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Feyerabend attended a Realgymnasium (High School) at which he was taught Latin, English, and science. He was a Vorzugsschüler, that is, `a student whose grades exceeded a certain average' (p.22), and by the time he was sixteen he had the reputation of knowing more about physics and math than his teachers. But he also got thrown out of school on one occasion.
Feyerabend `stumbled into drama' (p.26) by accident, becoming something of a ham actor in the process. This accident then led to another, when he found himself forced to accept philosophy texts among the bundles of books he had bought for the plays and novels they contained. It was, he later claimed, "the dramatic possibilities of reasoning and... the power that arguments seem to exert over people" (p.27) with which philosophy fascinated him. Although his reputation was as a philosopher, he preferred to be thought of as an entertainer. His interests, he said, were always somewhat unfocussed (p.27).
However, Feyerabend's school physics teacher Oswald Thomas inspired in him an interest in physics and astronomy. The first lecture he gave (at school) seems to have been on these subjects (p.28). Together with his father, he built a telescope and `became a regular observer for the Swiss Institute of Solar Research' (p.29). He describes his scientific interests as follows:
I was interested in both the technical and the more general aspects of physics and astronomy, but I drew no distinction between them. For me, Eddington, Mach (his Mechanics and Theory of Heat), and Hugo Dingler (Foundations of Geometry) were scientists who moved freely from one end of their subject to the other. I readFeyerabend does not tell us how he became acquainted with another one of his main preoccupations - singing. He was proud of his voice, becoming a member of a choir, and took singing lessons for years, later claiming to have remained in California in order not to have to give up his singing teacher. In his autobiography he talks of the pleasure, greater than any intellectual pleasure, derived from having and using a well-trained singing voice (p.83). During his time in Vienna in the second world war, his interest led him to attend the opera (first the Volksoper, and then the Staatsoper) together with his mother. A former opera singer, Johann Langer, gave him singing lessons and encouraged him to go to an academy. After passing the entrance examination, Feyerabend did so, becoming a pupil of Adolf Vogel. At this point in his life, he later recalled:
Machvery carefully and made many notes. (p.30).
The course of my life was... clear: theoretical astronomy during the day, preferably in the domain of perturbation theory; then rehearsals, coaching, vocal exercises, opera in the evening...; and astronomical observation at night... The only remaining obstacle was the war. (p.35).
Much of what happened I learned only after the war, from articles, books, and television, and the events I did notice either made no impression at all or affected me in a random way. I remember them and I can describe them, but there was no context to give them meaning and no aim to judge them by. (pp.37-8).
For me the German occupation and the war that followed were an inconvenience, not a moral problem, and my reactions came from accidental moods and circumstances, not from a well-defined outlook. (p.38).The general impression given by his autobiography is of an imaginative but fairly solitary person with no stable or well-defined personality. Rather, his decisions and courses of action seem to have been the result of a struggle between his tendency to conform and his contrariness. Just as when he was a child, events happening around him seemed strange, distant, and out of context. It is very difficult to see him identifying with any group, and he must have made an unlikely soldier.
Their training took place in Krems, near Vienna. Feyerabend soon volunteered for officers' school, not because of an urge for leadership, but out of a wish to survive, his intention being to use officers' school as a way to avoid front-line fighting. The trainees were sent to Yugoslavia. In Vukovar, during July 1943, he learnt of his mother's suicide, but was absolutely unmoved, and obviously shocked his fellow officers by displaying no feeling. In December that same year, Feyerabend's unit was sent into battle on the northern part of the Russian front, but although they blew up buildings, they never encountered any Russian soldiers.
Despite the fact that Feyerabend reports of himself that he was
foolhardy during battle, treating it as a theatrical event, he
received the Iron Cross (second class) early in March 1944, for
leading his men into a village under enemy fire, and occupying it. He
was advanced from private soldier to lance corporal, to sergeant, and
then, at the end of 1944, to lieutenant. At the end of November that
year, he gave a series of lectures to the officers' school at Dessau
Rosslau, near Leipzig. Their theme was the
(`historicist') one that "historical periods such
as the Baroque, the Rococo, the Gothic Age are unified by a concealed
essence that only a lonely outsider can understand" (p.49). His
description of these lectures, and of his notebook entries at the
time, reveals the influence of
Having returned home for Christmas 1944, Feyerabend again boarded the train for the front, this time for Poland, in January 1945. There he was put in charge of a bicycle company. Although he claims to have relished the role of army officer no more than he later did that of university professor, he must have been at least a competent soldier, since in the field he came to take the place of a sequence of injured officers: first a lieutenant, then a captain, and then a major, before he was shot during another heroic act of carelessness performed in the 1945 retreat westwards from the Russian army. The bullet lodged in his spine left him temporarily paralysed from the waist down, meaning that he spent time in a wheelchair, then on crutches, and thereafter walked with the aid of a stick. The war ended as he was recovering from his injury, in a hospital in Apolda, a little town near Weimar, while fervently hoping not to recover before the war was over. Germany's surrender came as a relief, but also as a disappointment relative to past hopes and aspirations. He later said of his stint in the army that it was "an interruption, a nuisance; I forgot about it the moment it was over" (p.111).
At the end of the war, Feyerabend went to the mayor of Apolda and asked for a job. He was assigned to the education section, given an office and a secretary and, fittingly, put in charge of entertainment.
In 1946, having recovered from paralysis, he received a state fellowship to return to study singing and stage-management for a year at the Musikhochschule in Weimar. He moved from Apolda to Weimar after about three months. At the Weimar Institut zur Methodologischen Erneuerung des Deutschen Theaters he studied theatre, and at the Weimar academy he took classes in Italian, harmony, piano, singing and enunciation. Singing remained one of his life's major interests. He attended performances (drama, opera, ballet, concerts) at Weimar's Nationaltheater, and later reminisced about opera stars of the time, recalling debates and arguments about theatre (e.g. the stereotyping of roles and plays) with Maxim Vallentin, Hans Eisler, etc. He also played a small part in one of the films of G.W.Pabst, a notable German film-director. Although, by his own account, he led a full life, he became restless and decided to move.
In August 1948, at the first meeting of the international summer
seminar of the Austrian College Society in Alpbach which he attended,
Feyerabend met the philosopher of science
Popper's own autobiography, unfortunately, tells us nothing about their meeting or their relationship, despite the fact that he was to be the largest single influence (first positive, then negative) on Feyerabend's work. For those hoping that Feyerabend might use the occasion of his autobiography to settle accounts with his erstwhile philosophical conscience, it is disappointing that the book tells us so little about his acquaintance with Popper. Elsewhere Feyerabend tells us that he
admired [Popper's] freedom of manners, his cheek, his disrespectful attitude towards the German philosophers who gave the proceedings weight in more senses than one, his sense of humour... [and] his ability to restate ponderous problems in simple and journalistic language. Here was a free mind, joyfully putting forth his ideas, unconcerned about the reaction of the `professionals'. (SFS, p.115).But Popper's ideas themselves, Feyerabend alleges, were not new to him, deductivism having been defended as early as 1925 by Viktor Kraft, and falsificationism being `taken for granted' at Alpbach. Popper's ideas, he remarks, were also similar to those of another Viennese philosopher,
At Alpbach he was also approached by communists, including the
Hollitscher never presented an argument that would lead, step by step, from positivism to realism and he would have regarded the attempt to produce such an argument as philosophical folly. He rather developed the realist position itself, illustrated it by examples from science and commonsense, showed how closely it was connected with scientific research and everyday action and so revealed its strength. (SFS, p.113).Feyerabend eventually developed these thoughts in a fascinating series of papers beginning in 1957, arguing that science needs realism in order to progress, and that positivism would stultify such progress. The argument was entirely in line with Popper's approach, as well as with his conclusions.
Not even a brief and quite interesting visit by Wittgenstein himself (in 1952) could advance our discussion. Wittgenstein was very impressive in his way of presenting concrete cases, such as amoebas under a microscope... but when he left we still did not know whether or not there was an external world, or, if there was one, what the arguments were in favour of it. (Feyerabend & Maxwell ibid., p.4. Note that Feyerabend must have got the date wrong, since Wittgenstein died in April 1951).
Wittgenstein, who took a long time to make up his mind and then appeared over an hour late gave a spirited performance and seemed to prefer our disrespectful attitude to the fawning admiration he encountered elsewhere. (SFS, p.109).In 1949, Feyerabend was introduced to Bertholt Brecht, and Hollitscher offered him the opportunity to become one of Brecht's production assistants, but he turned it down, later describing this as one of the biggest mistakes of his life (SFS, p.114). In the autobiography, however, he retracts this statement, saying that he would not have enjoyed being part of the closely knit group that surrounded Brecht. (The reasons for his later defection from the Popperian camp seem to have been similar).
The University of Vienna's physicists were Hans Thirring, Karl
Przibram, and Felix Ehrenhaft. Feyerabend admired Thirring and
Ehrenhaft, and was influenced by Ehrenhaft, who had lectured on
physics there from 1947. Ehrenhaft was known as a fierce and
independent critic of all kinds of orthodoxy in physics, but was
sometimes thought of as a charlatan. Feyerabend reports that he and
his fellow science students looked forward to exposing him as a fraud,
but in fact were treated, at the 1949 Alpbach seminar, to a battle
between Ehrenhaft and the orthodox in which the former presented his
experiments but the latter defended their position by using strategies
At the University of Vienna, although he had originally planned to submit a thesis on physics, Feyerabend swapped to philosophy when he got nowhere with the electrodynamics problem he was calculating (the philosopher of science as failed scientist?). He completed his doctoral thesis, `Zur Theorie der Basissätze' in 1951 under Kraft's supervision. The subject of the thesis was `basic sentences', or `protocol sentences', i.e. the kind of sentences that, the Logical Positivists had theorised, comprise the foundations of scientific knowledge. He later reported that in his philosophical work he had "started from and returned to the discussion of protocol statements in the Vienna Circle" (`Concluding Unphilosophical Conversation', in Munévar (1991), p.526). This is unsurprising, given that Kraft was then the Vienna Circle's only survivor in Vienna. However, Kraft's influence on Feyerabend has only recently been emphasised. Much of the material from Feyerabend's thesis was presented at (or gleaned from) meetings of the Kraft Circle, and also appears in his early articles, such as `An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience' (1958). The thesis itself was `a condensed version of the discussions in the Kraft Circle' (p.115).
In the early 1950's, Feyerabend published several German papers on Wittgenstein, written as a result of having read the proofs of the Philosophical Investigations, lent to him by Elizabeth Anscombe. Feyerabend first met Anscombe when lecturing on Descartes to the Austrian College Society. Anscombe had come to Vienna to perfect her German in order to translate Wittgenstein's works.
She gave me manuscripts of Wittgenstein's later writings and discussed them with me. The discussions extended over months and occasionally proceeded from morning over lunch until late into the evening. They had a profound influence upon me though it is not at all easy to specify particulars. (SFS, p.114).Feyerabend planned to study with Wittgenstein in Cambridge, and Wittgenstein was prepared to take him on as a student, but he died before Feyerabend arrived in England. Karl Popper became his supervisor instead.
Feyerabend is here referring to Popper's approach to the
Such an epistemology, Feyerabend now complains, makes the false assumption that `rational' standards can lead to a practice that is as mobile, rich and effective as the science we already have. Falsificationism would destroy science as we know it. Science did not develop in accordance with Popper's model. It is not `irrational', but it contains no overarching pattern. Popper's rules could produce a science, but not the science we now have. (Feyerabend remarks that the Logical Positivist Otto Neurath had already put this criticism of Popper some time before (p.91)).
In 1952, Feyerabend presented his ideas on scientific change to Popper's LSE seminar and to a gathering of illustrious Wittgensteinians (Elizabeth Anscombe, Peter Geach, H.L.A.Hart and Georg Henrik von Wright) in Anscombe's Oxford flat. This meeting seems to have been the first airing of the important concept of incommensurability (although not the term itself, which crept into publications only a decade later):
On one occasion which I remember vividly Anscombe, by a series of skilful questions, made me see how our conception (and even our perceptions) of well- defined and apparently self-contained facts may depend on circumstances not apparent in them. There are entities such as physical objects which obey a `conservation principle' in the sense that they retain their identity through a variety of manifestations and even when they are not present at all while other entities such as pains and after-images are `annihilated' with their disappearance. The conservation principles may change from one developmental stage of the human organism to another and they may be different for different languages (cf. Whorf's `covert classifications'... ). I conjectured that such principles would play an important role in science, that they might change during revolutions and that deductive relations between pre-revolutionary and post-revolutionary theories might be broken off as a result. (SFS, p.115).
Major discoveries, I said, are not like the discovery of America, where the general nature of the discovered object is already known. Rather, they are like recognizing that one has been dreaming. (KT, p.92).These thoughts received an unenthusiastic reception from Hart, von Wright and Popper.
Feyerabend's articles on Wittgenstein culminated in his review of the Philosophical Investigations, the text of which he studied in detail while he was in London. (`Being of a pedantic turn of mind', he says, `I rewrote the book so that it looked more like a treatise with a continuous argument'. (SFS, p.116)). Anscombe translated Feyerabend's summary into English and sent it to The Philosophical Review. It was accepted by the editor, Norman Malcolm (having been turned down by Gilbert Ryle, editor of Mind - see KT, p.93). This review was Feyerabend's first English-language publication; he called it his `Wittgensteinian monster' (p.115). He later commented:
I knew that Wittgenstein did not want to present a theory (of knowledge, or language), and I did not expressly formulate a theory myself. But my arrangements made the text speak like a theory and falsified Wittgenstein's intentions. (KT, p.93).
Wittgenstein's emphasis on the need for concrete research and his objections to abstract reasoning (`Look, don't think!) somewhat clashed with my own inclinations and the papers in which his influence is noticeable are therefore mixtures of concrete examples and sweeping principles. (SFS, p.115).In his review of the Philosophical Investigations, he summarised the book in a very effective way, drawing particular attention to Wittgenstein's critique of a family of `realist' or `
Unfortunately, as I have argued at length elsewhere, (Preston 1997, ch.2), Feyerabend completely failed to follow up this insight by endorsing Wittgenstein's non-representationalist conception of meaning, according to which the meaning of a term is determined by its use. Instead, wrongly associating the idea that meaning is use with positivism, Feyerabend proferred what he called a `contextual' theory of meaning, which identified the meaning of a term or statement with whatever role it plays in theoretical contexts. But he over-extended the idea of the theoretical to cover any context whatever, thus completely depriving it of content. For Feyerabend, the theoretical contrasts with nothing at all.
The book review was also critical of Wittgenstein, though. Notably, it
railed against Wittgenstein's conception of philosophy (as
`philosophical analysis'). In a short article published the next year
(1956), Feyerabend expanded on his critique, arguing that
consideration of G.E.Moore's famous `
One of the things that comes across most clearly from his autobiography is the consistently malleable nature of Feyerabend's views. He records that his friend Agassi caused him completely to change his mind about a book he considered translating. When Agassi urged Feyerabend to become a faithful Popperian, Feyerabend's resistance seems to have been based mainly on his aversion to groups.
During this period Feyerabend, having nothing to do and needing the money, translated Popper's `war effort', The Open Society and its Enemies into German, wrote articles on `Methodology' and `Philosophy of Nature' for a French encyclopaedia, produced a report on post-war developments in the Humanities in Austria for the U.S. Library of Congress, and made a mess of his first professional opportunity as a singer (p.98). But he also felt that he did not know what to do in the long run, so he applied for jobs in various universities.
He then met Arthur Pap, `who had come to Vienna to lecture on analytic philosophy and who hoped, perhaps somewhat unrealistically, that he would be able to revive what was left from the great years of the Vienna Circle and the analytic tradition there' (`Herbert Feigl: A Biographical Sketch', p.3). Feyerabend became Pap's assistant. Pap arranged for him to meet Herbert Feigl in Vienna in 1954, and together they studied Feigl's papers. Feigl had been a member of the Vienna Circle until his emigration to the USA in 1930, but he had never given up the `realist' view that there is a knowable external world. He convinced Feyerabend that the positivism of Kraft and Pap had not solved the traditional problems of philosophy. His paper `Existential Hypotheses' (1950), together with Kraft's contributions and certain ideas Popper had put forward at Alpbach in 1948 and 1949, greatly diminished Feyerabend's doubts about realism (ibid., p.4). Here is how Feyerabend recounts Feigl's influence:
It was ... quite a shock to hear Feigl expound fundamental difficulties and to hear him explain in perfectly simple language without any recourse to formalism why the problem of application [of the probability-calculus] was still without a solution. Formalization, then, was not the last word in philosophical matters. There was still room for fundamental discussion-for speculation (dreaded word!); there was still a possibility of overthrowing highly formalized systems with the help of a little common sense! (ibid., p.5).1954 saw the publication of the first of Feyerabend's many articles on the philosophy of
However, Feyerabend also came to think that Popper's earlier critique
of the Copenhagen orthodoxy had been somewhat limited and
superficial. According to Popper, the Copenhagen Interpretation was
simply the result of some bad positivistic
philosophising. Niels Bohr and Werner Heisenberg,
on this view, had been seduced by positivist philosophers (like Ernst
Mach and his ostensible followers, the Vienna Circle) into thinking
that their theory was not conjectural but was merely a compendious,
economical but non-hypothetical description of
experience. Feyerabend argued that, on the contrary, the Copenhagen
theorists had some perfectly good `physical', `scientific', or
`factual' arguments for thinking that their view alone was currently
compatible with the observed results of experiments. He therefore put
forward a defence of their instrumentalist
interpretation of the quantum theory. But the defence was only
tactical, since he ultimately argued that the observed results of
experiments themselves needed to be challenged by a point of
view which would reveal their truth or falsity. So Feyerabend used the
quantum case to push for a reconsideration of the methodological rules
to which scientists subscribe. This is the genesis of his idea of a
`pluralistic' test model, in which theories are compared with one
another, as well as against `experience'. (Note, however, that this
idea can already be found in Popper, and that Feyerabend did initially
acknowledge this fact). According to Feyerabend, only by endorsing
In the summer of that year, he again visited Alpbach, where he met the philosopher of science Philipp Frank (another former Logical Positivist), who exerted on him a (somewhat delayed) influence:
Frank argued that the Aristotelian objections against Copernicus agreed with empiricism, while Galileo's law of inertia did not. As in other cases, this remark lay dormant in my mind for years; then it started festering. The Galileo chapters of Against Method are a late result. (KT, p.103. See also SFS, p.112).Around the same time, Feyerabend met David Bohm, who was lecturing in physics at the University of Bristol. Bohm had been the favoured protegé of Niels Bohr, and his first book (Quantum Theory, (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1951))was a lengthy defence of the Copenhagen Interpretation of the quantum theory. But in the early 1950s Bohm rejected his former view, and became one of the leading defenders of the then-unpopular `hidden-variables' theory. He was to be a significant influence on Feyerabend, weaning him away from Popper with his somewhat Hegelian account of the structure of reality. In their later work, Bohm and Feyerabend moved in parallel directions, towards an interest in `fringe' science. Feyerabend produced a critical study of Bohm's 1957 book Causality and Chance in Modern Physics in 1960, when he was still very much under Popper's influence. But, as always with Feyerabend, Bohm's ideas sunk in gradually, and had visible effect only in his productions of the early 1970s.
In 1956, Feyerabend got married for the second time, this time to one of his former students, Mary O'Neill. But this relationship seems to have been very short-lived, for he reports that his wife spent Christmas 1957 away from him with her parents, that she subsequently had an affair, and that the last time he saw her was 1958.
Feyerabend remembers his Bristol lecture course on quantum mechanics as being a disaster. However, in the summer of 1956, along with Alfred Landé, he chaired a successful seminar on philosophical issues in quantum mechanics at Alpbach. A related success was his contribution to the 1957 Colston Research Symposium, where he gave a paper `On the Quantum Theory of Measurement'. Here Feyerabend introduced what was to become a long-running theme in his work: that there is no separate and neutral `observation-language' or `everyday language' against which the theoretical statements of science are tested, but that `the everyday level is part of the theoretical rather then something self-contained and independent' (Philosophical Papers, Volume I, p.217, emphasis added). This was his principal contribution to his central subject, the relation between theory and experience. It constituted not only a decisive break with the positivist conception of theories, but also something of a step beyond Popper's conception.
Around this time, many of Feyerabend's most important early papers were published. In them, under the influence of both Popper and Wittgenstein, Feyerabend initiated a vigourous critique of the then-orthodox philosophies of science provided by descendants of the Vienna Circle, `Logical Empiricist' thinkers such as Rudolph Carnap, Feigl, Nagel, and Hempel. This critique was conducted through a study of the relationship between observation and theory.
In perhaps the most important of these early publications, `An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience' (1958), Feyerabend argued against positivism and in favour of a scientific realist account of the relation between theory and experience, largely on grounds familiar from Karl Popper's falsificationist views. Positivist theories of meaning, he complained, have consequences which are `at variance with scientific method and reasonable philosophy' (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p.17). In particular, they imply what Feyerabend dubbed the `stability thesis', that even major changes in theory will not affect the meanings of terms in the scientific observation-language. Against this supposition, Feyerabend defended what he called `Thesis I', the idea that
the interpretation of an observation-language is determined by the theories which we use to explain what we observe, and it changes as soon as those theories change. (ibid., p.31).Thesis I reversed the direction of interpretation which the positivists had presupposed. Instead of meaning seeping upwards from the level of experience (or the observation-language), Feyerabend had it trickling down from theory to experience. For him, theory is meaningful independently of experience, rather than vice-versa. The roots of this view clearly lie in his contextual theory of meaning, according to which meaning is conferred on terms by virtue of their participation in theoretical contexts. It seems to imply that there is no principled semantic distinction between theoretical terms and observation terms. And Feyerabend soon followed up this implication with his `Pragmatic Theory of Observation', according to which what is important about observation-sentences is not their having a special core of empirical meaning, but their causal role in the production and refutation of theories.
In 1958, Feyerabend had been invited to spend one year at the University of California at Berkeley, and accepted. When this visiting appointment ended, the University administration decided to hire him on the basis of his publications and, of course, his big mouth (p.115). But because of his grant to work at Minneapolis, he only started lecturing full-time at Berkeley in 1960. There he encountered Thomas Kuhn, and read Kuhn's forthcoming book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions in draft form. He then wrote to Kuhn about the book (these letters have recently been published in Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 26, 1995). But he was not quite ready to take on Kuhn's descriptive-historical approach to the philosophy of science. Although more and more historical examples peppered his published work, he was still using them to support fairly orthodox falsificationist conclusions.
In his meta-methodology, Feyerabend applied to the dispute over the interpretation of scientific theories a strong measure of Popperian methodological conventionalism, arguing that the dispute between realists and instrumentalists is not a factual issue but a matter of choice. We can choose to see theories either as descriptions of reality (scientific realism) or as instruments of prediction (instrumentalism), depending on what ideals of scientific knowledge we aspire to. Adherence to these competing ideals (roughly: high informative content on the one hand, and sense-certainty on the other) is to be judged by their respective consequences. Stressing that philosophical theories have not merely reflected science but have changed it, Feyerabend argued further that the form of our knowledge can be altered to fit our ideals. So we can have certainty, and theories that merely summarise experience, if we wish. But, mobilising the usual equation between empirical content and testability (common to Carnap, Popper and Feyerabend), he urged that we should decisively reject the ideal of certainty and opt instead for theories which go beyond experience and say something informative about reality itself. In this respect, he clearly followed Popper's lead, reconstruing empiricism as a doctrine about the most desirable form for our theories, rather than as a view about the sources of knowledge.
Feyerabend argued that the idea, common to positivists, that the interpretation of observation terms doesn't depend upon the status of our theoretical knowledge, has consequences undesirable to positivists. One of these is that "every positivistic observation language is based upon a metaphysical ontology" (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p.21). Another follows from the thesis, which he relishes, that the theories we hold influence our language, and maybe even our perceptions. This implies that as long as we use only one empirically adequate theory, we will be unable to imagine alternative accounts of reality. If we also accept the positivist view that our theories are summaries of experience, those theories will be void of empirical content and untestable, and hence there will be a diminution in the critical, argumentative function of our language. Just as purely transcendent metaphysical theories are unfalsifiable, so too what began as an all-embracing scientific theory offering certainty will, under these circumstances, have become an irrefutable dogma, a myth. Elsewhere (Preston 1997, chapter 5) I have argued that his antipathy toward this `myth predicament' was one the main driving-forces behind Feyerabend's views at the time.
Feyerabend defended a realism according to which "the interpretation of a scientific theory depends upon nothing but the state of affairs it describes" (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p.42). At the same time he claimed to find in Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations a contextual theory of meaning according to which the meaning of terms is determined not by their use, nor by their connection with experience, but by the role they play in the wider context of a theory or explanation. Thesis I, the key proposition of Feyerabend's early work, is supposed to encapsulate both the contextual theory of meaning and scientific realism. Only realism, by insisting on interpreting theories in their most vulnerable form as universally-quantified statements which strive for truth, leads to scientific progress instead of stagnation, he argued. Only realism allows us to live up to the highest intellectual ideals of critical attitude, honesty, and testability.
Unlike positivism, which conflicts with science by taking experiences as unanalysable building-blocks, realism treats experiences as analysable, explaining them as the result of processes not immediately accessible to observation. Experiences and observation-statements are thus revealed as more complex and structured than positivism had realised. Feyerabend over-extended the contextual theory of meaning to apply not only to theoretical terms but to observation terms too, arguing that there is no special `problem' of theoretical entities, and that the distinction between observation terms and theoretical terms is a purely pragmatic one. If, as the contextual theory also implies, observation-statements depend on theoretical principles, any inadequacy in these principles will be transmitted to the observation-statements they subtend, whence our beliefs about what is observed may be in error, and even our experiences themselves can be criticised for giving only an approximate account of what is going on in reality. All our statements, beliefs and experiences are `hypothetical'. Observations and experiments always need interpretation, and different interpretations are supplied by different theories. If existing meanings embody theoretical principles, then instead of passively accepting observation- statements, we should attempt to find and test the theoretical principles implicit in them, which may require us to change those meanings.
Feyerabend therefore idolised semantic instability, arguing that the semantic stability presupposed by positivist accounts of reduction, explanation and confirmation, has been and should be violated if we want progress in science. If meaning is determined by theory, terms in very different theories simply cannot share the same meaning: they will be `incommensurable'. Any attempt to derive the principles of an old theory from those of a new one must either be unsuccessful or must effect a change in the meaning of the old theory's terms. The `theoretical reduction' beloved of Logical Empiricists is therefore actually more like replacement of one theory and its ontology by another. At the end of his well-known 1962 paper `Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism', in which he introduced the concept of incommensurability, Feyerabend concluded that this concept precluded any formal account of explanation, reduction or confirmation. (Kuhn's book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, in which the same term was used to characterize a related concept, was published in the same year).
In his first major published excursion from the philosophy of science, Feyerabend applied these ideas to the mind/body problem. In two papers published in 1963, he sought to defend materialism (roughly, the view that everything which exists is physical) against the supposition that the mind cannot be a physical thing. Although these papers exhibit a rather unclear mixture of views, they are now remembered primarily for having ushered in the position known as `eliminative materialism', according to which our way of conceiving the mind and mental phenomena amounts to a seriously inadequate theory which is in conflict with a (materialistic) scientific account of those same things. Feyerabend suggested that the two theories in question were incommensurable, but that nevertheless we ought to prefer the materialistic one on general methodological grounds. This radical view of the mind/body problem has been one of Feyerabend's most important legacies. Even though Feyerabend himself seems to have given it up in the late 1970s, it was taken up by Richard Rorty and, more recently, by Paul and Patricia Churchland.
In Feyerabend's version of the incommensurability thesis, the semantic
principles of construction underpinning a theory (in its
realist interpretation) can be violated or `suspended' by
another theory. As a result, theories cannot always be compared with
respect to their content, as `rationalists' would like. It took
Feyerabend a while to see it, for he did not officially
subscibe to this view until the late 1960s, but this opens the door to
In the ground-breaking central papers from this period of Feyerabend's oeuvre such as `How to be a Good Empiricist' (1963), `Realism and Instrumentalism' (1964), `Problems of Empiricism' and `Reply to Criticism' (1965), his most important argument for scientific realism was methodological: realism is desirable because it demands the proliferation of new and incompatible theories. This leads to scientific progress because it results in each theory having more empirical content that it otherwise would, since a theory's testability is proportional to the number of potential falsifiers it has, and the production of alternative theories is the only reliable way to ensure the existence of potential falsifiers. So scientific progress comes through `theoretical pluralism', allowing a plurality of incompatible theories, each of which will contribute by competition to maintaining and enhancing the testability, and thus the empirical content, of the others. According to Feyerabend's pluralistic test model, theories are tested against one another. He thus idealised what Kuhn called `pre-paradigm' periods and `scientific revolutions', occasions when there are many incompatible theories, all forced to develop through their competition with each other. But he downplayed the idea that theories are still compared with one another primarily for their ability to account for the results of observation and experiment. For Feyerabend, this idea was an empiricist myth which disguised the role of aesthetic and social factors in theory-choice.
Thus far, the argument for theoretical pluralism largely follows that
In thus appealing to the `principle of testability' as the supreme methodological maxim, Feyerabend forgets that testability must be traded-off against other theoretical virtues. Only his pathological fear of theories losing their empirical content and becoming myths leads him to want to maximise testability and embrace an absolutely unrestricted principle of proliferation. He also disregards historical evidence that anti-realist approaches can be just as pluralistic as realism.
At Alpbach in 1964, Feyerabend and Feigl jointly directed a seminar on the recent development of analytic philosophy. There Feyerabend re-encountered the leading light of the Logical Positivist movement, Rudolph Carnap (whom he had already met at UCLA). Carnap tried to convince Feyerabend of the virtues of clarity, but failed. Feyerabend was still attached to `scientific' philosophy, and considered philosophy worthless unless it made a positive and quantifiable contribution to the growth of knowledge (which, of course, meant science).
But a seminar in Hamburg in 1965, at which Feyerabend discussed the foundations of quantum theory with the physicist C.F. von Weizsäcker, did have a lasting, if somewhat delayed, impact:
Von Weizsäcker showed how quantum mechanics arose from concrete research while I complained, on general methodological grounds, that important alternatives had been omitted. The arguments supporting my complaint were quite good... but it was suddenly clear to me that imposed without regard to circumstances they were a hindrance rather than a help: a person trying to solve a problem whether in science or elsewhere must be given complete freedom and cannot be restricted by any demands, norms, however plausible they may seem to the logician or the philosopher who has thought them out in the privacy of his study. Norms and demands must be checked by research, not by appeal to theories of rationality. In a lengthy article I explained how Bohr had used this philosophy and how it differs from more abstract procedures. Thus Professor von Weizsäcker has prime responsibility for my change to `anarchism' - though he was not at all pleased when I told him so in 1977. (SFS, p.117).
My function was to carry out the educational policies of the State of California which means I had to teach people what a small group of white intellectuals had decided was knowledge. (SFS, p.118).However, Feyerabend's experience under these educational policies was undoubtedly one of the defining periods of his intellectual life, a time in which he became deeply suspicious of these intellectuals and `Western rationalism' as a whole:
In the years 1964ff. Mexicans, Blacks, Indians entered the university as a result of new educational policies. There they sat, partly curious, partly disdainful, partly simply confused hoping to get an `education'. What an opportunity for a prophet in search of a following! What an opportunity, my rationalist friends told me, to contribute to the spreading of reason and the improvement of mankind! I felt very differently. For it dawned on me that the intricate arguments and the wonderful stories I had so far told to my more or less sophisticated audience might just be dreams, reflections of the conceit of a small group who had succeeded in enslaving everyone else with their ideas. Who was I to tell these people what and how to think? (ibid. See also KT, p.123).At this time, Feyerabend gave two lectures, one on general philosophy, and one on philosophy of science. He seems to have got into some trouble at Berkeley by running his seminar on unacceptably loose lines, regularly cancelling lectures, and failing to prepare for the lectures he did give:
I often told the students to go home--the official notes would contain everything they needed. As a result an audience of 300, 500, even 1,200 shrank to 50 or 30. I wasn't happy about that; I would have preferred a larger audience, and yet I repeated my advice until the administration intervened. Why did I do it? Was it because I disliked the examination system, which blurred the line between thought and routine? Was it because I despised the idea that knowledge was a skill that had to be acquired and stabilized by rigorous training? Or was it because I didn't think much of my own performance? All these factors may have played a role. (p.122).But although he sympathised with the original aims of the student movement, Feyerabend was unimpressed by their leaders, feeling that their ideas were as authoritarian as those they were trying to replace. He reports having cut fewer lectures during the student strike than either before or afterwards! Nevertheless, by holding his lectures off-campus during this campus war, Feyerabend antagonised the administration that had hired him. Tales of him giving `A' grades to every student in his class, regardless of their production (or lack of it), abound. He had the impression that some of his colleagues, especially John Searle, wanted to have him fired, and that they only gave up when they realised how much paperwork would be involved (p.126).
Despite taking his academic duties and responsibilities decreasingly seriously, and coming into conflict with his own university's administration as a result, Feyerabend had not yet fouled his substantial reputation as a serious philosopher of science. He reports that he received job offers from London, Berlin, Yale, and Auckland, that he was invited to become a fellow of All Souls College, Oxford, and that he corresponded with Friedrich von Hayek (whom he already knew from the Alpbach seminars) about a job in Freiburg (p.127). He accepted the posts in London, Berlin, and Yale. In 1968, he resigned from UC Berkeley and left for Minneapolis, but grew homesick, got re-appointed, and returned to Berkeley almost immediately.
In London, lecturing to University College and the LSE, he met
By the early 1970s Feyerabend had flown the falsificationist coop and
was ready expound his own perspective on
Later that year, Feyerabend found himself lecturing at the University of Sussex:
I have no idea why and how I went to the University of Sussex at Brighton... what I do remember is that I taught two terms (1974/1975) and then resigned; twelve hours a week (one lecture course, the rest tutorials) was too much. (p.153).A member of Feyerabend's audience recalls things in rather more detail:
Sussex University: the start of the Autumn Term, 1974. There was not a seat to be had in the biggest Arts lecture theatre on campus. Taut with anticipation, we waited expectantly and impatiently for the advertized event to begin. He was not on time - as usual. In fact rumour had it that he would not be appearing at all that illness (or was it just ennui? or perhaps a mistress?) had confined him to bed. But just as we began sadly to reconcile ourselves to the idea that there would be no performance that day at all, Paul Feyerabend burst through the door at the front of the packed hall. Rather pale, and supporting himself on a short metal crutch, he walked with a limp across to the blackboard. Removing his sweater he picked up the chalk and wrote down three questions one beneath the other: What's so great about knowledge? What's so great about science? What's so great about truth? We were not going to be disappointed after all!Because his health was poor, Feyerabend started seeing a healer who had been recommended to him. The treatment was successful, and thenceforth Feyerabend used to refer to his own case as an example of both the failures of orthodox medicine and the largely unexplored possibilities of `alternative' or traditional remedies.
During the following weeks of that term, and for the rest of his year as a visiting lecturer, Feyerabend demolished virtually every traditional academic boundary. He held no idea and no person sacred. With unprecedented energy and enthusiasm he discussed anything from Aristotle to the Azande. How does science differ from witchcraft? Does it provide the only rational way of cognitively organizing our experience? What should we do if the pursuit of truth cripples our intellects and stunts our individuality? Suddenly epistemology became an exhilarating area of investigation.
Feyerabend created spaces in which people could breathe again. He demanded of philosophers that they be receptive to ideas from the most disparate and apparently far-flung domains, and insisted that only in this way could they understand the processes whereby knowledge grows. His listeners were enthralled, and he held his huge audiences until, too ill and too exhausted to continue, he simply began repeating himself. But not before he had brought the house down by writing `Aristotle' in three-foot high letters on the blackboard and then writing `Popper' in tiny, virtually illegible letters beneath it! (John Krige, Science, Revolution and Discontinuity, (Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980), pp.106-7).
Instead of the volume written jointly with Lakatos, Feyerabend put together his tour de force, the book version of Against Method (London: New Left Books, 1975), which he sometimes conceived of as a letter to Lakatos (to whom the book is dedicated). A more accurate description, however, is the one given in his autobiography:
AM is not a book, it is a collage. It contains descriptions, analyses, arguments that I had published, in almost the same words, ten, fifteen, even twenty years earlier... I arranged them in a suitable order, added transitions, replaced moderate passages with more outrageous ones, and called the result `anarchism'. I loved to shock people... (pp.139, 142).The book contained many of the themes mentioned so far in this essay, sprinkled into a case study of the transition from geocentric to heliocentric astronomy. But whereas he had previously been arguing in favour of methodology (a `pluralistic' methodology, that is), he had now become dissatisfied with any methodology. He emphasised that older scientific theories, like Aristotle's theory of motion, had powerful empirical and argumentative support, and stressed, correlatively, that the heroes of the scientific revolution, such as Galileo, were not as scrupulous as they were sometimes represented to be. He portrayed Galileo as making full use of rhetoric, propaganda, and various epistemological tricks in order to support the heliocentric position. The Galileo case is crucial for Feyerabend, since the `scientific revolution' is his paradigm of scientific progress and of radical conceptual change, and Galileo is his hero of the scientific revolution. He also sought further to downgrade the importance of empirical arguments by suggesting that aesthetic criteria, personal whims and social factors have a far more decisive role in the history of science than rationalist or empiricist historiography would indicate.
Against Method explicitly drew the `epistemological anarchist'
conclusion that there are no useful and exceptionless methodological
rules governing the progress of science or the growth of
knowledge. The history of science is so complex that if we insist on a
general methodology which will not inhibit progress the only `rule' it
will contain will be the useless suggestion: `anything goes'. In
particular, logical empiricist methodologies and Popper's Critical
Rationalism would inhibit scientific progress by enforcing restrictive
conditions on new theories. The more sophisticated `methodology of
scientific research programmes' developed by Lakatos either contains
ungrounded value-judgements about what constitutes good science, or is
reasonable only because it is epistemological anarchism in
disguise. The phenomenon of incommensurability renders the standards
which these `rationalists' use for comparing theories
inapplicable. The book thus (understandably) had Feyerabend branded an
`irrationalist'. At a time when Kuhn was downplaying the
`irrationalist' implications of his own book, Feyerabend was perceived
to be casting himself in the role others already saw as his for the
taking. (He did not, however, commit himself to political
He later said:
One of my motives for writing Against Method was to free people from the tyranny of philosophical obfuscators and abstract concepts such as `truth', `reality', or `objectivity', which narrow people's vision and ways of being in the world. Formulating what I thought were my own attitude and convictions, I unfortunately ended up by introducing concepts of similar rigidity, such as `democracy', `tradition', or `relative truth'. Now that I am aware of it, I wonder how it happened. The urge to explain one's own ideas, not simply, not in a story, but by means of a `systematic account', is powerful indeed. (pp.179-80).
... now I was alone, sick with some unknown affliction; my private life was in a mess, and I was without a defense. I often wished I had never written that fucking book. (KT, p.147).Feyerabend saw himself as having undermined the arguments for science's privileged position within culture, and much of his later work was a critique of the position of science within Western societies. Because there is no scientific method, we can't justify science as the best way of acquiring knowledge. And the results of science don't prove its excellence, since these results have often depended on the presence of non-scientific elements, science prevails only because `the show has been rigged in its favour' (SFS, p.102), and other traditions, despite their achievements, have never been given a chance. The truth, he suggests, is that
science is much closer to myth than a scientific philosophy is prepared to admit. It is one of the many forms of thought that have been developed by man, and not necessarily the best. It is conspicuous, noisy, and impudent, but it is inherently superior only for those who have already decided in favour of a certain ideology, or who have accepted it without ever having examined its advantages and its limits (AM, p.295).The separation of church and state should therefore be supplemented by the separation of science and state, in order for us to achieve the humanity we are capable of. Setting up the ideal of a free society as `a society in which all traditions have equal rights and equal access to the centres of power' (SFS, p.9), Feyerabend argues that science is a threat to democracy. To defend society against science we should place science under democratic control and be intensely sceptical about scientific `experts', consulting them only if they are controlled democratically by juries of laypeople.
Many of the more important papers Feyerabend published during the mid- 1980s were collected together in Farewell to Reason (London: Verso, 1987). The major message of this book is that relativism is the solution to the problems of conflicting beliefs and of conflicting ways of life. Feyerabend starts by suggesting that the contemporary intellectual scene in Western culture is by no means as fragmented and cacophonous as many intellectuals would have us believe. The surface diversity belies a deeper uniformity, a monotony generated and sustained by the cultural and ideological imperialism which the West uses to beat its opponents into submission. Such uniformity, however, can be shown to be harmful even when judged by the standards of those who impose it. Cultural diversity, which already exists in some societies, is a good thing not least because it affords the best defence against totalitarian domination.
Feyerabend proposes to support the idea of cultural diversity both positively, by producing considerations in its favour, and negatively `by criticising philosophies that oppose it' (FTR, p.5). Contemporary philosophies of the latter type are said to rest on the notions of Objectivity and Reason. He seeks to undermine the former notion by pointing out that confrontations between cultures with strongly held opinions which are each believed by members of the cultures in question to be objectively true can turn out in different ways. The result of such confrontation may be the persistence of the old views, fruitful and mutual interaction, relativism, or argumentative evaluation. `Relativism' here means the decision to treat the other people's form of life and the beliefs it embodies as `true-for-them', while treating our own views as `true-for-us'. Feyerabend feels that this is an appropriate way to resolve such confrontation.
Admittedly, these outcomes are indeed possible. But this does not establish any form of relativism. Indeed, we might as well turn the argument around, and say that the possibility of the dispute being resolved by one participant freely coming around to the other's point of view shows the untenability of relativism.
Feyerabend complains that the ideas of reason and rationality are `ambiguous and never clearly explained' (FTR, p.10); they are deified hangovers from autocratic times which no longer have any content but whose `halo of excellence' (ibid.) clings to them and lends them spurious respectability:
[R]ationalism has no identifiable content and reason no recognisable agenda over and above the principles of the party that happens to have appropriated its name. All it does now is to lend class to the general drive towards monotony. It is time to disengage Reason from this drive and, as it has been thoroughly compromised by the association, to bid it farewell. (FTR, p.13).Relativism is the tool with which Feyerabend hopes to `undermine the very basis of Reason' (ibid.). But is it Reason with a capital `R', the philosophers' abstraction alone, that is to be renounced, or reason itself too? Feyerabend is on weak ground when he claims that `Reason' is a philosophers' notion which has no content, for it is precisely the philosopher who is willing to attach a specific content to the formal notion of rationality (unlike the layperson, whose notion of reason is closer to what Feyerabend calls the `material' conception, where to be rational is `to avoid certain views and to accept others' (ibid., p.10)).
Relativism is a result of cultural confrontation, an `attempt to make sense of the phenomenon of cultural variety' (FTR, p.19). Feyerabend is well aware that the term `relativism' itself is understood in many different ways. But his attempt to occupy a substantial yet defensible relativist position is a failure. At some points he merely endorses views which no-one would deny, but which do not deserve to be called relativist (such as the idea that people may profit from studying other points of view, no matter how strongly they hold their own view (FTR, p.20)). At others he does manage to subscribe to a genuinely relativist view, but fails to show why it must be accepted.
It was only in 1988, on the 50th anniversary of Austria's unification with Germany, that Feyerabend became interested in his past (p.1). The Feyerabends left California for life in Switzerland and Italy in the fall of 1989 (p.2). It was during this move that Feyerabend re-discovered his mother's suicide note (p.9), which may have been one of the factors that spurred him to write his autobiography. Feyerabend looked forward to his retirement, and he and Grazia decided to try to have children. He claimed to have forgotten the thirty-five years of his academic career almost as quickly as he had earlier forgotten his military service (p.168).
Although these papers were on scattered subjects, there are some
strong themes running through them, several of which (as I have argued
elsewhere (Preston [forthcoming])) bear comparison with what gets
One of the projects which Feyerabend worked on for a long time, but never really brought to completion, went under the name `The Rise of Western Rationalism'. Under this umbrella he hoped to show that Reason (with a capital `R') and Science had displaced the binding principles of previous world-views not as the result of having won an argument, but as the result of power-play. While the first philosophers (the pre-Socratic thinkers) had interesting views, their attempt to replace, streamline or rationalise the folk-wisdom which surrounded them was eminently resistible. Their introduction of the appearance/reality dichotomy made nonsense of many of the things people had previously known. Even nowadays, indigenous cultures and counter-cultural practices provide alternatives to Reason and that nasty Western science.
However, Feyerabend recognised that this is to present science as too much of a monolith. In most of his work after Against Method, emphasises what has come to be known as the `disunity of science'. Science, he insists, is a collage, not a system or a unified project. Not only does it include plenty of components derived from distinctly `non-scientific' disciplines, but these components are often vital parts of the `progress' science has made (using whatever criterion of progress you prefer). Science is a collection of theories, practices, research traditions and world-views whose range of application is not well-determined and whose merits vary to a great extent. All this can be summed up in his slogan: "Science is not one thing, it is many".
Likewise, the supposed ontological correlate of science, `the world', consists not only of one kind of thing but of countless kinds of things, things which cannot be `reduced' to one another. In fact, there is no good reason to suppose that the world has a single, determinate nature. Rather we inquirers construct the world in the course of our inquiries, and the plurality of our inquiries ensures that the world itself has a deeply plural quality: the Homeric gods and the microphysicist's subatomic particles are simply different ways in which `Being' responds to (different kinds of) inquiry. How the world is `in-itself' is for ever unknowable. In this respect, Feyerabend's last work can be thought of as aligned with `social constructivism'.
His autobiography was published in 1995, his last book The Conquest of Abundance, is now being prepared, and a third volume of his Philosophical Papers will appear in 1998.
Although the focus of philosophy of science has moved away from interest in scientific methodology in recent years, this is not due in any great measure to acceptance of Feyerabend's anti-methodological argument. His critique of science (which gave him the reputation for being an `anti-science philosopher', `the worst enemy of science', etc.) is patchy. Its flaws stem directly from his scientific realism. It sets up a straight confrontation between science and other belief-systems as if they are all aiming to do the same thing (give us `knowledge of the world') and must be compared for how well they deliver the goods. A better approach would be, in Gilbert Ryle's words, `to draw uncompromising contrasts' between the businesses of science and those of other belief-systems. Such an approach fits far better with the theme Feyerabend approached later in his life: that of the disunity of science.
Feyerabend came to be seen as a leading cultural relativist, not just because he stressed that some theories are incommensurable, but also because he defended relativism in politics as well as in epistemology. His denunciations of aggressive Western imperialism, his critique of science itself, his conclusion that `objectively' there may be nothing to choose between the claims of science and those of astrology, voodoo, and alternative medicine, as well as his concern for environmental issues ensured that he was a hero of the anti-technological counter-culture.
Different components and phases of Feyerabend's work have influenced very different groups of thinkers. His early scientific realism, contextual theory of meaning, and the way he proposed to defend materialism were taken up by Paul and Patricia Churchland. Richard Rorty, for a time, also endorsed eliminative materialism. Feyerabend's critique of reductionism has influenced Cliff Hooker and John Dupré, and his general point of view influenced books such as Alan Chalmers' well-known introduction to philosophy of science What is this thing called science? (Milton Keynes: Open University Press, 1978).
Feyerabend has also had considerable influence within the social studies. He directly inspired books like D.L.Phillips' Abandoning Method (San Francisco, 1973), in which the attempt was made to transcend methodology. Less directly, he has exerted enormous influence on a generation of sociologists of science through his relativism, social constructivism, and apparent irrationalism. It is still far too early to say whether, and in what way, his philosophy will be remembered.
Table of Contents
First published: August 26, 1997
Content last modified: August 27, 1997