Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
In discussions of nonhuman animal (hereafter "animal")
consciousness there is no clearly agreed upon sense in which the
term "consciousness" is used. As a part of
folk psychology, "consciousness" has a multitude of
uses that may not be resolvable into a single, coherent concept. Two
ordinary senses of consciousness which are not in dispute when applied
to animals are the difference between wakefulness and sleep (or
unconsciousness), and the ability of organisms to perceive (and in
this sense be conscious or aware of) selected features of their
environments. Many psychologists, influenced by a history of
anecdotal anthropomorphism in 19th C. comparative psychology and the
countervailing swing to behaviorism, regard any
attempt to go beyond these uses of consciousness as entirely
Two remaining senses of consciousness that cause controversy are
the qualitative, subjective, or experiential aspects of animal
consciousness (qualia) and self-consciousness.
Philosophers of mind who turn their attention to animal consciousness
(or sentience) are typically concerned with the former, whereas
cognitive ethologists and some comparative psychologists have paid
rather more attention to the latter. In the rest of this article
"consciousness" is used to refer to the qualitative or
phenomenological nature of experience, unless otherwise noted.
The topic of animal consciousness has been primarily of
epistemological interest to philosophers of mind.
Two central questions are:
These questions might be seen as special cases of the general
skeptical "problem of other minds". But it is
often thought that knowledge of animal minds presents a special
problem because we cannot use language to ask animals about their
experiences. Philosophical theories of consciousness are frequently
developed without special regard to questions about animal
consciousness. The plausibility of such theories can often be
assessed against the results of their application to animal
- Which animals besides humans have conscious experiences?
- What, if anything, are the experiences of animals like?
Philosophical interest in animal consciousness also arises in the
context of theories of the ethical treatment of animals. It is a
widely accepted conditional statement that if animals lack sentience
(especially the capacity for feeling pain) then they deserve no moral
consideration. Some philosophers have defended the view that animals
are not sentient and attempted to employ this conditional for modus
ponens; others are inclined to use it for modus tollens and
make it a requirement of any theory of consciousness that it justify
attributions of consciousness to animals.
Qualitative consciousness is just one feature (some would say the
defining feature) of mental states or events. Any theory of animal
consciousness must be understood in the context of a larger account of
animal mentality that will also be concerned with issues such as
mental content and intentionality in the sense
described by the 19th C. German psychologist Franz
Brentano (not to be confused with intentional in the sense of
"purposeful"). Opinion divides over the relation of consciousness to
intentionality with some philosophers maintaining that they are
strictly independent, others arguing that intentionality is necessary
for consciousness, and still others arguing that consciousness is
necessary for genuine intentionality.
Many scientists who accept cognitive explanations of animal
behavior that attribute representational states to their subjects are
hesitant to attribute consciousness. If the representations invoked
within cognitive science are intentional in Brentano's sense, then
these scientists seem committed to denying that consciousness is
necessary for intentionality.
Because consciousness is assumed to be private or subjective, it is
often taken to be beyond the reach of objective scientific methods.
This claim might be taken in either of two ways. On the one hand it
might be taken to reject the possibility of knowledge that a member of
another taxonomic group (e.g. a bat) has conscious states. On the
other hand it might be taken to reject the possibility of knowledge of
the phenomenological details of the mental states of a member of
another taxonomic group. The difference between believing with
justification that a bat is conscious and knowing "what it
is like" to be a bat is important because, at best, the privacy of
conscious experience supports a negative conclusion only about the
latter. To support a negative conclusion about the former one must
also assume that consciousness has absolutely no measurable effects on
behavior. If conciousness does have effects then a strategy of
inference to the best explanation may be used to
support its attribution. A challenge for those who think that this is
possible is to articulate the relationship between attributions of
consciousness and behavioral or neurological evidence.
[To be expanded]
Aristotle took the ability to reason as the characteristic that
distinguishes humans from other animals. Modern philosophers,
including Descartes, Locke, Leibniz, also regarded the human capacity
to reason as qualitatively different from the capacities of nonhuman
animals. Descartes thought that animals' inability to reason is
demonstrated by their inability to use language and he took this to
show that animals are not sentient. However Locke and Leibniz,
although they both maintained that animals are incapable of reason,
both thought that animal perception is accompanied by some degree of
consciousness. Hume thought that much human behavior required a
degree of reasoning that could be matched by animals and he seemed to
regard the sentience of animals as plainly evident.
Although there is a very long history of discussion by philosophers of
animal consciousness, philosophers have shown themselves rather more
willing to theorize on the basis of what they thought animals could or
could not do rather than on the basis of the available empirical
evidence about animal behavior. The topic of animal consciousness is
still taboo for many psychologists. But interdisciplinary work
between philosophers and behavioral scientists is beginning to lay the
groundwork for treating some questions about consciousness in a
philosophically sophisticated yet empirically tractable way.
[Please let Colin Allen
know if you find any others.]
Brentano, Franz |
folk psychology |
inference to the best explanation |
other minds |
- Allen, C., " Animal cognition and animal minds," in P. Machamer & M. Carrier
(eds.) (1997) Philosophy and the Sciences of the Mind:
Pittsburgh-Konstanz Series in the Philosophy and History of Science
vol. 4. Pittsburgh University Press and the
Universitätsverlag Konstanz: pp. 227-243.
- Allen, C., and Bekoff, M. (1997) Species of Mind. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
See especially Chapter 8
- Dawkins, M.S., Through Our Eyes Only, (1995).
- Nagel, T., "What is it like to be a bat?" Philosophical Review
83 (1974): pp.435-450.
- Sorabji, R., Animal Minds and Human Morals: the origins of the
Western debate, Ithaca, NY (1993): Cornell University Press.
- Wilson, M.D., "Animal Ideas," Proceedings and Addresses of the
APA: 69 (1995): 7-25.
Copyright © 1995, 1997 by
Table of Contents
First published: December 23, 1995
Content last modified: Oct 8, 1997