valid inference from `John loves Mary' to `Something loves Mary' is different from the rule which permits the valid inference from `John loves Mary' to `John loves something'. The rule governing the first inference is a rule which applies only to the subject terms `John' and `Something'. The rule governing the second inference applies only to the transitive verb complements `Mary' and `something'. In Aristotelian logic, these inferences have nothing in common.
In Frege's logic, a single rule governs both the inference from `John loves Mary' to `Something loves Mary' and the inference from `John loves Mary' to `John loves something'. This was made possible by Frege's analysis of atomic and quantified sentences. Frege took intransitive verb phrases such as `is happy' to be functions of one variable (`x is happy'), and resolved the sentence "John is happy" in terms of the application of the function denoted by `is happy' to the argument denoted by `John'. In addition, Frege took the verb phrase `loves' to be a function of two variables (`x loves y') and resolved the sentence `John loves Mary' as the application of the function denoted by `x loves y' to the objects denoted by `John' and `Mary' respectively. In effect, Frege saw no distinction between the subject `John' and the direct object `Mary'. What is logically important is that `loves' denotes a function of 2 arguments, that `gives' denotes a function of 3 arguments (x gives y to z), that `bought' denotes a function of 4 arguments (x bought y from z for amount u), etc.
This analysis allowed Frege to develop a more systematic treatment of quantification than that offered by Aristotelian logic. No matter whether the quantified expression `something' appears within a subject ("Something loves Mary") or within a predicate ("John loves something"), it is to be resolved in the same way. In effect, Frege treated quantified expressions as variable-binding operators. The variable-binding operator `some x is such that' can bind the variable `x' in the expression `x loves Mary' as well as the variable `x' in the expression `John loves x'. Thus, Frege analyzed the above inferences in the following general way:
Proof. As part of his predicate calculus, Frege developed a strict definition of a `proof'. In essence, he defined a proof to be any finite sequence of well-formed statements such that each statement in the sequence either is an axiom or follows from previous members by a valid rule of inference. A proof of the statement B from the premises A1,...,An is any finite sequence of statements (with B the final statement in the sequence) such that each member of the sequence: (a) is one of the premises A1,...,An, or (b) is an axiom, or (c) follows from previous members of the sequence by a rule of inference. This is essentially the definition of a proof that logicians still use today.
A Foundation for Mathematics. Frege attempted to construct a foundation for mathematics. His most comprehensive logical system was developed in his landmark work Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, in which he attempted to validate the philosophical doctrine known as logicism, i.e., the idea that mathematical concepts can be defined in terms of purely logical concepts and that mathematical axioms can be derived from the laws of logic alone. Unfortunately, Frege employed a principle in the Grundgesetze (Basic Law V) which turned out to be subject to Russell's Paradox. This paradox caused him to question the truth of logicism, and few philosophers today believe that mathematics can be reduced to logic. Mathematics seems to require some non-logical notions (such set membership) and some non-logical axioms (such as the non-logical axioms of set theory). Despite the fact that a contradiction invalidated a part of his system, the intricate theoretical web of definitions and proofs developed in the Grundgesetze produced a conceptual framework for mathematical logic that was nothing short of revolutionary. There is no doubt that the logical system and maze of definitions developed by Bertrand Russell and Alfred North Whitehead in Principia Mathematica owe a huge debt to the work found in Frege's Grundgesetze.
Definition. Frege was extremely careful about the proper description and definition of logical and mathematical concepts. He developed powerful and insightful criticisms of mathematical work which did not meet his standards for clarity. For example, he criticized mathematicians who defined a variable to be a number that varies rather than an expression of language which can vary as to which determinate number it refers to. And he criticized those mathematicians who developed `piecemeal' definitions or `creative' definitions. In the Grundgesetze (Band II, Sections 56-67) Frege criticized the practice of defining a concept on a given range of objects and later redefining the concept on a wider, more inclusive range of concepts. Frequently, this `piecemeal' style of definition led to conflict, since the redefined concept did not always reduce to the original concept when one restricts the range to the original class of objects. In that same work (Band II, Sections 139-147), Frege criticised the mathematical practise of introducing notation to name (unique) entities without first proving that there exist (unique) such entities. He pointed out that such `creative definitions' were simply unjustified.
The Natural Numbers. In his seminal work Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, Frege successfully defined the notion of a `cardinal number' in terms of the primitive notion of an extension or set. The insight behind the definition is that a statement of cardinal number such as `There are n F-things' predicates a higher-order concept of the concept F, namely, that it is a concept under which n things fall. Frege simply defines the (cardinal) number of the concept F (i.e., the number of Fs) as the extension of the concept being a concept equinumerous to F. On this definition, the number of planets is identified as the extension of the concept being a concept equinumerous to the concept of being a planet. In other words, the number of planets is an extension (or set) which contains all those concepts which, like the concept being a planet, are exemplified by nine objects.
Frege defined the concept of natural number by defining, for every relation xRy, the general concept `x is an ancestor of y in the R-series' (this new relation is called `the ancestral of the relation R'). The ancestral of a relation R was first defined in Frege's Begriffsschrift. The intuitive idea is easily grasped if we consider the relation x is the father of y. Suppose that a is the father of b, that b is the father of c, and that c is the father of d. Then Frege's definition of `x is an ancestor of y in the fatherhood-series' ensured that a is an ancestor of b, c, and d, that b is an ancestor of c and d, and that c is an ancestor of d.
More generally, if given a series of facts of the form aRb, bRc, cRd, and so on, Frege showed how to define the relation x is an ancestor of y in the R-series (this is the ancestral of the relation R). To exploit this definition in the case of natural numbers, Frege had to define both the relation x precedes y and the ancestral of this relation, namely, x is an ancestor of y in the predecessor-series. He first defined the relational concept x precedes y as follows:
x precedes y iff there is a concept F and an object z such that:In the notation of the second-order predicate calculus, Frege's definition becomes:
- z falls under F,
- y is the (cardinal) number of the concept F, and
- x is the (cardinal) number of the concept object other than z falling under F
To see the intuitive idea behind this definition, consider how the definition is satisfied in the case of the number 1 preceding the number 2: there is a concept F (e.g., let F = the concept being an author of Principia Mathematica) and an object z (e.g. let z = Alfred North Whitehead) such that:
Given this definition of precedes, Frege then defined the ancestral of this relation, namely, x is an ancestor of y in the predecessor-series. So, for example, if 10 precedes 11 and 11 precedes 12, it follows that 10 is an ancestor of 12 in the predecessor-series. Note, however, that although 10 is an ancestor of 12, 10 does not precede 12, for the notion of precedes is that of strictly precedes. Note also that by defining the ancestral of the precedence relation, Frege had in effect defined x < y.
Frege then defined the number 0 as the (cardinal) number of the concept being an object not identical with itself. The idea here is that nothing fails to be self-identical, so nothing falls under this concept. The number 0 is therefore identified with the extension of all concepts which fail to be exemplified.
Finally, Frege defined:
x is a natural number iff either x = 0 or 0 is an ancestor of x in the predecessor seriesIn other words, a natural number is any member of the predecessor series beginning with 0.
Using this definition, Frege derived many important theorems of number theory. It was recently shown by R. Heck  that, despite the logical inconsistency in the system of his Grundgesetze, Frege validly derived the Dedekind/Peano Axioms for number theory from a powerful and consistent principle now known as Hume's Principle ("The number of Fs is equal to the number of Gs if and only if there is a one-to-one correspondence between the Fs and the Gs"). Although Frege used his inconsistent axiom Basic Law V to establish Hume's Principle, once Hume's Principle was established, Frege validly derived the Dedekind/Peano axioms without making any further essential appeals to Basic Law V. Following the lead of George Boolos, philosophers today call derivation of the Dedekind/Peano Axioms from Hume's Principle `Frege's Theorem'. The proof of Frege's Theorem was a tour de force which involved some of the most beautiful, subtle, and complex logical reasoning that had ever been devised. For a comprehensive introduction to the logic of Frege's Theorem, see the entry Frege's logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic.
Frege's Ontology. In Frege's ontology, functions and objects were rigorously distinguished as two fundamentally different kinds of entity. Functions are the kind of thing that take objects as arguments and map those arguments to a value. Frege did not limit examples of functions to mathematical functions such as x + 3. He allowed the variable x to range over any object, and so father of x is a genuine example of a function---it maps certain biological offspring to their fathers and maps everything else to The False. Frege associates with every function, a course-of-values. The course-of-values of a function explicitly indicates the value of the function for each object that is supplied as an argument. In addition, Frege believed that there are two distinguished objects, namely, the truth value The True and the truth-value The False. Those functions which map objects to truth values are called concepts. For example, not only is the mathematical function x + 3 = 5 a concept (this concept maps the number 2 to The True and everything else to The False), but so is the function x is happy (which maps anything that is happy to The True and everything else to The False). Frege defines the extension of a concept to contain just those objects which the concept maps to The True (as indicated by the course-of-values associated with the concept).
Frege suggested that existence is not a property of objects but rather of concepts: it is the property a concept has just in case it has an non-empty extension (i.e., just in case it maps some object to The True). So the fact that the extension of the concept martian is empty underlies the ordinary claim "Martians don't exist." Frege therefore took existence to be a `second-level' concept.
Frege's Puzzle About Identity Statements. Here are some examples of identity statements:
117 + 136 = 253.Frege believed that these statements all have the form "a = b ", where `a ' and `b ' are either names or descriptions that denote individuals. He naturally assumed that a sentence of the form "a = b " is true if and only if the object denoted by `a ' is the same as the object denoted by `b '. For example, "117 + 136 = 253" is true if and only if `117 + 236' and `253' denote the same number. And "Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens" is true if and only if `Mark Twain' and `Samuel Clemens' denote the same person. So the truth of "a = b " requires that the expressions flanking the identity sign denote the same object.
The morning star is identical to the evening star.
Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens.
Bill is Debbie's father.
But Frege noticed that on this account of truth, the truth conditions for "a = b " are no different from the truth conditions for "a = a ". For example, the truth conditions for "Mark Twain = Mark Twain" are the same as those for "Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens"; not only do the names flanking the identity sign denote the same object in each case, but the object is the same between the two cases. The problem is that the cognitive significance (or meaning) of the two sentences differ. We can learn that "Mark Twain = Mark Twain" is true simply by inspecting it; but we can't learn the truth of "Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens" simply by inspecting it. Similarly, whereas you can learn that "117 + 136 = 117 + 136" and "the morning star is identical to the morning star" are true simply by inspection, you can't learn the truth of "117 + 136 = 253" and "the morning star is identical to the evening star" simply by inspection. In the latter cases, you have to do some arithmetical work or astronomical investigation to learn the truth of these identity claims.
So the puzzle Frege discovered is: if we cannot appeal to a difference in denotation of the terms flanking the identity sign, how do we explain the difference in cognitive significance between "a = b " and "a = a "?
Frege's Puzzle About Propositional Attitude Reports. Frege is generally credited with identifying the following puzzle about propositional attitude reports, even though he didn't quite describe the puzzle in the terms used below. A propositional attitude is a psychological relation between a person and a proposition. Belief, desire, intention, discovery, knowledge, etc., are all psychological relationships between persons, on the one hand, and propositions, on the other. When we report the propositional attitudes of others, these reports all have a similar logical form:
x believes that pIf we replace the variable `x ' by the name of a person and replace the variable `p ' with a sentence that describes the propositional object of their attitude, we get specific attitude reports. So by replacing `x ' by `John' and `p ' by "Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn " in the first example, the result would be the following specific belief report:
x desires that p
x intends that p
x discovered that p
x knows that p
John believes that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn.
To see the problem posed by the analysis of propositional attitude reports, consider what appears to be a simple principle of reasoning, namely, the Principle of Substitution. If a name, say n, appears in a true sentence S, and the identity sentence n=m is true, then the Principle of Substitution tells us that the substitution of the name m for the name n in S does not affect the truth of S. For example, let S be the true sentence "Mark Twain was an author", let n be the name `Mark Twain', and let m be the name `Samuel Clemens'. Then since the identity sentence "Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens" is true, we can substitute `Samuel Clemens' for `Mark Twain' without affecting the truth of the sentence. And indeed, the resulting sentence "Samuel Clemens was an author" is true. In other words, the following argument is valid:
Mark Twain was an author.Similarly, the following argument is valid.
Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens.
Therefore, Samuel Clemens was an author.
4 > 3In general, then, the Principle of Substitution seems to take the following form, where S is a sentence, n and m are names, and S(n ) differs from S(m ) only by the fact that at least one occurrence of m replaces n:
4 = 8/2
Therefore, 8/2 > 3
S(n )This principle seems to capture the idea that if we say something true about an object, then even if we change the name by which we refer to that object, we should still be saying something true about that object.
n = m
Therefore, S(m )
But Frege, in effect, noticed following counterexample to the Principle of Substitution. Consider the following argument:
John believes that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn .This argument is not valid. There are circumstances in which the premises are true and the conclusion false. We have already described such circumstances, namely, one in which John learns the name `Mark Twain' by reading Huckleberry Finn but learns the name `Samuel Clemens' in the context of learning about 19th century American authors (without learning that the name `Mark Twain' was a pseudonym for Samuel Clemens). John may not believe that Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn. The premises of the above argument, therefore, do not logically entail the conclusion. So the Principle of Substitution appears to break down in the context of propositional attitude reports. The puzzle, then, is to say what causes the principle to fail in these contexts. Why aren't we still saying something true about the man in question if all we have done is changed the name by which we refer to him?
Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens.
Therefore, John believes that Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn .
Frege's Theory of Sense and Denotation. To explain these puzzles, Frege suggested that in addition to having a denotation, names and descriptions also express a sense. The sense of a expression accounts for its cognitive significance---it is the way by which one conceives of the denotation of the term. The expressions `4' and `8/2' have the same denotation but express different senses, different ways of conceiving the same number. The descriptions `the morning star' and `the evening star' denote the same planet, namely Venus, but express different ways of conceiving of Venus and so have different senses. The name `Pegasus' and the description `the most powerful Greek god' both have a sense (and their senses are distinct), but neither has a denotation. However, even though the names `Mark Twain' and `Samuel Clemens' denote the same individual, they express different senses. Using the distinction between sense and denotation, Frege can account for the difference in cognitive significance between identity statements of the form "a = a" and "a = b". The sense of the whole statement, on Frege's view, is a function of the senses of its component parts. Since the sense of `a' differs from the sense of `b', the components of "a = a" and "a = b" are different and so the sense of the whole expression will be different in the two cases. Since the sense of an expression accounts for its cognitive significance, Frege has an explanation of the difference in cognitive significance between "a = a" and "a = b", and thus a solution to the first puzzle.
Moreover, Frege proposed that when a term (name or description) follows a propositional attitude verb, it no longer denotes what it ordinarily denotes. Instead, Frege claims that in such contexts, a term denotes its ordinary sense. This explains why the Principle of Substitution fails for terms following the propositional attitude verbs in propositional attitude reports. The Principle asserts that truth is preserved when we substitute one name for another having the same denotation. But, according to Frege's theory, the names `Mark Twain' and `Samuel Clemens' denote different senses when they occur in the following sentences:
John believes that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn.If they don't denote the same object, then there is no reason to think that substitution of one name for another would preserve truth.
John believes that Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn.
Frege developed the theory of sense and denotation into a thoroughgoing philosophy of language. This philosophy can be explained, at least in outline, by considering a simple sentence such as "John loves Mary". In Frege's view, each word in this sentence is a name and, moreover, the sentence as a whole is a complex name. Each of these names has both a sense and a denotation. Then sense and denotation of the words are basic; but sense and denotation of the sentence as a whole can be described in terms of the sense and denotation of the words and the way in which those words are arranged in the sentence. Let us refer to the denotation and sense of the words as follows:
d[j] refers to the denotation of the name `John'.We now work toward a theoretical description of the denotation of the sentence as a whole. On Frege's view, d[j] and d[m] are the real individuals John and Mary, respectively. d[L] is a function that maps d[m] (i.e., Mary) to a function which serves as the denotation of the predicate `loves Mary'. Let us refer to that function as d[Lm]. Now the function d[Lm] maps d[j] (i.e., John) to the denotation of the sentence "John loves Mary". Let us refer to the denotation of the sentence as d[jLm]. Frege identifies the denotation of a sentence as one of the two truth values. Because d[Lm] maps objects to truth values, it is a concept. Thus, d[jLm] is the truth value The True if the extension of the concept d[Lm] contains John; otherwise it is the truth value The False. So, on Frege's view, the sentence "John loves Mary" names a truth value.
d[m] refers to the denotation of the name `Mary'.
d[L] refers to the denotation of the name `loves'.
s[j] refers to the sense of the name `John'.
s[m] refers to the sense of the name `Mary'.
s[L] refers to the sense of the name `loves'.
The sentence "John loves Mary" also expresses a sense. Its sense may be described as follows. First, s[L] (the sense of the name "loves") is identified as a function. This function maps s[m] (the sense of the name "Mary") to the sense of the predicate `loves Mary'. Let us refer to the sense of `loves Mary' as s[Lm]. Now the function s[Lm] maps s[j] (the sense of the name `John') to the sense of the whole sentence. Let us call the sense of the entire sentence s[jLm]. Frege calls the sense of a sentence a thought, and whereas there are only two truth values, he supposes that there are an infinite number of thoughts.
On Frege's view, therefore, the sentences "4 = 8/2" and "4 = 4" both name the same truth value, but they express different thoughts. That is because s is different from s[8/2]. Similarly, "Mark Twain = Mark Twain" and "Mark Twain = Samuel Clemens" denote the same truth value, but express different thoughts (since the sense of the names differ). Thus, Frege has a general account of the difference in the cognitive significance between identity statements of the form "a = a" and "a = b". Furthermore, recall that Frege proposed that terms following propositional attitude verbs denote not their ordinary denotations but rather the senses they ordinarily express. In fact, in the following propositional attitude report, not only do the words `Mark Twain', `wrote' and `Huckleberry Finn ' denote their ordinary senses, but the entire sentence "Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn" also denotes its ordinary sense (namely, a thought):
John believes that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn.Frege, therefore, would analyze this attitude report as follows: "believes that" denotes a function that maps the denotation of the sentence "Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn" to a concept. In this case, however, the denotation of the sentence "Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn" is not a truth value but rather a thought. The thought it denotes is different from the thought denoted by "Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn" in the following propositional attitude report:
John believes that Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn.Since the thought denoted by "Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn" in this context differs from the thought denoted by "Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn" in the same context, the concept denoted by `believes that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn' is a different concept from the one denoted by `believes that Samuel Clemens wrote Huckleberry Finn'. One may consistently suppose that the concept denoted by the former predicate maps John to The True whereas the the concept denoted by the latter predicate does not. Frege's analysis therefore preserves our intuition that John can believe that Mark Twain wrote Huckleberry Finn without believing that Samuel Clemens did. It also preserves the Principle of Substitution---the fact that one cannot substitute "Samuel Clemens" for "Mark Twain" when these names occur after propositional attitude verbs does not constitute evidence against the Principle. For if Frege is right, names do not have their usual denotation when they occur in these contexts.
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First published: September 14, 1995
Content last modified: March 6, 1998