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My concern will be with voluntary euthanasia - that is, with those instances of euthanasia in which a clearly competent person makes a voluntary and enduring request to be helped to die. I shall have occasion to mention non-voluntary euthanasia - instances of euthanasia where a person is either not competent or unable to express a wish about euthanasia - only in the context of considering the claim that permitting voluntary euthanasia will lead via a slippery slope to permitting non-voluntary euthanasia. I shall not have anything to say about involuntary euthanasia, where a competent person's life is brought to an end despite an explicit expression of opposition to euthanasia, beyond saying that, no matter how honourable the perpetrator's motive, such a death is, and ought to be, unlawful.
Debate about the morality and legality of voluntary euthanasia is, for the most part, a phenomenon of the second half of the twentieth century. Certainly, the ancient Greeks and Romans did not consider life needed to be preserved at any cost and were, in consequence, tolerant of suicide in cases where no relief could be offered to the dying or, in the case of the Stoics and Epicereans, where a person no longer cared for his life. In the sixteenth century, Thomas More, in describing a utopian community, envisaged such a community as one that would facilitate the death of those whose lives had become burdensome as a result of `torturing and lingering pain'. But it has only been in this century that there have been concerted efforts to provide, through the law, for voluntary euthanasia. Until quite recently there had been no success in obtaining such legal provision. However, in, the nineteen seventies and eighties a series of court cases in The Netherlands culminated in agreement being reached between the legal and medical authorities to ensure that no physician would be prosecuted for assisting a patient to die as long as certain guidelines were strictly adhered to. In brief, the guidelines require that physicians may practise voluntary euthanasia where a competent patient has made a voluntary and informed decision to die, the patient's suffering is unbearable, there is no way of making that suffering bearable which is acceptable to the patient, and the physician's judgements as to diagnosis and prognosis are confirmed after consultation with another physician. In the nineteen nineties the first legislative approval for voluntary euthanasia was achieved with the passage of a bill in the parliament of Australia's Northern Territory to enable physicians to practise voluntary euthanasia. Though the Act has been recently proclaimed, it is faced with a series of legal challenges from opponents of voluntary euthanasia. In Oregon in the United States a referendum gave approval for voluntary euthanasia to be practised. As yet no legislation has been enacted to give legal recognition to the outcome of the referendum because of a court challenge.
With that brief sketch of the historical background in place I shall now proceed to set out the conditions which those who have advocated making voluntary euthanasia legally permissible have wished to insist should be satisfied. The conditions are stated with some care so as to focus the moral debate about legislation. Second, I will go on to outline the positive moral case underpinning the push to make voluntary euthanasia legally permissible. Third, I will then consider the more important of the morally grounded objections which have been advanced by those opposed to the legalisation of voluntary euthanasia.
a) suffering from a terminal illness; b) unlikely to benefit from the discovery of a cure for that illness during what remains of her life expectancy; c) as a direct result of the illness, either suffering intolerable pain, or only has available a life that is unacceptably burdensome (because the illness has to be treated in ways which lead to her being unacceptably dependent on others or on technological means of life support); d) has an enduring, voluntary and rational wish to die (or has, prior to losing the competence to do so, expressed a wish to die in the event that conditions a - c are satisfied); and e) unable without assistance to commit suicide,then there should be legal and medical provision to enable her to be allowed to die or assisted to die.
It should be acknowledged that these conditions are quite restrictive, indeed more restrictive than some would think appropriate. In particular, the conditions concern access only to voluntary euthanasia for those who are terminally ill. While that that expression is not free of all ambiguity, for present purposes it can be agreed that it does not include the bringing about of the death of, say, victims of accidents who are rendered quadriplegic or victims of early Alzheimer's Disease. Those who consider that such cases show the first condition to be too restrictive may nonetheless accept that including them would, at least for the time being, make it far harder to obtain legal protection for helping those terminally ill persons who wish to die. The fifth condition further restricts access to voluntary euthanasia by excluding those capable of ending their own lives, and so will not only be thought unduly restrictive by those who think physician-assisted suicide a better course to follow, but will be considered morally much harder to justify by those who think health care practitioners may never justifiably kill their patients. More on this anon.
The second condition is intended simply to reflect the fact that we normally are able to say that someone's health status is incurable. So-called `miracle' cures may be spoken of by sensationalist journalists, but progress toward medical breakthroughs is typically painstaking. If there are miracles wrought by God that will be quite another matter entirely but it is at least clear that not everyone's death is thus to be staved off.
The third condition recognises what many who oppose the legalisation of voluntary euthanasia do not, namely that it is not only release from pain that leads people to want to be helped to die. Sufferers from some terminal conditions may have their pain relieved but have to endure side effects that for them make life unbearable. Others may not have to cope with pain but instead be incapable, as with motor neurone disease, of living without life supports which at the same time rob their lives of quality.
A final preliminary point is that the fourth condition requires that the choice to die not only be voluntary but that it be made in an enduring (not merely a one-off) way and be rational. The choice is one that will require discussion and time for reflection and so should not be settled in a moment. As in other decisions affecting matters of importance, normal adults are presumed to choose voluntarily unless the presence of defeating considerations can be established. The onus of establishing lack of voluntariness or lack of rationality is on those who refuse to accept the person's choice. There is no need to deny that it can sometimes be met (e.g. by pointing to the person's being in a state of clinical depression). The claim is only that the onus falls on those who deny that a normal adult's choice is not competent.
The technological interventions of modern medicine have had an effect on how drawn out the dying phase may be. Sometimes this added life is an occasion for rejoicing, sometimes it may serve to stretch out the period of significant physical and intellectual decline in such a way as to impair and burden the end of life so that life comes to be no longer worth living. There is no single, objectively correct answer, which has application to everyone, as to when, if at all, life becomes a burden and unwanted. But that simply points up the importance of individuals being able to decide autonomously for themselves whether their own lives retain sufficient quality and dignity. In making such decisions individuals decide about the mix between their self-determination and their well-being that suits them. Given that a critically ill person is typically in a severely compromised and debilitated state it is, other things being equal, the patient's judgement of whether continued life is a benefit that must carry the greatest weight provided always that the patient is competent.
Suppose it is agreed that a person's exercise of her autonomy warrants our respect. If medical assistance is to be provided to help a person achieve her autonomously chosen goal of an easeful death (because she cannot end her own life), the autonomy of the assisting professional(s) also has to be respected. The value (or right) of self-determination does not entitle a patient to compel a medical professional to act contrary to her own moral or professional values. If voluntary euthanasia is to be legally permitted it must be against a backdrop of respect for professional autonomy. Thus if a doctor's view of her moral or professional responsibilities is at odds with the request of her patient for euthanasia, provision must be made for the transfer of the patient's care to another who faces no such conflict.
Opponents of voluntary euthanasia have endeavoured to counter this very straightforward moral case for the practice in a variety of ways. Some of the counter-arguments are concerned only with whether the moral case warrants making the practice of voluntary euthanasia legal, others are concerned with trying to undermine the moral case itself. In what follows consideration will be given to the six most important of the counter-arguments. (Some less important moral objections to the practice of voluntary euthanasia are considered in Young, 1976, esp. pp. 265-275.)
There are several flaws in this counter-argument. First, while both good palliative care and hospice care make important contributions to the care of the dying neither is a panacea. To get the best palliative care for an individual involves trial and error with some consequent suffering in the process. But, far more importantly, even high quality palliative care commonly exacts a price in the form of side effects such as nausea, incontinence, loss of awareness because of semi-permanent drowsiness and so on. A rosy picture is often painted as to how palliative care can transform the plight of the dying. Such a picture is misleading according to those who have closely observed the effect of extended courses of treatment with drugs like morphine, a point acknowledged as well by many skilled palliative care specialists. Second, though the sort of care provided through hospices is to be applauded, it is care that is available only to a small proportion of the terminally ill and then usually only in the very last stages of the illness (typically a matter of a few weeks). Third, the point of greatest significance is that not everyone wishes to avail themselves of either palliative care or hospice care. For those who prefer to die in their own way and in their own time neither palliative care nor hospice care may be attractive. For many dying patients it is having their autonomous wishes frustrated that is a source of the deepest distress. Fourth, as indicated earlier when the conditions under which voluntary euthanasia is advocated were outlined, not everyone who is dying is suffering because of the pain occasioned by their illness. For those for whom what is intolerable is their dependence on others or on machinery, the availability of effective pain control will be quite irrelevant.
ii. A second, related objection to permitting the legalisation of voluntary euthanasia is to the effect that we never have sufficient evidence to be justified in believing that a dying person's request to be helped to die is rational, enduring and genuinely voluntary.
Notice first that a request to die may not reflect an enduring desire to die (cf. some attempts to commit suicide may similarly reflect temporary despair). That is why advocates of voluntary euthanasia have agreed that normally a cooling off period should be allowed. But that said, the objection claims we can never be justified in believing someone's request to die reflects a settled preference for death. This goes too far. If someone discusses the issue with others on different occasions, or reflects on the issue over an extended period, and does not waver in her conviction, her wish to die is surely an enduring one.
But, it might be said, what if a person is racked with pain, or befuddled because of the measures taken to relieve her pain, and so not able to think clearly and rationally about the alternatives? It has to be agreed that a person in those circumstances who wants to die cannot be assumed to have a rational, enduring and genuinely voluntary desire to die. However, there are at least two important points to make about those in such circumstances. First, they do not account for all of the terminally ill, so even if it is acknowledged that such people are incapable of agreeing to voluntary euthanasia that does not show that no one can ever voluntarily request help to die. Second, it is possible for a person to indicate in advance of losing the capacity to give rational, enduring and voluntary consent, how she would wish to be treated should she become terminally ill and be suffering intolerably from pain or from loss of control over her life. `Living wills' or `advance declarations' are legally useful instruments for giving voice to people's wishes while they are capable of giving rational, enduring and voluntary consent, including to their wanting help to die. As long as they are easily revocable in the event of a change of mind (just as ordinary wills are), they should be respected as evidence of a well thought out conviction.
Perhaps, though, what is really at issue in this objection is whether anyone can ever form a rational, enduring and voluntary wish about being better off dead rather than continuing to suffer from an illness before actually suffering the illness. If this is what underlies the objection it is surely too paternalistic to be acceptable. Why cannot a person have sufficient inductive evidence (e.g. based on the experience of the deaths of friends or family) to know her own mind and act accordingly?
iii. According to the traditional `doctrine of double effect' it is permissible to act in ways which it is foreseen will have bad consequences provided only that
(a) this occurs as a side effect (or indirectly) to the achievement of the act which is directly aimed at or intended; (b) the act directly aimed at is itself morally good or, at least, morally neutral; (c) the good effect is not achieved by way of the bad, that is, the bad must not be a means to the good; and (d) the bad consequences must not be so serious as to outweigh the good effect.In line with the doctrine of double effect it is, for example, held to be permissible to alleviate pain by administering drugs like morphine which it is foreseen will shorten life, whereas to give an overdose or injection with the direct intention of terminating a patient's life (whether at her request or not) is considered morally indefensible. This is not the appropriate forum to give full consideration to this doctrine. However, there is one vital criticism to be made of the doctrine in relation to the issue of voluntary euthanasia. With that point made we will be able to turn to the more general question of the moral permissibility of intentional killing.
The criticism of the relevance of the doctrine of double effect to any critique of voluntary euthanasia is simply this: the doctrine can only be relevant where a person's death is an evil or, to put it another way, a harm. Sometimes `harm' is understood simply as damage to a person's interest whether consented to or not. At other times it is more strictly understood as wrongfully inflicted damage. On the latter understanding consent becomes crucial. Unless paternalistic interference is judged to be appropriate the giving of consent removes any suggestion of wrongfulness. So, if the death of a person who wishes to die is not harmful (because from that person's standpoint it is, in fact, beneficial), the doctrine of double effect can have no relevance to the debate about the permissibility of voluntary euthanasia.
iv. There is a widespread belief that passive (voluntary) euthanasia is morally acceptable because steps are simply not taken which could preserve or prolong life (and so a patient is allowed to die), whereas active (voluntary) euthanasia is not because it requires an act of killing. The distinction, despite its widespread popularity, is very unclear. Whether behaviour is described in terms of acts or omissions (which underpins the alleged distinction between active and passive (voluntary) euthanasia), is generally a matter of pragmatics not of anything of deeper importance. Consider, for instance, the practice of deliberately proceeding slowly to a ward in response to a request to provide assistance for a patient who is subject to a `not for resuscitation' code. Or consider `pulling the plug' on an oxygen machine keeping an otherwise dying patient alive as against not replacing the tank when it runs out. Are these acts or omissions; cases of passive euthanasia or active euthanasia?
More fundamentally, though, those who think some reliance can be placed on the distinction think that, at least in a medical context, killing is morally worse than letting die. Consider the case of a patient suffering from motor neurone disease who is completely respirator dependent, finds her condition intolerable, and competently and persistently requests to be removed from the respirator so that she may die. Even the Catholic Church in recent times has been prepared to agree in cases like this one to the turning off of the respirator. Is this merely a case of letting the patient die? It is often said that where motives and consequences are agreed to be in common, if someone's life is intentionally terminated she has been killed, whereas if she is no longer being aggressively treated her life is not ended by the withdrawal of such aggressive treatment but by the underlying disease.
One way to show that it is in most cases implausible to think that the withdrawal of life sustaining measures involves no intention to terminate the patient's life is to consider the growing practice of withholding artificial nutrition and hydration in those instances where a decision has been made to cease aggressive treatment, and then to see if we can generalise to cases like that of the motor neurone sufferer (cf. Winkler, 1995). It is my assessment that those who withdraw artificial nutrition and hydration do intend the deaths of their patients and that sense can be made of what they do only on that basis. Permanently withdrawing nutrition from someone in, say, an irreversible coma (a persistent vegetative state), thereby starving the patient, is not merely to foresee that death will ensue, but to intend the death. What could be the point of the action, the goal aimed at, the intended outcome, if not the ending of the patient's life? No sense can be made of the action as being intended to serve to palliate the disease, or to keep the patient comfortable, or even, in the case of a person in a permanently vegetative state, as allowing the underlying disease to carry the person off. The loss of brain activity is not going to kill the person. What is going to kill the patient is the act of starving her to death. That is the clear intention, not merely something foreseen as an unfortunate side effect, but in no way aimed at.
Can this claim be extended to other circumstances? The giving of massive doses of morphine, way beyond what is needed to control pain, or the removal of a respirator from a sufferer from motor neurone disease would seem, by parallel reasoning, to amount to the intentional bringing about of the death of the person being cared for.
It has to be conceded, though, that there are circumstances where doctors can truthfully say that actions which they perform, or omissions which they make, do lead to the deaths of their patients without them intending that those patients should die. Thus, for instance, if a patient refuses life prolonging medical treatment because she considers it useless, it might reasonably be said that the doctor's intention in complying is simply to respect the patient's wishes. But the point we have been considering is much wider and suggests that it is utterly stilted to claim, as many doctors do, that their actions and omissions are not intended to bring about death and so cannot count as killing.
Two final points need to be added to round off the discussion of the fourth objection. First, much of the debate surrounding the objection is premised on the belief that killing, at least in medical contexts, cannot morally be justified. For that reason alone the medical profession has long found psychological comfort in the belief that even if killing cannot be justified it is quite another thing to allow a patient to die (where that involves no negligence) because there the cause of death is natural. This underlying assumption is one that is open to challenge (and has been challenged in e.g. Rachels, 1986, chs. 7, 8; Kuhse, 1987). First, there will be cases, namely those where someone who has requested assistance to die and is allowed to die, rather than killed, where it is morally worse to allow to die because all that does is prolong the patient's suffering. The second point to make (noted already in connection with the doctrine of double effect) is that despite the longstanding legal doctrine that no one can justifiably consent to be killed (on which more later), it surely is relevant to the justification of an act of killing someone that she has autonomously decided that that would be best for her.
v. It is often said that if society allows voluntary euthanasia to be legally permitted we will have set foot on a slippery slope that will lead us inevitably to support other forms of euthanasia, especially non-voluntary euthanasia. Whereas it was once the common refrain that that was precisely what happened in Hitler's Germany, nowadays the claim tends to be that the experience of The Netherlands in the last decade or so confirms the reality of the slippery slope. Slippery slope arguments, come in at least three different versions: logical, psychological and arbitrary line. What the different forms share is the contention that once the first step is taken on a slippery slope the subsequent steps follow inexorably, whether for logical reasons, psychological reasons or to avoid arbitrariness in `drawing a line' across a person's actions. (For further discussion see e.g. Rachels, 1986, ch. 10; Brock, 1992, pp. 19ff.).
I shall first say something about why at the theoretical level none of these forms of argument appears powerful enough to trouble an advocate of the legalisation of voluntary euthanasia. I shall then, second, comment on the alleged empirical support from the experiences of Hitler's Germany and present day Holland for the existence of a slippery slope beginning from voluntary euthanasia.
There is nothing logically inconsistent in supporting voluntary euthanasia but rejecting non-voluntary euthanasia as morally inappropriate. Since the two issues are logically separate there will be some advocates of voluntary euthanasia who will wish also to lend their support to some acts of non-voluntary euthanasia (e.g. for those in persistent vegetative states who have never indicated their wishes about being helped to die or for some severely disabled infants for whom the outlook is hopeless). Others will think that what may be done with the consent of the patient sets a strict limit on the practice of euthanasia. The difference is not one of logical acumen. It has to be located in the respective values of the different supporters (e.g. whether self-determination alone or the best interests of a person should prevail).
As regards the alleged psychological inevitability of moving from voluntary to non-voluntary euthanasia, again it is hard to see the supposed inevitability. Why should those who value the autonomy of the individual and so support provision for voluntary euthanasia be psychologically driven to support cases of euthanasia which have no connection with the exercise of patient autonomy?
Finally, if there is nothing arbitrary about distinguishing voluntary euthanasia from non-voluntary euthanasia (because the line between them is based on clear principles) there can be no substance to the charge that there is a slide from voluntary to non-voluntary euthanasia that can only be prevented by arbitrarily drawing a line between them.
What, though, of Hitler's Germany and today's Holland? The former is easily dismissed as a provider of evidence for an inevitable descent from voluntary euthanasia to non-voluntary. There never was a policy in favour of, or a legal practice of, voluntary euthanasia in Germany in the 1920s to the 1940s. There was, prior to Hitler coming to power, a clear practice of killing some disabled persons. The justification was never suggested to be that their being killed was in their best interests, rather it was said to be society that benefited. Hitler's later revival of the practice and its widening to take in other groups such as Jews and gypsies was part of a programme of eugenics, not euthanasia.
Since the publication of the Remmelink Report in 1991 into the medical practice of euthanasia in The Netherlands it has frequently been said that the Dutch experience shows decisively that legally protecting voluntary euthanasia is impossible without also affording protection to the non-voluntary euthanasia that will come in its train. Unfortunately, many of those who have made this claim have paid insufficient attention to the serious studies carried out by van der Maas, et al. (1991), and van der Wal, et al. (1992a and 1992b) into what the Report revealed. In a second nation-wide investigation of physician-assisted dying in the Netherlands carried out in 1995 a similar picture emerged as had in the earlier Remmelink Report. Again no evidence was found of any descent down a slippery slope toward ignoring people's voluntary choices to be assisted to die (see van der Maas et al. (1996); van der Wal et al. (1996)). The true picture is that, of those terminally ill persons assisted to die under the agreement between the legal and medical authorities, a little over one half were clearly cases of voluntary euthanasia as it has been characterised in this article. Of the remainder, the vast majority of cases were of patients who at the time of the assisted death were no longer competent. The deaths of some of these were brought about by withdrawal of treatment, that of others by interventions such as the giving of lethal doses of anaesthetics. But the critical point about this vast majority of such cases is that the decision to end life was nearly always taken after consultation between the doctor(s) and family members. In a very few cases there was no consultation of this kind. It seems that sometimes, at least, this was because families in The Netherlands strictly have no final authority to act as surrogate decision-makers for incompetent persons. That there has only been one prosecution of a Dutch doctor for failing to follow agreed procedures, and that the Dutch public have regularly reaffirmed their support for those agreed procedures suggests that, contrary to the claims of some critics of The Netherlands' experience of legally protecting voluntary euthanasia, social life has not broken down. Indeed, such studies as have been published about what happens in other countries, like Australia, where no legal protection is in place, suggest that the pattern of things in Holland and elsewhere is quite similar. If active euthanasia is widely practised but in ways that are not legally recognized there is apt in fact to be more danger that the distinction between voluntary cases and non-voluntary ones will be blurred or ignored than in a situation where the carrying out of euthanasia is transparent and subject to monitoring.
We can bring this discussion of the fifth objection to a close with two observations. First, nothing that has been said should be taken as suggesting that there is no need to put in place safeguards against potential abuse of any legal protection for voluntary euthanasia. This is particularly important for those who have become incompetent by the time decisions need to be taken about assisting them to die. As was mentioned very early on, there are ways of addressing this issue (such as by way of advance declarations or living wills) which are widely thought to be effective, even if they are not perfect. The main point to be stressed at the present, though, is that there is surely no need for anyone to be frightened into thinking that the legalisation of voluntary euthanasia will inevitably end in her having her life snatched away from her should she become incapable of exercising a competent judgement on her own behalf. Second, it is, of course, possible that the reform of any law may have unintended effects. It is sometimes said in discussions about legalising voluntary euthanasia that experience with abortion law reform should remind us of how quickly and easily practices can become accepted which were never among the reformers' intentions, and that the same thing could occur if voluntary euthanasia were to become legally permitted. No amount of theorising, it is said, can gainsay that possibility. There is no need to deny that it is possible that reform of the laws that presently prohibit voluntary euthanasia could have untoward consequences. However, if the arguments given above are sound (and the Dutch experience is not only the best evidence we have that they are sound, but the only relevant evidence), that does not seem very likely.
vi. I turn now to the final objection to be considered here. It is often claimed that whatever the morality of an individual's deciding for herself that her life is no longer of value to her, that provides no basis for the formulation of public policy. The fear of the slippery slope is, no doubt, part of the concern expressed here. But, as well, there are concerns about the role of the law and more particularly, its contribution to the regulation of medicine.
Legal permission for doctors to perform voluntary euthanasia cannot simply be grounded in the right of self-determination of patients. We have already had occasion to note that the law does not presently permit an individual to consent to her own death. Nevertheless, the very same fundamental basis of the right to decide about life-sustaining treatment - respect for a person's autonomy - underpins voluntary euthanasia as well. Extending the right of self-determination to cover cases of voluntary euthanasia would not, therefore, amount to a dramatic shift in legal policy. No novel legal values or principles need to be invoked. Indeed, the fact that suicide and attempted suicide are no longer criminal offences in many jurisdictions indicates that the central importance of individual self-determination in a closely analogous setting has been accepted. The fact that assisted suicide and voluntary euthanasia have not yet been widely decriminalised is probably best explained along the lines that have frequently been offered for excluding consent of the victim as a justification for an act of killing, namely the difficulties thought to exist in establishing the genuineness of the consent. The establishment of suitable procedures for giving consent to assisted suicide and voluntary euthanasia would seem to be no harder than establishing procedures for competently refusing burdensome or otherwise unwanted medical treatment. The latter has already been accomplished in many jurisdictions, so the former should be capable of establishment as well.
Suppose that the moral case for legalising voluntary euthanasia does come to be judged as stronger than the case against (as the drift of this article would imply), and voluntary euthanasia is made legally permissible. Should doctors take part in the practice? Should only doctors perform voluntary euthanasia? The proper administration of medical care is not at odds with an understanding of medical care that both promotes patients' welfare interests and respects their self-determination. It is these twin values which should guide medical care, not a commitment to preserving life at all costs, or preserving life without regard to whether patients want their lives prolonged when they judge that life is no longer of benefit or value to themselves. Many doctors in The Netherlands and, to judge from available survey evidence, in other Western countries as well, see the practice of (voluntary) euthanasia as not only compatible with their professional commitments but also with their conception of the best medical care for the dying. That being so, they should not be prohibited by law from lending their professional assistance to those competent, terminally ill persons for whom no cure is possible and who wish for an easy death.
Table of Contents
First published: April 18, 1996
Content last modified:August 15, 1996