|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Feminists have developed a wide variety of women-centered approaches to ethics, including those labeled "feminine," "maternal," and "lesbian." Each of these approaches to ethics highlights the differences between men's and women's respective situations in life- biological and social; provides strategies for dealing with issues that arise in private as well as public life; and offers action guides intended to undermine rather than bolster the present systematic subordination of women (Jaggar, "Feminist Ethics," 1992). Considered together the overall aim of all feminist approaches to ethics, irrespective of their specific labels, is to create a gender-equal ethics, a moral theory that generates non-sexist moral principles, policies, and practices.
With respect to the kind of questions about "women's morality" posed above, the eighteenth-century thinker Mary Wollstonecraft answered that women's and men's moralities are fundamentally the same. Although she did not use terms such as "socially-constructed gender roles," Wollstonecraft denied that women are by nature more pleasure seeking than men. She reasoned that if men were confined to the same cages women find themselves locked in, as are low-ranking military men, for example, they would develop the same kind of weak characters women develop. Denied the chance to develop their rational powers, to become moral persons who have concerns, causes, and commitments over and beyond their own physical and psychological pleasure, men as well as women would become overly "emotional," a condition Wollstonecraft associated with hypersensitivity, extreme narcissism, and excessive self indulgence (Wollstonecraft, A Vindication of the Rights of Women, 1988).
Because she regarded the ability to reason rather than the capacity to feel as the characteristic that distinguishes humans from brutes, Wollstonecraft contrasted manners, such as any automaton might master, with morals, which requires an educated understanding. Whereas society teaches men morals, it teaches women manners. More specifically, society encourages women to cultivate negative psychological traits like "cunning," "vanity," and "immaturity," all of which impede the development of more positive psychological traits. Even worse, society twists what could be woman's genuine virtue into vices. Wollstonecraft specifically claimed that when strong women practice gentleness, it is a grand, even godly, virtue; but when weak women practice it, it is a demeaning, even subhuman, vice. The positive psychological trait of gentleness is transformed into the negative psychological trait of obsequiousness "when it is the submissive demeanor of dependence, the support of weakness that loves, because it wants protection; and is forebearing because it must silently endure injuries; smiling under the lash at which it dare not snarl" (Wollstonecraft, A Vindication of the Rights of Women, p. 117).
Distressed by her female contemporaries' negative psychological traits, Wollstonecraft concluded that the quickest way for women to be regarded as moral is for them to become like men--that is, for women to display the psychological traits usually associated with men. Yet, just because Wollstonecraft lamented women's moral deficiencies does not mean that she totally blamed women for not being as good as they possibly could be. On the contrary, she claimed that because women are politically and economically oppressed, they do not have the material means necessary to develop their moral potential.
Debates about what makes a character good and a personality socially acceptable did not end with Mary Wollstonecraft. The passing of time can certainly result in changes, for by the nineteenth-century women were regarded as more moral (though also as less intellectual) than men, a view that disturbed utilitarian philosopher John Stuart Mill. As he saw it virtue (as well as intellect) has nothing to do with gender. Society is wrong, he said to set up an ethical double standard according to which women's morality is to be assessed differently than men's morality. Reflecting further on women's alleged moral superiority, Mill concluded that women's "moral nature" is not the result of innate female propensities but of systematic social conditioning. To praise women on account of their great "virtue" is merely to compliment patriarchal society for having inculcated in women those psychological traits that serve to maintain it. Women are taught to live for and sacrifice for others; to always give and never receive; to submit, yield and obey; to be long-suffering. Their "virtue" is not of their own doing; society imposes it upon them (J.S. Mill, The Subjection of Women, 1970).
In contrast to Wollstonecraft and Mill, other eighteenth-and nineteenth-century thinkers denied that virtue is one. Instead, they forwarded either a separate-but-equal theory of virtue according to which male and female virtues are simply different, or a separate-and unequal theory of virtue according to which female virtue is ultimately better than male virtue. Significantly, this diverse group of thinkers disagreed among themselves whether the characteristics typically associated with women (nurturance, empathy, compassion, self sacrifice, kindness) are (1) full-fledged moral virtues to be developed by men as well as by women; (2) positive psychological traits to be developed by women alone; (3) or negative psychological traits to be developed neither by women nor men.
Catherine Beecher belonged to this group of thinkers. Even though she believed that women's place is in the home, she did not believe that women's work is unimportant. On the contrary, she believed that women's work--the creation and maintenance of homes in which moral virtue thrives--is absolutely essential for society's well-being. She reasoned that men would lose their raison d'etre for working if they lacked loving families and well-ordered homes. In an effort to make certain that society would indeed value women's work at least as much as men's work, Beecher and her sister Harriet created the discipline of "domestic science." They stressed that women's work requires much intelligence and skill; that it is not easy to manage a household properly. They also emphasized that women's most important work is to make society Christlike--that is, submissive, self-sacrificial, and benevolent. Sheltered safely in the private realm, where they are largely insulated from the siren calls of wealth, power, and prestige that pervade the public sphere of politics and economics, women are supposedly better situated to cultivate what Beecher and her sister termed the Christlike virtue of "self-denying benevolence." The better that women are, the better that everyone else will be. Convinced that women were somehow responsible for the moral rectitude of men and children, it never occurred to Beecher to ask herself why Christ, a man, had selected women rather than men to specialize in the virtue of self-denying benevolence (Beecher and Stowe, The American Woman's Home, 1971).
Writing around the time Beecher wrote, Elizabeth Cady Stanton also found differences between women's and men's moralities. Stanton's discussion of this already knotty topic is complicated by her apparent inability to decide whether female and male virtue and vice are more the product of nurture or nature. But whether her final view is that men's and women's diverging virtues and vices are the result of social manipulation or biological imperative, Stanton consistently maintained that what she regarded as men's inferior set of morals have set the standard for behavior in the public world. Women's set of morals, which Stanton regarded as superior to men's, have been either suppressed or ignored to the detriment of the public world. The solution to this unfortunate state of affairs, said Stanton, is a relatively simple one: permit, indeed require, women to enter the public world. Humankind cannot afford to leave women, as Beecher would, in the private world, struggling to exert their good influence there and only there. (Buhle and Buhle, eds., The Concise History of Women's Suffrage, 1988).
Yet, despite the fact that like Beecher, Stanton valued women's self-denying benevolence, she believed there was a higher virtue for women to develop: namely, self-development. In the course of interpreting a biblical passage in which Jesus praises a poor widow for her charitable actions, Stanton observed that an oppressed person cannot always afford to be so giving--not without destroying herself. Agreeing that the poor widow's charitable actions were indeed laudatory, Stanton nonetheless cautioned women that women's self-sacrifice may effectively perpetuate women's second-class status. Although the duty of self-sacrifice is morally required in the abstract, "ought" implies can in the concrete. Because few women in a patriarchal society have the political and economic means to practice benevolence without men taking advantage of them, they cannot always afford to be other-directed; sometimes they have to be self-centered.
Although she probably did not think of herself as extending Stanton's line of reasoning, Charlotte Perkins Gilman portrayed on all-female society in which the women are able to serve each other and their daughters (produced through parthenogenesis) without anyone being "sacrificed" in the process. Herland is a child-centered society of mothers in which the lines between the so-called private and public realms have been radically redrawn. The women of Herland are at ease in the halls of justice and centers of trade as well as in the nurseries and schools. Competitive individualistic approaches to life, with their hostility toward connectedness, disappear in Herland, and its women are able to relate to each other without dominating each other.
No wonder that the three American explorers--Terry, Jeff and Van --who
stumble on Herland are shocked and confused. Before they arrive, they
joke about the mythical land, assuming that there must be men it,
since women could not possibly cooperate well enough, or be competent
enough, to run a country. When they see how successfully Herland is
run, only one of them, Van, praises its all female population as a
group of exemplary human beings whose behavior all persons, male as
well as female, should seek to emulate. As he sees it, the women of
Herland exhibit virtues that are neither feminine nor masculine, but
simply fully human (Gilman, Herland, 1979).
Of course, Herland is a fictional, ideal-world in which imagined social, economic, and ideological conditions permit women to develop in morally good as well as psychological healthy ways. Conditions are quite different for women in our nonfictional, real-world. In Women and Economics (1966), Gilman wrote that to the degree women are dependent on men for support, women will be known for their blind faith, complete submission, and servile self-sacrifice, and men will be known for their stubborn opinions, dominating actions, and arrogant selfishness. Only when women are men's economic equals will women and men both be able to develop truly human moral virtue, the perfect blend of pride and humility: namely, self-respect.
Proponents of feminine approaches to ethics like Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings stress that traditional western moral theories, principles, practices, and policies are deficient to the degree that they lack, ignore, trivialize, or demean those traits of personality and virtues of character that are culturally associated with women. Gilligan presents her work as a response to the Freudian notion that whereas men have a well-developed moral sense, women do not. Freud attributed women's supposed moral inferiority to girls' psychosexual development. Whereas boys break their attachment to their mothers for fear of being castrated by their fathers if they don't, girls remain emotionally tied to their mothers since castration threats have no power over them. As a result of this state of affairs, girls are supposedly much slower than boys to develop a sense of themselves as autonomous moral agents personally responsible for the consequences of their actions or inactions; as persons who must obey society's rules or face its punishments.
According to Gilligan, Freud is simply one of many western psychologists and philosophers who have seen women's moral inferiority where, in Gilligan's estimation, they should have instead seen simply women's moral difference from men. Gilligan singles out her former mentor, educational psychologist and moralist Lawrence Kohlberg for particular criticism. Kohlberg claimed that moral development is a six-stage process. Stage One is the punishment and obedience orientation. To avoid the "stick" of punishment and/or to receive the "carrot" of a reward, children do as they are told. Stage Two is "the instrumental relativist orientation." Based on a limited principle of reciprocity- You scratch my back and I'll scratch yours--children meet others' needs only if others meet their needs. Stage Three is the "good boy-nice girl" orientation. Adolescents conform to prevailing norms to secure others' approval and love. Stage Four is the law and order orientation. Adolescents begin to do their duty, show respect for authority, and maintain the given social order to secure others' admiration and respect for them as honorable, law abiding citizens. Stage Five is the social-contract legalistic orientation. Adults adopt an essentially utilitarian moral point of view according to which individuals are permitted to do as they please, provided they refrain from harming other people in the process. Stage Six is the universal ethical principle orientation. Adults adopt an essentially Kantian moral perspective that seeks to transcend and judge all conventional moralities. Adults are no longer ruled by self-interest, the opinion of others, or the fear of legal punishment, but by self-legislated and self-imposed universal principles such as those of justice, reciprocity, and respect for the dignity of human persons (Kohlberg in Mischel, ed., Cognitive Development and Epistemology, 1971).
Although Gilligan concedes that Kohlberg's six-stage scale appeals to many people schooled in traditional western ethics, she insists that the popularity of a theory of moral development is not an index of its truth. She asks whether Kohlberg's six stages of moral developments are indeed: (1) universal, (2) invariant (a always precedes b, b always precedes c, etc.), and (3) hierarchical (b is "more adequate" than a, c is "more adequate" than b, etc.). In particular, she asks why, in the Kohlbergian work with which she is most familiar, women rarely climb past Stage Three, whereas men routinely ascend to Stages Four and even Five? Does this gender difference mean that women are less morally developed than men are? Or does it instead mean that there is something wrong with Kohlberg's methodology--some bias that permits men to achieve higher moral development scores than women?
Gilligan answers that Kohlberg's methodology is male-biased. Its "ears" are tuned to male, not female, moral voices. Thus, it fails to register the different voice Gilligan claims to have first heard in her study of twenty-nine women reflecting on their abortion decisions. This moral voice, insists Gilligan, speaks a language of care stressing relationships and responsibilities, a language that is largely unintelligible to Kohlbergian researchers, who speak the dominant moral language of western ethical tradition--namely, a language of justice emphasizing rights and rules.
Although Gilligan emphasizes that the languages of care and justice are not gender correlated in any iron-clad way, with all women speaking only the language of care and all men speaking only the language of justice, the examples she uses tend to belie her important disclaimer. In her foundational abortion study, she shows only women moving in and out of the three moral frames of reference that constitute her relational ethics: Level One in which women overemphasize the interests of their selves; Level Two in which women overemphasize their own interests; and Level Three in which women weave their own interests together with those of others. Thus, a woman at Level One would make her abortion decision in terms of what is best for herself, at Level Two in terms of what is best for others, and at Level Three in terms of what is best for herself and others considered as a relational unit (Gilligan, In a Different Voice, 1982).
As described so far, Gilligan's Levels seem no more an account of human moral development than Kohlberg's Stages, with Kohlberg focusing on men's moral experience, and Gilligan on women's. Openly admitting this point, Gilligan has begun to study men's as well as women's moral experience. Her central aim is to expose the ways in which the U.S. society continues to muffle boys' and mens' sensitivity, encouraging them to be less than caring and fully nurturant human persons. Gilligan stresses that unlike today's women who speak the moral language of justice and rights nearly as fluently as the moral language of care and relationship, today's boys and men remain largely unable to articulate their moral concerns in anything other than the moral language of justice and rights.
One index of the importance of Gilligan's work is not only the number of thinkers who have applied her insights to their areas of expertise but also the number of thinkers who have taken her work seriously enough to critique it. To date Gilligan's critics have focused either on the relationship between justice and care, considered as two, gender-neutral perspectives on morality, or on the fact, that women are culturally associated with care and men are culturally associated with justice.
Critics who adopt the first strategy are primarily non-feminist critics. Some of them argue that even if care is a moral virtue and not simply a pleasing psychological trait that some people happen to have, it is a less essential moral virtue than justice. Among the statements such non feminist critics make is that it is better to act out of a general moral principle like "aid the needy" than a particular caring feeling like human heartedness because principles are more reliable and less ephemeral than feelings; and (2) that, when justice and care conflict, considerations of impartiality must trump considerations of partiality: my children's fundamental rights and basic needs are neither more nor less important than anyone else's children's.
Other non-feminist critics fault Gilligan not for claiming that care is a genuine moral virtue equal in value to justice, but for suggesting that this is ethical "news." These critics stress that two, not one, basic principles of prima facie obligation, benevolence and justice, have always ruled traditional western ethics. From benevolence flow the principle of utility, the principle of not harming anyone, and the principle of not interfering with another's liberty. From justice flows the principles of equality of respect and consideration and equality before the law. But in defense of Gilligan, what some traditional western philosophers mean by "benevolence" may not be what Gilligan means by "care." Philosopher Lawrence A. Blum invites us to consider the specific principle "Protect one's children from harm," a principle that flows from the general principle of benevolence. As Blum sees it, all sorts of parents subscribe to this specific principle, but only those parents who are caring--that is, sensitive to and aware of their children's unique interests and needs--will not only know when and how to meet the terms of the principle, but actually be motivated to do so. Although most traditional western philosophers agree with Blum that caring parents are more likely to actually act benevolently than uncaring parents are, they do not agree with him that only caring parents are capable of so acting. Instead they insist that a formal sense of duty, whether or not it is accompanied by caring feelings, is sufficient to generate moral action. Like many ethicists who are developing feminine approaches to ethics, however, Blum believes that the person who would be moral must do more than merely obey the letter of the law. He or she must also be infused with the proper spirit--the appropriate emotions, sentiments, feelings--to perform an entirely morally worthy action (Blum, Friendship, Altruism, and Morality, 1980).
In addition to the non-feminist criticisms that have been raised against Gilligan, several feminist criticisms have been directed against her work. Of these criticisms, the most powerful worries that even if women are better carers than men, it may still be epistemically, ethically, and politically imprudent to associate women with the value of care. To link women with caring is to promote the view that because women can care, they should care no matter the cost to themselves.
In Femininity and Domination (1990), feminist critic Sandra Lee Bartky argues that women's experience of feeding men's egos and tending men's wounds ultimately disempowers women. She notes that the kind of emotional work practiced by women in some service-oriented occupations often causes these women to lose touch with their own emotional base. For example, to pay a person to be "relentlessly cheerful"--to smile at even the most verbally-abusive and unreasonably demanding customer--means paying a person to feign a certain set of emotions. Yet, a person can pretend to be happy only so many times before that person forgets how it feels to be genuinely or authentically happy.
Bartky concedes that women insist that, far from draining them; the emotional work they do energizes them. Indeed many wives and mothers claim the experience of caring for their husbands and children is meaning-giving and self-validating. The better carers they become, they more they view themselves as the family's or marriage's indispensable backbone. Yet subjective feelings of empowerment are not the same as the objective reality of actually having power, says Bartky. She explains how women's androcentric emotional work can work against women distorting women's moral integrity. Bartky points to Teresa Stangl, wife of Fritz Stangl, Kommandant of Treblinka. Despite the fact that her husband's monstrous activities horrified her, she continued to "feed" and "tend" him dutifully, even lovingly. In doing so, however, she played footloose and fancy free with her own soul, for a woman cannot remain silent about evil and still expect to keep her goodness entirely intact. Since horror perpetrated by a loved one is still horror, women need to analyze "the pitfalls and temptations of caregiving itself" before they embrace as ethics of care wholeheartedly (Bartky, Femininity and Domination, 1990).
Mullet reinforces Bartky's fears about a feminine ethics of care. She distinguishes between "distortion of caring" on the one hand and "undistorted caring" one the other. According to Mullet, a person cannot truly care for someone if she is economically, socially, and/or psychologically coerced to do so. Thus, genuine, or fully authentic caring cannot occur, for example, under conditions characterized by male domination and female subordination. Only under conditions of sexual equality and freedom can women care for men without men diminishing, disempowering, and/or disregarding them. As long as men demand and expect more caring from women than women demand and expect from men, both sexes will remain morally impoverished. Neither men nor women will be able to authentically care.
Bartky's and Mullet's interpretation of care are far too pessimistic in the opinion of the thinkers--and there are more than Gilligan--who favor "feminine" approaches to ethics. They stress that even if it is dangerous for women to care in a patriarchal society, care remains part of the solution as well as part of the problem. Care's conflicted status calls for the development of a more robust ethics of care, not for the abandonment of care.
In response to the summons for a sound and complete ethics of care, Nel Noddings has developed a feminine, relational ethics. For Noddings, ethics is about particular relationships between two parties, the "one-caring" and the "cared-for." Caring is not simply a matter of feeling favorably disposed towards humankind in general, of being concerned about people with whom one has no concrete connection. I can't be said to care about the children in Somalia as much as I care for my own two sons. Real care requires actual encounters with specific individuals; it cannot be accomplished through good intentions alone.
Noddings claims that as children we act from a natural caring that moves us to help others simply because we want to. Later, when society distorts our wants and makes it harder for us to care, the deliberateness of ethical caring supplements the spontaneity of natural caring. Nevertheless, says Noddings, natural caring remains somehow better than ethical caring--and certainly the condition of its possibility.
Although Noddings insists that men as well as women can and should be carers, most of her examples of caring involve women, many of whom seem to care too much--that is, to the point of imperiling their own identity, integrity, and even survival. Although Noddings protests that, in her estimation, it is moral for the one-caring to care for herself, she conveys the impression that the one caring should care for herself only insomuch as her self-caring enables her to care for others better. Thus, the one-caring's self-caring is actually a disguised form of other-directed care.
In her maternal approach to ethics, Ruddick claims that society should not trivialize what she terms "maternal practice." Like any human practice, maternal practice has its own form of thinking with a vocabulary and logic peculiar to it, and its own aims and goals. In the case of maternal thinking, these aims and goals consist in the preservation, growth, and acceptability of one's children (Ruddick, Maternal Thinking, 1989).
Preserving the life of a child is the "constitutive maternal act." Infants are totally vulnerable. They simply will not survive unless their caretakers feed, clothe, and shelter them. Ruddick gives the example of Julie, an exhausted young mother with a very demanding infant. Having reached her physical and psychological limits, Julie pictures herself killing her baby daughter. Horrified by her own thought, Julie spends the night riding a city bus, her baby in her arms. She reasons that, as long as they remain in the public eye, she will not harm her baby.
Ruddick tells Julie's story to stress how difficult it is for a mother to meet her child's material needs. Not every mother grows so run-down and desperate that she has to take steps to ensure that she will not slaughter her child. However, even under relatively ideal circumstances, most mothers do have days when they wish they were not mothers. In order to be able to "preserve" their children on these bad days, says Ruddick, mothers should cultivate the intellectual virtue of scrutiny and the moral virtues of humility and cheerfulness. Armed with these three virtues, mothers will be able to roll with the punches that life delivers to children and adults alike.
The second dimension of Ruddick's maternal-practice is fostering children's growth. Whatever fostering a child's growth may mean, it does not mean the act of imposing an already written script on one's child. A mother should not hand book entitled The Tale of the Perfect Child to her daughter insisting that she enact in her imperfect life scenes of the "perfect child's" perfect life. Rather, a mother should tell her daughter, realistic, compassionate, and delightful "maternal stories"--the kind of stories that will enable her daughter to realize that she is lovable despite her weaknesses.
The third and final dimension of Ruddick's maternal practice is training. For the most part, mothers work hard to socialize their children--to help them become committed and concerned citizens as opposed to members of either armed gangs or opium dens. On occasion, however, mothers will demur from "properly" socializing their children. For example, they will refuse to fit their children's vulnerable bodies into military uniforms, or diet them into designer jeans, or dress them for success in the so-called "dog-eat-dog" world. In a patriarchal society--that is, an overly competitive, hierarchical, and individualistic society-mothers may find themselves caught between the external demands of patriarchy on the one hand and their own inner conviction that these external demands are dehumanizing ones on the other. If a mother trains her son to dress for success, he may become both the chief executive officer of a large firm and a very mean-spirited human being. In contrast, if she refuses to teach her son the lessons of conformity, he may become both an exemplary human being and someone whom patriarchy labels "a loser." Like all mothers, says Ruddick, this mother must decide whether her maternal values or those of the larger society should guide her child-training practices.
Grounding the work of preserving, fostering the growth of, and training children, says Ruddick, is the metavirtue of "attentive love." This metavirtue, which is at once cognitive and affective, rational and emotional, enables mothers to look their children in the eyes and not be shocked, horrified, or appalled by what they see. Indeed, among the several characteristics that distinguish maternal thinkers from nonmaternal thinkers is their utter realism. Mothers who love their children inattentively let their fantasies blind them. They do not see their children as they actually are. Rather they see their children as they could perhaps be: the fulfillment of their dreams. In contrast to these mothers, mothers who love their children attentively accept their children for whom they are, working within their physical and psychological limits.
Ruddick's ultimate goal is not simply to develop a phenomenology of maternal practice. Rather, she wants to demonstrate that anyone, male or female, who engages in maternal practice will come to think like a mother in the public world as well as the private world. If men spent as much time rearing children as women do, men as well as women would come to think and see what mothers think and see. People who think and see like mothers make connections, for example, between war in the abstract and war in the concrete. For them, war is not about winning, defending one's way of life, and establishing one's position of power. Instead, it is about destroying that boy or girl whom one has spent years preserving, nurturing, and training: a unique human person who cannot be replaced. In sum, for a maternal thinker, war is about death--about canceling out the "product(s)" of maternal practice.
Held approaches maternal practice from a somewhat different perspective than Ruddick does. She suggests that because women have spent so much of their time mothering, they should develop moral theories that fit the kind of relationships and activities that characterize the private rather than the public domain. Although Held knows that not all women live in the private world, and although she does not believe that all women are determined by nature to have a distinctive set of moral experiences, she nonetheless claims that a sizable gap exists between women's and men's moral experience. It concerns her that traditional western ethics not only discounts women's morality but presents what amounts to men's morality as gender neutral morality. She claims that if traditional western ethics really gender-neutral, however, it would not favor paradigms--for example, the contract model --that speak much more to men's experience than to women's. In Held's estimation, too many traditional western ethicists bless a human relationship as moral to the degree that it serves the separate interests of individual rational contractors. Yet life is about more than conflict, competition, and controversy--about getting what one wants. It is, as mothering persons know, also about cooperation, consensus, and community- about meeting other people's needs. Held speculates that were the relationship between a mothering person and a child, rather than the relationship between two rational contractors, the paradigm for good human relationships, society might look very different (Held, "Feminism and Moral Theory," 1987).
Held concedes, however, that the kind of relationships that exists between mothering persons and children can be just as oppressive--indeed, even more oppressive--than the relationship that exist between two rational contractors. For example, it is sometimes harder to recognize abuses of power in a father-son relationship than in an employer-employee relationship. A father's subtle pressure that his artistic son give up the theater and go to law school may not be as evident an abuse of power as the executive who steals his assistant's ideas and presents them as his own, but both situations exploit and undercut the autonomy of the two relatively powerless agents involved.
Held also admits that, in their attempt to celebrate the positive features of maternal ethics, some maternal thinkers unnecessarily reject the valuable features of traditional ethics. Just because a maternal ethics can handle issues that exceed the "moral minimum" of taking everyone's rights seriously does not mean that it should dispense with this "moral minimum." Mothering persons must be fair as well as compassionate; rational as well as emotional; able to make generalizations about human relations as well as to articulate their unique features. A maternal thinker who says that no two human relationships are ever alike invites moral chaos. Like principles, relationships can be qualified as good, better, or best (bad, worse, or worst), and that which is subject to qualification is also subject to evaluation. In the same way that we can ask what makes a principle good or bad, we can ask what makes a relationship good or bad.
Unlike some maternal thinkers, Held believes that men as well as women can be mothering persons. Just because men cannot bear children does not mean that they cannot rear children. Men as well as women can, indeed should, appropriate the moral outlook of those who care for others. Leaving caregiving to women alone produces boys with relatively combative and insensitive personalities. Because bellicose, unfeeling boys usually mature into bellicose, unfeeling men in positions of power, Held claims that human survival may depend on our ability to reorganize the way we parent. Equal parenting, based on men's and women's equal respect and consideration for each other's equal rights of self-determination must become the order of the day (Held, "The Obligations of Mothers and Fathers," 1984).
Despite the fact that Held believes that men as well as women can mother, she still indicates that there may be a qualitative difference between female mothering and male mothering. The fact that women can bear children as well as rear children may signal that women are, afterall, more responsible than men for the existence of new persons. She notes that although women need men to begin a pregnancy, they do not need men to end a pregnancy. Through abortion or suicide, women can say a definite "no" to life.
By stressing women's ultimate responsibility for bringing (or not bringing) new persons into existence, Held does not wish to negate her previous point that fathers as well as mothers are obligated to rear children. Because men participate in the creation of life, they should participate in its maintenance. Nevertheless, men's direct role in procreation lasts but a few moments, whereas women's lasts for nine months. The experiences of pregnancy make women especially aware of their procreative role. For example, when a pregnant woman eats, she can focus on the fact that she is, as they old saying goes, "eating for two." If she fails to eat a healthy diet, both she and the fetus will suffer. Likewise, when a pregnant women finally gives birth, she can say to herself, "Through this pain, I bring life into this world." These kinds of experiences are ones that a man can never have. The well-being of the fetus his sperm helped create depends on him only indirectly, and he will probably never be called to physically suffer for his son or daughter as much as his wife (or lover) did on the day she gave birth to their child.
Even if the daily toil of bringing up a child will eventually take a greater toll on a parent than the momentary suffering of giving birth, Held asserts that we should not trivialize the birthing act as if it had no effect whatsoever on subsequent parent-child relationships. In suggesting that biological experiences may influence the attitudes of the mother and father toward the preciousness of a particular child, Held wants to explore the relationship between the kind of feelings women and men have for their children on the one hand and the kind of obligations they have to them on the other. If ethicists assume that "natural" male tendencies like the desire to pursue their own self-interest competively play a role in determining men's moral rights and responsibilities, then they should make the same assumption about "natural" female tendencies like the tendency to center their lives on the well-being of their children. Thus, the fact that mothers shudder at the Biblical account of Abraham, who was willing to kill his son, Isaac, in order to honor God's command, is to be expected. Women who birth children--who preserve, nurture, and train them--are not likely to believe that obeying a command, even a command of God, is more valuable than preserving the very lives of these children. To be sure, from the standpoint of traditional western ethics, a mother's refusal to subordinate the concrete life of her child to the abstract commands of duty or higher law indicates her underdevelopment as a moral agent. Yet, in an age where a blindness to interconnection has led to the destruction of the environment and a perilous buildup of the nuclear arsenal, a focus on connection rather than individualistic rights may indeed not only suggest a higher morality but offer a saving grace in an increasingly chaotic world.
In general Whitbeck offers an interpretation of mothering that, more than Ruddick's or Held's, emphasizes the biological facts of motherhood. In fact, Whitbeck suggests that women's "maternal instinct" causes them to notice things about their babies that men do not. Specifically, a mother often feels as vulnerable as an infant throughout her pregnancy, but especially during labor. It is her helplessness--in the sense of losing control of her body during pregnancy, of suffering pain during labor, of feeling weak during the postpartum period- that enables a mother to understand just how dependent her infant is on her. No matter how hard a father tries, he can never experience either a mother's or an infant's helplessness. All he can do is to intellectualize about this experience, sympathizing with it the best he can.
Despite the fact that Whitbeck concedes that men can learn how to mother their children and that women can choose not to mother their children, she nonetheless believes that men's and women's different biological experiences typically affect the intensity of their respective attachments to their offspring. The bodily experiences that women have simply because they are women tend to deepen those feelings and attitudes which cause people generally to care for their infants. To the degree that human beings are mind-body unities rather than mind-body dualities, a mother's physical experiences will affect the way she thinks about her children (Whitbeck, "The Maternal Instinct," 1984).
The critics of maternal approaches to ethics, like the critics of feminine approaches to ethics, are of two kinds: nonfeminist and feminist. Nonfeminist critics doubt that any one human relationship either can, or should, serve as the paradigm for all human relationships. As they see it, any human relationship--be it one of husband-wife, parent-child, sibling-sibling, friend-friend, or ruler subject--is simply too specific to provide a general model for how people should treat each and every person with equal respect and consideration. Certainly, relationships between unequals should not serve as the model for relationships between equals or vice versa.
Feminist critics express reservations about maternal approaches to ethics quite similar to those of non-feminist critics. They note that Ruddick herself has some doubts even about her own version of maternal ethics. She worries that she might be over-idealizing mothers, unnecessarily excluding men and nonbiological mothers from maternal work, and underemphasizing the differences that exist among mothers, some of whom find themselves "mothering" under extremely oppressive circumstances.
Stressing that some mothers abuse and neglect their children, that many men and nonbiological mothers are just as good or even better parents than many biological mothers, other feminist critics add the point that the mother-child relationship is a particularly problematic choice for a moral paradigm, freighted as it is with enough patriarchal baggage to weigh down even the strongest of women. Although these feminists critics of maternal approaches to ethics concede that the mother-child relationship is a better model for human and humanizing relationships than the traditional rational-contractor model, they believe that even better models are available. After all, the mother-child relationship is not the only human relationship that is based more on need than on desire, more on love than on obligation, and more on trust than on fear. Friendship relationships, especially ones based on shared goals and aspirations as well as on having a good time and/or on providing emotional and economic support, offer all that the mother-child relationship offers and more. Held together by tears, laughter, and sweat rather than waivers, subpoenas, and depositions, friendship relations seem to hold out more possibilities for moral development than contractual relations. They are also less imbalanced than mother-child relationships in that the parties to them are equals in the sense that they can give to each other approximately as much as they take from each other (Friedman, What Are Friends For?:Feminist Perspectives on Personal Relationships and Moral Theory, 1990).
Focused as they are on questions about power, those developing fully feminist approaches to ethics offer action guides aimed at subverting rather than reinforcing the present systematic subordination of women. Liberal, Marxist, radical, socialist, multicultural, global, and ecological feminists have each offered a different set of explanations and solutions for this state of affairs. So too have existentialist, psychoanalytic, cultural, and postmodern feminists. Proponents of these varied schools of feminist thought maintain that the destruction of all systems, structures, institutions, and practices that create or maintain invidious power differentials between men and women is the necessary prerequisite for the creation of gender equality.
Liberal feminists charge that the main cause of female subordination is a set of informal rules and formal laws that block women's entrance and/or success in the public world. Excluded from places such as the academy, the forum, the marketplace, and the operating room, women cannot reach their potential. Women cannot become men's full equals until society grants women the same educational opportunities and political rights it grants men.
Marxist feminists disagree with liberal feminists. They argue that it is impossible for any oppressed person, especially a female one, to prosper personally and professionally in a class society. The only effective way to end women's subordination to men is to replace the capitalist system with a socialist system in which both women and men are paid fair wages for their work. Women must be men's economic as well as educational and political equals before they can be as powerful as men.
Disagreeing with both Marxist and liberal feminists, radical feminists claim that the primary causes of women's subordination to men are women's sexual and reproductive roles and responsibilities. Radical feminists demand an end to all systems and structures that in any way restrict women's sexual preferences and procreative choices. Unless women become truly free to have or not have children, to love or not love men, women will remain men's subordinates.
Seeing wisdom in both radical and Marxist feminist ideas, socialist feminists attempt to weave these separate streams of thought into a coherent whole. For example, in Women's Estate, Juliet Mitchell argues that four structures overdetermine women's condition: production, reproduction, sexuality, and the socialization of children. A woman's status and function in all of these structures must change if she is to be a man's equal. Furthermore, as Mitchell adds in Psychoanalysis and Feminism, a woman's interior world, her psyche, must also be transformed;
for unless a woman is convinced of her own value, no change in her exterior world can totally liberate her.
Multicultural feminists generally affirm socialist feminist thought, but they believe it is inattentive to issues of race and ethnicity. They note, for example, that U.S. "white" culture does not praise the physical attractiveness of African American women in a way that validates the natural arrangement of black facial features and bodies, but only insofar as they look white with straightened hair, very light brown skin and thin figures. Thus, African-American women are doubly oppressed. Not only are they subject to gender discrimination in its many forms, but racial discrimination as well.
Although global feminists praise the ways in which multiculturalist feminists have amplified socialist feminist thought, they nonetheless regard even this enriched discussion of women's oppression as incomplete. All too often, feminists focus in a nearly exclusive manner on the gender politics of their own nation. Thus, while U.S. feminists struggle to formulate laws to prevent sexual harassment and date rape, thousands of women in Central America, for example, are sexually tortured on account of their own, their fathers', their husbands', or their sons' political beliefs. Similarly, while U.S. feminists debate the extent to which contraceptives ought to be funded by the government or distributed in public schools, women in many Asian and African countries have no access to contraception or family planning services from any source.
Ecofeminists agree with global feminists that it is important for women to understand how women's interests can diverge as well as converse. When a wealthy U.S. woman seeks to adopt a child, for example, her desire might prompt profiteering middlemen to prey on indigent Asian or African women, desperate to give their yet-to-be-born children a life better than their own. Ecofeminists add another concern to this analysis: In wanting to give her adopted child the best that money can buy, an affluent woman might not realize how her spending habits negatively affect not only less fortunate women and their families, but also many members of the greater animal community and the environment in general.
Departing from these inclusionary ways of understanding women's oppression, existentialist feminists stress how, in the final analysis, all selves are lonely and in fundamental conflict. In The Second Sex, Simone de Beauvoir writes that, from the beginning, man has named himself the Self and woman the Other. If the Other is a threat to the Self, then woman is a threat to man; and if men wish to remain free, they must not only economically, politically, and sexually subordinate women to themselves, but also convince women they deserve no better treatment. Thus, if women are to become true Selves, they must recognize themselves as free and responsible moral agents who possess the capacity to perform excellently in the public as well as the private world.
Like existentialist feminists, psychoanalytic and cultural feminists seek an explanation of women's oppression in the inner recesses of women's psyche. As they see it, because children are reared almost exclusively by women, boys and girls are psychosocialized in radically different ways. Boys grow up wanting to separate themselves from others and from the values culturally linked to their mothers and sisters. In contrast, girls grow up copying their mothers' behavior and wanting to remain connected to them and others. Moreover, because of the patriarchal cues they receive both in and outside the home, boys and girls-come to think that such "masculine" values as justice and conscientiousness, which they associate with culture and the public world, are more fully human than such "feminine" values as caring and kindness, which they associate with nature and the private world.
In the estimation of many psychoanalytic and cultural feminists, the solution to this dichotomous, women-demeaning state of affairs rests in some type of dual-parenting arrangement. Were men to spend as much time fathering as women presently spend mothering, and were women to play as active a role in the world of enterprise as men currently do, then children would cease to associate authority, autonomy, and universalism with men and love, dependence, and particularism with women. Rather, they would identify all of these ways of being and thinking as ones that full persons incorporate in their daily lives.
Finally, as postmodern feminists see it, all attempts to provide a single explanation for women's oppression not only will fail but should also fail. They will fail because there is no one entity, "Woman," upon whom a label may be fixed. Women are individuals, each with a unique story to tell about a particular self. Moreover, any single explanation for "Woman's" oppression should fail from a feminist point of view, for it would be yet another instance of so-call "phallogocentric" thought: that is, the kind of "male thinking" that insists on telling as absolute truth one and only one story about reality. Women must, in the estimation of postmortem feminists reveal their differences to each other so that they can better resist the patriarchal tendency to center, congeal, and cement thought into a rigid "truth" that always was, is, and forever will be.
Because feminist approaches to ethics focus on how power is used to oppress women in particular, nonfeminist critics of them have complained that these approaches are "female-biased." Ethics, insist these critics, cannot proceed from a specific standpoint--in this case, from the standpoint of women--and still be regarded as an ethics. Indeed, traditional western ethics has proceeded on the assumption that its values and rules apply to all rational persons equally. Yet, any number of the "Great Philosophers"' moral theories seem to be based on the moral experience of men--usually powerful ones--as opposed to women. For example, Aristotle's ethics reflects the values of Athenian citizens: that is, property-owning Greek males. It does not reflect the values of Greek females or of slaves/foreigners--be they male or female. Nevertheless, traditional western ethicists have tried to make the case that, properly interpreted, Aristotle's ethics applies equally well to both women and men, to both non-Greeks and Greeks; and that it would be misguided to deliberately--as opposed to nonreflectively- construct an ethics that focuses on a specific group of people.
Related to the above controversy are similar controversies about women's history and literature courses, for example. A person developing a feminist approach to ethics could argue, for example, that she is simply doing what Aristotle, Mill, and Kant should have done in the first place--namely, paying as much attention to women's moral experience as men's. In the same way that historians have ignored the stresses, strains, and struggles of the private world of children, church, and kitchen to focus on the economic revolutions, political upheavals, and military conquests of the public world, traditional western ethicists have focused on men's moral interests, issues, and values, failing to notice just how significant and interesting women's moral issues and values are. Therefore, when a proponent of feminist ethics insists on highlighting "women's morality," she may be doing little more than some corrective surgery--adding women's moral experiences to a male-biased ethical tradition sorely in need of them.
However, she may be doing more than this. She may be suggesting that it is not enough for traditional western ethics to incorporate women's interests and issues, and to recognize women as moral agents who must be taken seriously. On the contrary, she may be urging the "Tradition" to rethink all of the ontological and epistemological assumptions upon which it is based; and even to consider the possibility, that far from being sources of human liberation, its principles, rules, regulations, norms, and criteria actually serve to support patterns of domination and subordination that "demoralize" everyone.
If its focus on women-oppressive system and structures is indeed what makes an ethics feminist, as opposed to simply feminine or maternal, then Alison Jaggar's summary of the fourfold function of feminist ethics cannot be improved upon in any significant way. According to Jaggar, all fully feminist approaches to ethics seek to (1) articulate moral critiques of actions and practices that perpetuate women's subordination; (2) prescribe morally justifiable ways of resisting such actions and practices; (3) envision morally desirable alternatives for such actions and practices; and (4) take women's moral experience seriously, though not uncritically (Jaggar, "Feminist Ethics" 1992). Women should not focus on making the world a better place for everyone in general; rather, their primary aim should be to make the world a better place for women in particular -and perhaps also for other vulnerable people like children, the elderly, the infirm, the disabled, minorities, etc. In Jaggar's estimation, encouraging women with supportive thoughts, kind words, and benign actions is not enough. A feminist approach to ethics entails women resisting and overcoming their continuing oppression under patriarchy.
Second, lesbian ethics threatens the Tradition because thinkers like Mary Daly recommend a transvaluation of values equal to the one Nietzsche offered nineteenth-century western moralists. Nietzsche's disenchantment with western civilization--and its good-naturedness, mediocrity, egalitarianism, softness--led him to redefine and counter prevailing notions of good and bad. Virtue, said Nietzsche, does not consist in what the Jews, Christians, democrats and socialists believe it consists; namely, kindness, humility, and sympathy. Rather it consists in what noble aristocrats, or übermenschen, regard as good; namely, assertiveness, aloofness, and pridefulness. What western civilization has come to accept as "good" is in actuality very bad, insisted Nietzsche. Value must be transvalued. What is praised as "virtue" must be exposed as vice; and what is condemned as "vice" must be revealed as virtue.
Daly is Nietzschean not because she posits two types of morality--a superior female morality and an inferior male morality--but because she insists that when it comes to women, she whom the patriarch calls "evil," is in fact good, whereas she whom the patriarch calls "good" is in fact bad. If a woman is to escape the traps men have laid for her--if she is to assert her power, to be all that she can--she must realize that it is not good for her to sacrifice, deny, and deprive herself for the sake of the men and children in her life. What is actually good for women, observes Daly, is precisely what patriarchy identifies as evil for women; namely, becoming her own person (Daly, Gyn/Ecology, 1978).
Finally and continuing Daly's revolution, Sarah Lucia Hoagland releases in her Lesbian Ethics (1989) the too-long suppressed female freedom to question and choose. Hoagland says women must replace the questions "Am I good?" and "Is this good" with the question "Does this contribute to my self-creation, freedom, and liberation?" Of course, from the perspective of traditional western ethics, Hoagland's question is not the "right" question to ask.
As Hoagland's supporter Marilyn Frye sees it, however, the need to ask the "right" question tends to arise among people who have a vested interest not only in being good but also in making others be good. For example, a white/Christian/middle-class/ heterosexual American bases his conception of himself as a judge, teacher, preacher, director, administrator, manager, leader and in this mode, as an authority, upon his conviction that he is in the right--that he knows what is good for others as well as himself. So long as women continue to accept this "male" conception of moral agency, says Frye, they will have only two choices: (1) to become like men so that they can exert men's moral authority over others; or (2) to become female moral authorities who then make it their business to exert women's moral authority over others.
That Frye should regard both of these options as unacceptable is not surprising. The first forces women to negate themselves; and the second sends women down the same moral blind-alley men have supposedly gone. If ethics is about some people not only proclaiming to other people what is "good" for them, but imposing that "good" upon them, then Frye welcomes the criticism that lesbian approaches to ethics are not really about ethics. Only those who have a vested interest in the status quo, in the powerful remaining powerful, require certitude about their righteousness and their warrant to "direct" and "administer" everything. But because lesbians are some of society's least powerful members, says Frye, they have no way to impose their conception of the good on anyone but themselves nor do they have any desire to do so (Frye, "A Response to Lesbian Ethics: Why Ethics?", 1991).
Claiming the particularity rather than universality of their conception of the good, lesbian ethicists contrast their self-created values with the Tradition's other-imposed values. They imply that insofar as lesbians are concerned, the act of choosing, in and of itself, makes what is chosen somehow "good." More than any other feature of lesbian ethics, it is this one that provokes comment from its nonfeminist critics. These critics ask thinkers like Frye and Hoagland if it makes no moral difference to them what a lesbian chooses, provided that she freely choose it.
To this query Hoagland has a response. She notes that so many limitations and boundaries have been imposed on lesbian choice that perhaps for now choice is of more moral importance to lesbians than the things chosen. Still, Hoagland does not mean to insist there are no limits on lesbian choice. At one point in her analysis of what constitutes moral agency and interaction, Hoagland observes that in choosing for herself, a lesbian chooses for other lesbians, who in turn choose for her. Lesbians do not weave value in isolation from each other; they weave value together. Ethics is not an individualistic quest; moral value does not emerge from somewhere deep within one's self or from far outside of one's self. On the contrary, moral value--that is, meaning--emerges from what Hoagland terms "lesbian context," or "an energy field capable of resisting oppression." A lesbian approach to ethics is about lesbians becoming the kind of human beings who refuse to participate in anything other than egalitarian relationships (Hoagland, Lesbian Ethics, 1989)..
Insofar as relationships of domination and subordination are a very bad thing indeed, what heterosexual women and men can learn from a lesbian approach to ethics, then, is what Hoagland and other lesbian ethicists--Maria Lugones in particular--term "playfulness;" that is, "the ability to travel in and out of each other's worlds" (Lugones, "Playfulness, `World'-travelling, and Loving Perception," 1987). In fact, Hoagland believes that playfulness is the essence of a lesbian approach to ethics--a welcome relief, to what she perceives as the deadly and deadening seriousness of traditional western approaches to ethics. An emphasis on playfulness--on adventure, curiosity, desire--enables lesbians to create moral meanings and values for lesbians only, leaving it to nonlesbians to create their own moral meanings and values.
Although feminists' different interpretations of what constitutes a voluntary and intentional choice, an illegitimate or legitimate exercise of control, and a healthy or a pathological relationship reassure the intellectual and moral community that, after all, feminism is not a monolithic ideology that prescribes one and only one way for all women to be, this variety of thought is also the occasion of considerable political fragmentation among feminists. Asked to come to the policy table to express the feminist perspective on a moral issue, all that an honest feminist ethicist can say is that there is no such perspective. Yet, if feminists have no clear, cogent, and unified position on a key moral issue, then a perspective less appealing to women may fill the gap. Although it is crucial for feminist ethicists to emphasize, for example, how a policy that benefits one group of women might at the same time harm another group of women, it is probably a mistake for feminist ethicists to leave the policy table without suggesting policies that are able to serve the most important interests of the widest range of women. For this reason, many feminist ethicists believe that, over and beyond their commitment to eliminating gender inequality, feminists need to develop a mutually-agreeable methodology that will permit them to achieve a consensus position on many, if not all, the moral issues related to women. Feminist ethicists have a moral duty first to listen to each others' differing points of view, and then to develop a theory and practice that, despite their shortcomings, will nevertheless help inch as many women as possible towards the goal of gender equality with men.
Table of Contents
First published: February 16, 1998
Content last modified: February 16, 1998