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Animal Consciousness

In discussions of nonhuman animal (hereafter "animal") consciousness there is no clearly agreed upon sense in which the term "consciousness" is used. As a part of folk psychology, "consciousness" has a multitude of uses that may not be resolvable into a single, coherent concept. Two ordinary senses of consciousness which are not in dispute when applied to animals are the difference between wakefulness and sleep (or unconsciousness), and the ability of organisms to perceive (and in this sense be conscious or aware of) selected features of their environments. Many psychologists, influenced by a history of anecdotal anthropomorphism in 19th C. comparative psychology and the countervailing swing to behaviorism, regard any attempt to go beyond these uses of consciousness as entirely unscientific.

Two remaining senses of consciousness that cause controversy are the qualitative, subjective, or experiential aspects of animal consciousness (qualia) and self-consciousness. Philosophers of mind who turn their attention to animal consciousness (or sentience) are typically concerned with the former, whereas cognitive ethologists and some comparative psychologists have paid rather more attention to the latter. In the rest of this article "consciousness" is used to refer to the qualitative or phenomenological nature of experience, unless otherwise noted.

Philosophical interest in animal consciousness

The topic of animal consciousness has been primarily of epistemological interest to philosophers of mind. Two central questions are:
  1. Which animals besides humans have conscious experiences?
  2. What, if anything, are the experiences of animals like?
These questions might be seen as special cases of the general skeptical "problem of other minds". But it is often thought that knowledge of animal minds presents a special problem because we cannot use language to ask animals about their experiences. Philosophical theories of consciousness are frequently developed without special regard to questions about animal consciousness. The plausibility of such theories can often be assessed against the results of their application to animal consciousness.

Philosophical interest in animal consciousness also arises in the context of theories of the ethical treatment of animals. It is a widely accepted conditional statement that if animals lack sentience (especially the capacity for feeling pain) then they deserve no moral consideration. Some philosophers have defended the view that animals are not sentient and attempted to employ this conditional for modus ponens; others are inclined to use it for modus tollens and make it a requirement of any theory of consciousness that it justify attributions of consciousness to animals.

Animal consciousness and intentionality

Qualitative consciousness is just one feature (some would say the defining feature) of mental states or events. Any theory of animal consciousness must be understood in the context of a larger account of animal mentality that will also be concerned with issues such as mental content and intentionality in the sense described by the 19th C. German psychologist Franz Brentano (not to be confused with intentional in the sense of "purposeful"). Opinion divides over the relation of consciousness to intentionality with some philosophers maintaining that they are strictly independent, others arguing that intentionality is necessary for consciousness, and still others arguing that consciousness is necessary for genuine intentionality.

Many scientists who accept cognitive explanations of animal behavior that attribute representational states to their subjects are hesitant to attribute consciousness. If the representations invoked within cognitive science are intentional in Brentano's sense, then these scientists seem committed to denying that consciousness is necessary for intentionality.

Science and animal consciousness

Because consciousness is assumed to be private or subjective, it is often taken to be beyond the reach of objective scientific methods. This claim might be taken in either of two ways. On the one hand it might be taken to reject the possibility of knowledge that a member of another taxonomic group (e.g. a bat) has conscious states. On the other hand it might be taken to reject the possibility of knowledge of the phenomenological details of the mental states of a member of another taxonomic group. The difference between believing with justification that a bat is conscious and knowing "what it is like" to be a bat is important because, at best, the privacy of conscious experience supports a negative conclusion only about the latter. To support a negative conclusion about the former one must also assume that consciousness has absolutely no measurable effects on behavior. If conciousness does have effects then a strategy of inference to the best explanation may be used to support its attribution. A challenge for those who think that this is possible is to articulate the relationship between attributions of consciousness and behavioral or neurological evidence.

Historical views

[To be expanded]

Aristotle took the ability to reason as the characteristic that distinguishes humans from other animals. Modern philosophers, including Descartes, Locke, Leibniz, also regarded the human capacity to reason as qualitatively different from the capacities of nonhuman animals. Descartes thought that animals' inability to reason is demonstrated by their inability to use language and he took this to show that animals are not sentient. However Locke and Leibniz, although they both maintained that animals are incapable of reason, both thought that animal perception is accompanied by some degree of consciousness. Hume thought that much human behavior required a degree of reasoning that could be matched by animals and he seemed to regard the sentience of animals as plainly evident.

Prospects for progress on animal consciousness

Although there is a very long history of discussion by philosophers of animal consciousness, philosophers have shown themselves rather more willing to theorize on the basis of what they thought animals could or could not do rather than on the basis of the available empirical evidence about animal behavior. The topic of animal consciousness is still taboo for many psychologists. But interdisciplinary work between philosophers and behavioral scientists is beginning to lay the groundwork for treating some questions about consciousness in a philosophically sophisticated yet empirically tractable way.


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Related Entries

behaviorism | Brentano, Franz | consciousness | epistemology | folk psychology | inference to the best explanation | intentionality | other minds | qualia

Copyright © 1995, 1997 by
Colin Allen

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First published: December 23, 1995
Content last modified: Oct 8, 1997