Two-Dimensional Semantics

First published Mon Dec 13, 2010; substantive revision Mon Apr 24, 2017

Two-dimensional (2D) semantics is a formal framework that is used to characterize the meaning of certain linguistic expressions and the entailment relations among sentences containing them. Two-dimensional semantics has also been applied to thought contents. In contrast with standard possible worlds semantics, 2D semantics assigns extensions and truth-values to expressions relative to two possible world parameters, rather than just one. So a 2D semantic framework provides finer-grained semantic values than those available within standard possible world semantics, while using the same basic model-theoretic resources. The 2D framework itself is just a formal tool. To develop a semantic theory for someone’s language, a proponent of 2D semantics must do three things: (i) explain what exactly the two possible world parameters represent, (ii) explain the rules for assigning 2D semantic values to a person’s words and sentences, and (iii) explain how 2D semantic values help in understanding the meanings of the person’s words and sentences.

The two-dimensional framework has been interpreted in different ways for different explanatory purposes. The two most widely accepted applications of two-dimensional semantics target restricted classes of expressions. David Kaplan’s 2D semantic framework for indexicals is widely used to explain conventional semantic rules governing context-dependent expressions like ‘I’, ‘that’, or ‘here’, which pick out different things depending on the context in which the expression is used. And logicians working on tense and modal logic use 2D semantics to characterize the logical implications of operators like ‘now’, ‘actually’, and ‘necessarily’. Such restricted applications of 2D semantics are intended to systematize and explain uncontroversial aspects of linguistic understanding.

Two-dimensional semantics has also been used for more ambitious philosophical purposes. Influential theorists like David Lewis, Frank Jackson and David Chalmers argue that a generalized 2D semantic framework can be used to isolate an apriori aspect of meaning. Roughly, the idea is that speakers always have apriori access to the truth-conditions associated with their own sentences. On the face of it, this apriority claim seems to conflict with the observation that certain necessary truths, such as ‘water = H2O’, can be known only on the basis of empirical inquiry. But proponents of generalized 2D semantics argue that the 2D framework undercuts this objection, by showing how such aposteriori necessities are consistent with apriori access to truth-conditions. The positive reasons to accept generalized 2D semantics, however, are bound up with larger (and partly disjoint) explanatory projects. As a consequence, debates over the merits of generalized 2D semantics touch on broader controversies about apriority, modality, semantic theory and philosophical methodology.

The two-dimensional framework can also figure in a theory of ad hoc language use, instead of a theory of literal meanings. Robert Stalnaker’s influential 2D account of assertion falls in this category. His “metasemantic” interpretation of the 2D framework is intended to characterize what is communicated when conversational partners are partially ignorant or mistaken about the literal meaning of their own words. Although it is formally similar to generalized 2D semantics, Stalnaker’s use of the 2D framework avoids apriori accessible truth-conditions of the sort posited by generalized 2D semantics.

Readers who are unfamiliar with the 2D framework and want to get an overall sense of the formalism and its philosophical applications should read section 1 plus the subsequent “overview” sections. Those already familiar with the basic 2D framework may skip section 1 and move directly to sections 2 and 3, which contrast recent philosophical applications of the framework.

1. Indexicals

1.1 Introducing a 2D framework

A good way to get an intuitive feel for the basic structure of a two-dimensional semantic framework is to consider the semantics of context-dependent “indexical” expressions like ‘I’ or ‘this’.

Semantic theories explain how the truth or falsity of whole sentences depends on the meanings of their parts by stating rules governing the interpretation of subsentential expressions and their modes of combination. A semantic framework provides a standard formalism for stating such rules. The simplest (0-dimensional) semantic frameworks work by assigning extensions as the semantic values of particular expressions. Intuitively, the extension includes those things in the actual world to which the expression applies: e.g., the extension of the name ‘Barack Obama’ is the man Obama, the extension of the predicate ‘is cool’ is the set all the actual cool things, and the extension of a two-place predicate ‘is cooler than’ is the set of pairs of actually existing things the first of which is cooler than the second. A whole sentence is assigned a truth-value (True or False) as its extension, which is computed on the basis of the extensions of the component expressions: e.g., the sentence, ‘Barack Obama is cool’, will have the semantic value True just in case Obama is a member of the set of actual cool things. A two-dimensional semantic framework is the result of enriching this simple extensional framework in two distinct ways.

The first enrichment, standard possible worlds semantics, is introduced in order to explain the meaning of modal operators like ‘possible’ and ‘necessary’ and to distinguish the intuitive subject matter represented by particular subsentential expressions. Consider the expressions ‘Roger Federer’, ‘the greatest tennis player of all time’, and ‘the most famous Swiss citizen in 2010’. All three expressions happen to have exactly the same extension: a particular individual RF. So a simple extensional semantics will assign exactly the same semantic value to all three expressions. But clearly they differ in meaning: if events had unfolded only slightly differently than they actually did, the three expressions would pick out different people. For instance, if Federer had decided to go into banking instead of tennis, Jean Piaget might have been the best known Swiss citizen and Rod Laver the greatest tennis player; but of course Federer would still have been Federer. In general, definite descriptions like ‘the greatest tennis player’ or ‘the most famous Swiss citizen’ pick out different individuals depending on who happens to have the relevant properties in counterfactual situations; whereas proper names like ‘Roger Federer’ rigidly pick out the very same individual in every possible situation.[1] [See entry on rigid designators.] Moreover, such differences in what expressions pick out in counterfactual situations affect the truth of modal claims: e.g., ‘Federer is necessarily Federer’ is true, but ‘Federer is necessarily the greatest tennis player’ is false. So there seems to be an aspect of meaning that is not captured in simple extensional semantics. The basic idea behind possible world semantics is to map out such differences in meaning by specifying what an expression picks out relative to every possible way the world could be (every “possible world”).

In standard (1-dimensional) possible worlds semantics, the semantic value of an expression is an intension, a function that assigns an extension to the expression “at” every possible world. For instance, the semantic value of a definite description like ‘the best known Swiss citizen’ is a function that takes as input a possible world and yields as output whoever happens to satisfy that description in that world, and the semantic value of a proper name like ‘Roger Federer’ is a constant function that maps every possible world to the very same individual, RF. Such intensions allow the semantic theorist to capture commonsense intuitions about the nature of the objects, kinds, or properties picked out by particular expressions. The nature of Federer is reflected in the different properties he could have in different possible situations, and the nature of being the greatest tennis player is reflected in the properties of the individuals who satisfy that description in different possible situations. Standard possible worlds semantics provides a unified framework for keeping track of such modal intuitions—intuitions about the “modal profile” of the objects, kinds and properties picked out by our words.[2] The possible worlds framework also helps explain the meaning of modal operators like ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’: a sentence is necessarily true just in case it is true at every possible world, and it is possibly true just in case it is true at some possible world. So we can think of the semantic value of the modal operator ‘necessarily’ as a function that maps necessarily true sentences to the truth value True and all other sentences to the value False. This sort of possible worlds semantics is the standard formal framework for clarifying the content of modal claims and the logical relations among them. [See the entries on intensional Logic and modal logic.]

The second enrichment of the basic extensional semantic framework—the one that is distinctive of two-dimensional semantics—requires us to take possible worlds into account in a different way. To see why this might be necessary for an adequate account of meaning, let’s focus on context sensitive expressions like ‘I’, ‘here’ or ‘this’. In one respect, these terms function like names, picking out the very same thing in every possible world. For instance, if Hillary Rodham Clinton says ‘I could have been president’, her word ‘I’ refers rigidly to the very same woman, HRC, in every possible world and her claim is true just in case there is a possible way the world could be in which that very woman is president. In standard possible worlds semantics, then, the semantic value of Clinton’s utterance of ‘I’ will be exactly the same as an utterance of the name ‘Hillary Rodham Clinton’: a function that yields the individual HRC for every possible world. But clearly the English word ‘I’ is not synonymous with the name ‘Hillary Rodham Clinton’—for John McCain might utter the sentence ‘I could have been president’ and in his mouth the word ‘I’ would refer rigidly to a different person, JM, in every possible world. What’s distinctive of context-sensitive expressions like ‘I’ or ‘this’ is that they represent different things depending on the context in which they are used. David Kaplan (1989)[3] first brought widespread attention to this phenomenon of context-dependence by proposing a highly influential two-dimensional semantic theory to clarify the rules governing such expressions [see the entry on indexicals].

Kaplan distinguishes two different aspects of the meaning of expressions in a public language. The first aspect, content, reflects the modal profile of the object, kind or property represented. This is the aspect of meaning that is modeled by standard possible world semantics. The second aspect of meaning, character, reflects semantic rules governing how the content of an expression may vary from one context of use to the next. A proper name like ‘Hillary Rodham Clinton’ (or indeed any non-indexical expression) has a constant character, picking out the very same object in every context in which it’s used, whereas indexical expressions like ‘I’ or ‘this’ have variable character, picking out different things in different contexts of use.

Formally, character is defined as a function that maps possible contexts of use to contents, and content is defined as a function mapping possible worlds to extensions. Thus, a character is a function that takes as input a context and yields as output a function from possible worlds to extensions. This is a two-dimensional intension, since there are two distinct roles that possibilities play here: as a context of use, and as a circumstance of evaluation (a possible situation relative to which we evaluate whether the relevant object exists or the relevant kind or property is instantiated). A possible context of use is just a possible situation in which someone uses the relevant expression. Contexts can be thought of as “centered” possible worlds: possible worlds with a designated agent and time within that world, which serve to locate a particular situation in which the expression is used. We can then represent a context as an ordered triple \(\langle w, a, t\rangle\) of a possible world, an agent within that world, and a time when the agent exists in that world.[4] With this formalism, it’s clear that the set of possible worlds must be taken into account twice over in Kaplan’s account of character: once in their role in determining possible contexts of use, and once in their normal role as possible circumstances of evaluation.

The conventional semantic rules governing the indexical ‘I’ can be easily represented using this 2D semantic framework. The rules governing ‘I’ in English are modeled by a particular character: in any possible context of use \(\langle w, a, t\rangle\), an utterance of ‘I’ rigidly designates the agent of that context, a, picking out that very individual in all possible circumstances of evaluation. Kaplan analyzes the semantic rules governing the demonstrative ‘that’ in a similar way: relative to any possible context of use \(\langle w, a, t\rangle\), an utterance of ‘that’ rigidly designates the object (if any) that is made salient by a’s pointing gesture in that context [see the entry on indexicals for a more detailed discussion].

1.2 Introducing 2D matrices

A useful way of visualizing the dual role played by possible worlds in a 2D framework is to construct a two-dimensional matrix (Stalnaker 1978). To represent Kaplan’s theory of indexicals, we array possible circumstances of evaluation along the horizontal axis and possible contexts of utterance along the vertical axis. Each horizontal row of the matrix represents the content the target expression would have if used in the context specified for that row. This content is (partially) represented by recording the extension of the term at each possible circumstance arrayed along the horizontal axis. This procedure is then repeated for each context listed along the vertical axis.

For instance, consider a particular utterance of ‘I’ made by Barack Obama during his inaugural presidential address. This context of use can be represented as the world \(w_1\), centered on the man BO, at time \(t_0\). We can (partially) represent the content of ‘I’ in this centered world thus:

Obama’s use of ‘I’ in his inaugural address:
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) BO BO BO

This simple one-dimensional matrix reflects the fact that, when used in this context, ‘I’ refers rigidly to Obama at every possible circumstance of evaluation—even at the counterfactual worlds \(w_2\) and \(w_3\), in which John McCain or Hillary Rodham Clinton won the 2008 presidential election. The context-dependence of the expression ‘I’ is revealed when we evaluate the use of ‘I’ with respect to different possible contexts of use. Let’s consider two other contexts: \(\langle w_2, \JM, t_0\rangle\) is a world in which McCain won the election, centered on him at his inaugural address; and \(\langle w_3, \HRC, t_0\rangle\) is a world in which Clinton won, centered on her at her inaugural address. We then rely on our implicit understanding of the semantic rules governing ‘I’ to generate two more rows for our matrix:

Kaplanian character of ‘I’:
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) BO BO BO
\(\langle w_2, \JM, t_0\rangle\) JM JM JM
\(\langle w_3, \HRC, t_0\rangle\) HRC HRC HRC

What the matrix reveals is that the expression ‘I’ rigidly designates different individuals, depending on the context in which it is used. Thus the 2D matrix provides a graphic illustration of how content of the expression ‘I’ varies, depending on the context in which it is used.

Such 2D matrices can be used to represent the differences between the semantic rules governing indexicals, definite descriptions, and names. For instance, the definite description ‘the inaugural speaker in 2009’ will generate the following Kaplanian matrix:

Kaplanian character of ‘the inaugural speaker in 2009’:
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) BO JM HRC
\(\langle w_2, \JM, t_0\rangle\) BO JM HRC
\(\langle w_3, \HRC, t_0\rangle\) BO JM HRC

Unlike the matrix for ‘I’, the horizontal rows of this 2D matrix are all exactly the same. This reflects the fact that the expression ‘the inaugural speaker in 2009’ is not context-sensitive: it always represents the very same property irrespective of the context in which it is used—namely, the property of being the person who delivers the inaugural US presidential address in 2009. This property is exemplified by different individuals at different possible worlds: the person who is the inaugural speaker at \(w_1\) is Obama, at \(w_2\) it’s McCain, and at \(w_3\) it’s Clinton. In general, the sequence arrayed along the rows of this matrix reflects the variety of different individuals who could instantiate the property represented by ‘the inaugural speaker’ in different circumstances. Of course, no finite matrix can fully capture the range of variation, but it can give a useful partial representation of the property in question.

The matrix for a proper name like ‘Barack Obama’ reveals another very different pattern:

Kaplanian character of ‘Barack Obama’:
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) BO BO BO
\(\langle w_2, \JM, t_0\rangle\) BO BO BO
\(\langle w_3, \HRC, t_0\rangle\) BO BO BO

According to Kaplan, proper names are context-invariant: they always have the very same content irrespective of the context in which they are used. Proper names are also rigid designators: they pick out a single individual at every possible world. The upshot is that the 2D matrix for a proper name will be completely uniform: the very same individual appears in every cell of the matrix. This reflects the idea that the semantic function of a name in a public language is simply to pick out a particular individual, not to convey any information about how to identify the individual in question. [Some proponents of generalized 2D semantics reject this account of the conventional meaning of proper names. See §2.2 below.]

1.3 The logic of indexicals and diagonal intensions

Kaplan’s semantic rules for indexicals guarantee that certain sentences will be true whenever they are uttered, and certain inferences will be truth preserving. This account paves the way for a formal logic of indexicals (Kaplan 1989). In this system, logical validity is defined in terms of different possible contexts of use: a sentence is valid iff it is true in every possible context of use; and an inference is valid iff the truth of the premises ensures the truth of the conclusion in every possible context of use.

In this formal system, sentences can be logically valid, even if they express contingent propositions. For instance, the semantic rules governing indexicals ensures that the sentence ‘I am here’ will be true whenever uttered: ‘I’ always picks out the agent who is making the utterance and ‘here’ always picks out the place where the agent is making the utterance. So no matter how we vary the circumstances in which the utterance takes place, an utterance of ‘I am here’ is always guaranteed to be true. The sentence will express different contents depending on who is using it, but normally the sentence will express a contingent proposition. (I could easily not have been here right now, but at the beach instead.)

To get a clearer understanding of how this works, we can construct a partial 2D matrix for the sentence using our previous example. Let’s assume Obama would attend the inaugural address of McCain but not of Clinton, McCain would avoid the inauguration of anyone who defeated him, and Clinton would attend Obama’s inauguration but not McCain’s. This yields the following 2D matrix:

Kaplanian character of ‘I am here’
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) T T F
\(\langle w_2, \JM, t_0\rangle\) F T F
\(\langle w_3, \HRC, t_0\rangle\) T F T

The content of Obama’s utterance of ‘I am here’ in the context \(\langle w_1, \BO, t_0\rangle\) is the proposition that Obama is in Washington DC on January 20th 2009. Since this claim is true at worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\), the top row of the matrix assigns T for those worlds, but it assigns F for \(w_3\) in which Obama is on childcare duty in Chicago during Clinton’s inauguration. The content of McCain’s utterance in the second context is that McCain is in DC at that time, so the intension assigns T to the world of that context, \(w_2\), and F to the worlds where he is in Arizona on inauguration day. And the content of Clinton’s utterance is that she is in DC, so the world of that context \(w_3\) is assigned T, while the other worlds get divergent truth-values depending on her location in those worlds. Thus the differences in the horizontal rows of the 2D matrix reflect the different propositions expressed by the sentence in these three contexts. The fact that the horizontal rows of this matrix contain both ‘T’s and ‘F’s reflects the fact that the intensions expressed in the relevant contexts are metaphysically contingent: e.g., it’s neither necessarily true nor necessarily false that McCain is located in DC on inauguration day.

The 2D matrix also graphically represents the fact that the sentence is guaranteed to be true whenever uttered. For every possible context \(\langle w, a, t\rangle\), the semantic rules for indexicals guarantee that ‘I am here’ will be assigned T at the world of that context \(w\). Thus the diagonal of the matrix running from the top left corner to the bottom right contains all ‘T’s. With a nod to Stalnaker (1978), we can call this the diagonal intension associated with the sentence. In Kaplan’s semantic framework, a necessary diagonal intension indicates that a sentence is logically valid and analytic: it’s guaranteed by semantic rules to be true in every possible context in which it is uttered, even though it may express distinct propositions in different contexts.[5]

2. Modal Operators

At around the same time that Kaplan began developing his account of indexicals, logicians working on tense and modal logic had begun using 2D semantic frameworks to explain the behavior of sentential operators like ‘now’ and ‘actually’ (Åqvist 1973; Kamp 1971; Segerberg 1973; Vlach 1973). Unlike Kaplan, these logicians were not primarily concerned with the semantic rules governing natural languages. In particular, modal logicians were not focused on how the context in which an expression is used can affect its reference. Rather, they were interested in developing formal systems for representing valid inferences about time and possibility. It turns out that tense and modal logic are formally very similar and that both require double-indexing for expressive adequacy. Thus, to fully capture reasoning about what’s necessary and possible, we need to move from standard possible worlds semantics to a 2D semantic framework.

2.1 ‘Actually’ and ‘Necessarily’

The need for a 2D modal framework is not obvious at first glance. After all, we can state semantic rules for the basic modal operators like ‘it’s necessarily the case that’ or ‘it’s possibly the case that’ by simply quantifying over possible worlds: a sentence is necessary iff it’s true in all possible worlds, and a sentence is possible iff it’s true in some possible world. But this (one-dimensional) framework cannot capture what is expressed by operators like ‘it’s actually the case that’. To understand how this operator works and to map out the valid inferences it licenses, we need a double-indexing framework in which possible worlds play two distinct roles (Crossley and Humberstone 1977; Hazen 1976, 1978).

To see why this is so, consider the following sentence:

  • (1) It is possible for everything that is actually red to be shiny.

Standard possible worlds semantics lacks the expressive power to capture what is said by this sentence. The claim is not that there is a possible world such that all the things that are red in that world are also shiny in that world (they’re supposed to be red in the actual world, not the counterfactual one). Nor is the claim that for each object that is red, there is a possible world in which it is shiny (the objects are all supposed to be shiny together within a single possible world). So here is a relation among objects in possible worlds that cannot be expressed in standard possible world semantics. To capture the relation, we need to introduce an extra element into the formal framework: we simply designate one world within the model to play the role of the actual world. We can then introduce a sentential operator ‘\(\mathcal{A}\)’ (read as ‘Actually’), which requires us to evaluate any claim within its scope at the designated world, even when the operator is embedded within the scope of other modal operators. Using this enriched possible worlds framework, we can represent the truth-conditions of our sample sentence in a straightforward way:

  • \((1')\) \(\Diamond \forall x(\mathcal{A}\Red(x) \rightarrow \Shiny(x))\)

This sentence is true just in case there is some possible world, \(w\), in which everything that is red in the designated world, \(w_@\), is shiny in \(w\).

One awkward consequence of this 2D semantic account of ‘Actually’ is the way this operator interacts with the standard modal operator ‘Necessarily’. Intuitively, what the actual world is like seems logically and metaphysically contingent. But according to the proposed semantics for ‘Actually’, any true sentence \(S\) will yield a necessary truth when embedded within the scope of the operator ‘\(\mathcal{A}\)’. For instance, consider the following sentence:

  • (2) Obama actually won the 2008 election.

If Obama won in the designated world of our model, then it’s true at every possible world in that model that Obama won at its designated world. So on the proposed 2D semantics, the sentence is necessarily true. (When we embed (2) within the necessity operator ‘\(\Box\)’ we get a truth; and any claim of the form \(\mathcal{A}S \rightarrow \Box \mathcal{A}S\) will be logically valid.) But intuitively it’s a contingent matter how the 2008 elections turned out: surely the fact that Obama actually won does not show that he was destined by logical necessity to actually win!

To mitigate this counterintuitive consequence, Crossley and Humberstone introduce a new logical operator, ‘Fixedly’ (‘\(\mathcal{F}\)’) in such a way that the complex operator ‘Fixedly Actually’ (‘\(\mathcal{F}\mathcal{A}\)’), captures the sense of necessity we have in mind when we deny that (2) is necessary. A sentence is fixedly actually true just in case it is true no matter which world is designated as actual.[6]

Once again, 2D matrices can be used to graphically depict how the semantic theory works. Let’s take our universe of possible worlds to contain just three worlds: \(w_1\) is a world where Obama won, \(w_2\) a world where McCain won, and \(w_3\) a world where Clinton won. To explain the ‘Fixedly Actually’ operator, we need to consider possible worlds playing two different roles: the standard role as a circumstance of evaluation and the special role of being designated as the actual world. To construct a 2D matrix, we array possible worlds playing the standard role along the horizontal axis, and along the vertical axis we array the same worlds playing the role of being designated as actual. Each horizontal row of this matrix represents a different model with a particular world designated as actual.[7] On this account, the truth of a sentence embedded within the ‘Actually’ operator depends entirely on what’s true in the world designated as actual in a given model. So we can fill in the 2D matrix as follows:

C&H matrix for ‘Obama actually won.’
\(w_1\) \(w_2\) \(w_3\)
\(w_1\) as actual T T T
\(w_2\) as actual F F F
\(w_3\) as actual F F F

In any world in a model, ‘Actually \(S\)’ is always evaluated by looking at the designated world of that model. So such sentences are either necessarily true (True at every world in the model) or necessarily false (False at every world in the model). This is the sense of necessity that corresponds to the standard modal operator ‘\(\Box\)’. On this understanding of necessity, the target sentence is necessarily true (since \(w_1\) represents the actual actual world). But intuitively there is a sense in which the sentence seems contingent, since a different world could have been actual: if \(w_2\) or \(w_3\) had been actual, the sentence ‘Obama actually won’ would have been false. This fact is reflected in the 2D matrix by the diagonal intension, where the sentence comes out true with respect to \(\langle w_1, w_1\rangle\), but false with respect to \(\langle w_2, w_2\rangle\) and \(\langle w_3, w_3\rangle\). The ‘Fixedly Actually’ operator is sensitive to the necessity or contingency of the diagonal intension. The sense in which the target sentence (2) is not necessary is that it’s not fixedly actually true.

2.2 Philosophical applications of modal logic

A highly influential paper by Martin Davies and Lloyd Humberstone (1980) brought the formal tools developed in 2D modal logic to bear on philosophical puzzles about modality. Following Gareth Evans (1979), Davies and Humberstone suggest that there are two notions of metaphysical necessity involved in ordinary modal thinking: deep and superficial necessity. They argue that the two logical operators, ‘\(\mathcal{F}\mathcal{A}\)’ and ‘\(\Box\)’ respectively, provide a clear formal elucidation of these two notions.

These two notions of necessity, they argue, help explain some of Saul Kripke’s (1980) puzzling examples in which necessity and apriority come apart. Using 2D modal logic, it’s easy to construct necessary aposteriori truths. The semantic rules governing the modal operator ‘\(\mathcal{A}\)’ guarantee that every claim of the form \(\mathcal{A}S\) will be either necessarily true or necessarily false in the sense of ‘\(\Box\)’. But when the embedded sentence \(S\) is an ordinary empirical truth like ‘Obama won’, \(\mathcal{A}S\) will be knowable only aposteriori: so \(\mathcal{A}S\) will be a necessary aposteriori truth. The ‘Actually’ operator can also be used to construct contingent apriori truths. Any claim of the form \((\mathcal{A}S \rightarrow S)\) is guaranteed by the semantic rules governing ‘Actually’ to be true at the designated world no matter which world is designated as actual (i.e., it’s fixedly actually true). But when \(S\) is an ordinary empirical truth, the complex claim is not necessary in the sense of ‘\(\Box\)’: there will be some worlds in the model where \(S\) is false while \(\mathcal{A}S\) is true. In such cases, the complex sentence will be a contingent apriori truth.

Davies and Humberstone also suggest that the 2D modal operator ‘Actually’ might help analyze certain referring expressions in natural language. In particular, they focus on Evans’ (1982) notion of a ‘descriptive name’ (a name whose reference is fixed by a description) and on natural kind terms. Suppose the following definitions capture the semantic rules governing the relevant expressions in natural language:

  1. Julius \(=_{df}\) the actual inventor of the zip.
  2. Water \(=_{df}\) the actual chemical kind to which that liquid belongs which falls from clouds, flows in rivers, is drinkable, colorless, odorless, etc.

If such analyses are correct, then the semantics for ‘actually’ will allow us to explain why ‘Julius invented the zip’ is contingent and apriori and ‘water = H2O’ is necessary aposteriori.[8] [See the entries on names and descriptions. For a survey of other philosophical applications of the 2D framework in modal logic see (Humberstone 2004).]

Davies and Humberstone themselves express reservations about the adequacy of analyses using ‘actually’ for natural language expressions, particularly in the case of proper names (1980, 17–21). As a consequence, they did not take 2D modal logic to provide a complete response to Kripke’s puzzles about necessary aposteriori and contingent apriori truths. However, the use of the 2D framework to explain these puzzles was subsequently taken up and refined by proponents of generalized 2D semantics.

Recently, Brian Rabern has argued that the semantic considerations that support double-indexing for modal operators also support the need for multiple modal operators (Rabern 2012b). If this is right, then the role of multiple-indexing in compositional semantics should be sharply distinguished from dual roles for possible worlds that Kaplan highlights:

Theorists tend to focus on the case of double indexing. And this lines up well with the Kaplanian distinction between content generating versus content evaluating parameters (Kaplan 1989). But the motivations for this Kaplanian distinction are really quite different from the motivations for double indexing from compositional semantics. And once we take the latter motivations to their logical consequence we are left with a system of infinite indexing, which doesn’t cohere nicely with Kaplan’s two-level picture. There is a fundamental tension in our default conception of semantic theory. (Rabern 2012b, 120)

Rabern’s suggestion is that the notion of semantic value needed for compositional semantics should be distinguished from the notion of assertoric content of utterances (or of thoughts). For similar views, see (Ninan 2010; Yalcin 2015). This sharp distinction between formal semantics and intensional content would undercut some of the motivation for treating the generalized two-dimensional semantic program advocated by theorists like David Chalmers and Frank Jackson as contributing to a compositional semantic theory.

3. Generalized 2D Semantics

3.1 Vindicating the traditional approach to meaning

In the previous sections, we considered applications of the 2D framework that seek to explain the meaning of specific types of expression: indexicals and modal operators. In contrast, proponents of generalized 2D semantics believe that the 2D framework can be used to explain an important aspect of the meaning of all expressions. In particular, generalized 2D semantics is meant to vindicate the traditional idea that we have apriori access to our own meanings through armchair reflection.

According to the philosophical tradition, to know the meaning of a subsentential expression like ‘bachelor’ is to implicitly grasp a criterion that determines exactly which individuals count as bachelors in any possible situation. (Accounts of meaning broadly along these lines were advanced by Plato, Descartes, Locke, Hume, Frege, Russell, Carnap, and many others.) On the traditional account, speakers’ implicit grasp of a criterion plays two key theoretical roles:

  1. Semantic competence: Two speakers (or one speaker on two occasions) share the same meaning just in case they associate the very same criterion with their expressions.
  2. Reference determination: The criterion a speaker currently associates with an expression determines which things fall into its extension in every possible situation.

The first claim requires that speakers who share the same meaning must share a criterion for identifying the reference; while the second requires that this criterion be veridical. If this traditional account of meaning is correct, then one can make one’s own meanings explicit by engaging in apriori conceptual analysis. Such conceptual analysis allows you to determine what exactly it takes to count as a bachelor in any possible world; and it allows you to specify what exactly someone must be prepared to accept in order to genuinely agree or disagree about bachelors.

Generalized two-dimensional semantics is a strategy for defending a variant of this traditional view of meaning against a series of highly influential objections. In the 1970s and 80s, semantic externalists used a variety of persuasive examples to argue that the traditional account of meaning yields an unrealistic picture of (i) semantic competence, (ii) reference determination, and (iii) epistemic access to modal facts. Proper names and natural kind terms seem especially problematic for the traditional account.[9] By commonsense standards, you don’t need to know a specific rule for identifying Gödel in any possible world in order to count as competent with the name ‘Gödel’; and no such knowledge seems required for your use of the name to pick out the relevant man in every possible world (Donnellan 1970; Kripke 1980).[10] Similarly, you don’t need to know precisely what it takes for something to count as water in any possible world to be competent with the word ‘water’ or for your word to pick out the chemical substance H2O in every possible world (Kripke 1980; Putnam 1970, 1972). Indeed, making room for the possibility of ignorance and error about reference-conditions seems crucial to explaining empirical inquiry into the nature of familiar things, and to vindicating the commonsense realist idea that we can refer to things whose nature we don’t fully understand (Burge 1979, 1986; Putnam 1972, 1973). If these critics are right, then the traditional account of meaning is untenable. Implicit knowledge of reference-conditions is not required either for linguistic competence or for determinate reference. And apriori conceptual analysis cannot be trusted to reveal what’s genuinely possible—at best, it reveals one’s current fallible assumptions about the topic in question. [See the entry on externalism about mental content.]

Proponents of generalized 2D semantics believe this pessimistic conclusion is unwarranted. What critics’ examples really show, they argue, is that the traditional view of meaning should be refined, not junked. Moreover, the 2D semantics developed for indexicals and modal operators suggests a promising strategy for accommodating putative externalist counterexamples within a broadly traditional account of meaning. In the case of indexicals and rigidified definite descriptions, competent speakers grasp a reference-fixing criterion without grasping the modal profile of the object, kind, or property picked out by the expression. For instance, you can know that ‘I’ always refers to the speaker whenever it is uttered without knowing the nature of the person who is actually picked (e.g., what it takes to be Barack Obama in any possible world). Perhaps our understanding of names and natural kind terms is structured in a similar way: competent speakers always have apriori access to the reference-fixing criterion currently associated with their use of the name ‘Barack Obama’, but they have only aposteriori access to the associated modal profile. If this suggestion is on the right track, then a generalized 2D semantic framework could be used to clarify the nature of this semantic understanding. Moreover we may be able to explain certain epistemic operators, like ‘it is conceptually possible that’ or ‘it is apriori that’, as operating on such 2D semantic values.

The basic philosophical idea behind generalized 2D semantics—that subjects have apriori access to reference-fixing criteria for their words but not to the modal profile of the subject matter picked out—has been suggested by a number of theorists. David Lewis, in particular, was a powerful champion of the idea that we can give apriori definitions for terms whose precise reference we do not understand. Lewis articulated the ‘analytic functionalist’ approach to specifying the meaning of mental predicates and of theoretical terms in science (1966; 1970; 1972; 1979; 1980; 1994); and he was also an early advocate of a generalized 2D approach to semantics (1981; 1994). Other influential proponents of the idea that we can have implicit knowledge of reference-fixing criteria without knowing the modal profile of the reference include Michael Dummett (1973; 1981), Gareth Evans (1982), and John Searle (1983). Early proponents of an explicitly two-dimensional semantics for names and natural kind terms include Harry Deutsch, Ulrike Haas-Spohn, and Kai-Yee Wong (Deutsch 1990, 1993; Haas-Spohn 1995; Wong 1996). However, it is two later theorists—Frank Jackson (1994; 1998a; 1998b; 2004) and David Chalmers (1996; 2002b; 2002c; 2004; 2006a)—who have most systematically developed and defended generalized 2D semantics as a way of reconciling the lessons of semantic externalism with the traditional apriori approach to meaning and modality.

It’s worth noting that generalized 2D semantics has been motivated primarily by epistemic, metasemantic, and metaphysical concerns, rather than by issues in compositional semantics. In particular, generalized 2D semantics seeks to vindicate the traditional idea that we can know the truth conditions of our own sentences via armchair reasoning about hypothetical cases. The approach promises to explain why certain necessary truths can only be known aposteriori by appealing to the structure of our implicit semantic understanding. Proponents of generalized 2D semantics make claims about how the two types of intension may interact with modal and epistemic operators. However, working out the details of the compositional semantics has been a relatively recent concern of proponents of generalized 2D semantics (e.g. Chalmers 2011a, c; Chalmers and Rabern 2014; Johannesson and Packalén 2016; Kipper forthcoming).

The 2D semantic frameworks proposed by Jackson and Chalmers are very similar in their broad aims and formal structure, and commentators often treat the two versions as interchangeable. However, the two frameworks are developed in the service of two quite different philosophical projects, emphasizing different aspects of the traditional approach to meaning. Jackson takes up the traditional empiricist project of explaining empirical facts about language use and communication, while Chalmers pursues a broadly rationalist project of explaining key structural interconnections between meaning, apriority, and possibility. This difference in explanatory aims leads to different interpretations of the 2D framework.

4. The Empiricist Project

4.1 Linguistic understanding and coordination

An empiricist account of meaning is essentially a high-level causal explanation of uncontroversial facts about language use. In particular, the empiricist seeks to characterize the psychological states that guide individuals’ application of an expression to particular cases, and to explain how linguistic coordination within a linguistic community is achieved.

Clearly individual speakers must have some implicit assumptions about the reference of a word that guide their verdicts about whether it applies to particular cases (Jackson 1998a, 29–42). When someone asks you whether a particular Gettier case counts as knowledge, for instance, you do not simply answer at random: your answer is guided by your prior understanding of the term ‘knowledge’, and your answer is only justified insofar as it makes sense of that prior understanding. An empiricist seeks to explain these facts by positing a stable internal psychological state—something like an internal reference-fixing template—that guides your verdicts no matter what the actual world turns out to be like.

It’s equally clear that members of the same linguistic community generally manage to use words to reliably coordinate their beliefs and actions (Jackson 1998b, 2004). When I ask you to pass the salt, you know roughly which white granular substance I’m asking for—you know, for instance, that it would be inappropriate to pass the sugar bowl or the pepper grinder. This sort of everyday coordination requires speakers to have similar dispositions to classify things as falling into the extension of words, and it requires that these similarities in classificatory dispositions be mutually obvious to all concerned: for it to make sense for me to say ‘please pass the salt’ in order to get salt, it must be common knowledge between us that we’re inclined to classify roughly the same things as ‘salt’. An empiricist explains this common knowledge by positing implicit conventions that require everyone to associate the very same reference-fixing template with a given word (Jackson 1998b; Lewis 1969).

An empiricist use of the 2D framework is intended to show that this core explanatory project is not undermined by the intuitions about names and natural kind terms highlighted by semantic externalists (Jackson 1998a; 1998b). According to the empiricist picture of meaning, implicit linguistic conventions ensure that speakers within a linguistic community associate roughly the same reference-fixing criteria with particular words. Empiricist proponents of 2D semantics hold that the 2D framework can help elucidate the content of the shared reference-fixing criteria for names and natural kind terms.[11]

4.2 The role of the 2D framework

Externalists argue that ordinary speakers are often ignorant or mistaken about the precise nature (modal profile) of the objects, kinds or properties their words pick out. But linguistic conventions don’t always fix the reference by specifying the nature of the reference. Indexicals are a clear case in point: you can understand my use of the term ‘here’ in an email, without realizing that it refers to Melbourne in all possible worlds. This ignorance is possible because the semantic rule for ‘here’ fixes the reference via a contingent property of the place picked out (i.e., a given utterance happened to occur there). Perhaps the conventions governing names and natural kind terms are structured in a similar way, specifying the reference via its contingent properties. For instance, we might have an implicit semantic rule requiring us to take ‘water’ to pick out whatever chemical kind actually explains a certain suite of superficial observable properties: e.g., being a clear, potable, odorless liquid that fills lakes and streams around here (Jackson 1998a, 1998b). On this analysis, ‘water’ just is an implicitly indexical expression, picking out different chemical kinds depending on which world constitutes the actual context of use. If this rule is what one must accept to count as competent with the meaning of the expression type ‘water’, then it is no surprise that competent speakers often fail to realize that water = H2O: for they may not know that H2O is what actually fulfills the reference-fixing role in question. Externalist examples of ignorance and error, therefore, do not directly threaten the empiricist account of meaning.

Of course, it is an empirical question whether names and natural kind terms are in fact governed by indirect reference-fixing rules of this sort. But according to the 2D empiricist, you can test whether your implicit understanding of ‘water’ is structured in the relevant way by considering possible situations in two different roles: as your actual environment or as a mere counterfactual circumstance of evaluation (Jackson 1998a, ch. 2). Consider two different possible worlds based on Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment (Putnam 1972). In the first world, Earth, the clear potable stuff that fills lakes and streams and is habitually called ‘water’ by English speakers is H2O. The second world, Twin Earth, is exactly the same except that the stuff that has these properties is the complex chemical kind, XYZ. If your commonsense understanding of ‘water’ is governed by the proposed reference-fixing convention, it would lead you to identify different chemical substances as water depending on what your actual environment is like: if your actual environment is like Earth, then water is HO; but if your actual environment is like Twin earth, then water is XYZ. If you assume that water is actually H2O, however, you will judge that water is essentially H2O in all counterfactual circumstances. And if you assume water is actually XYZ, then you’ll judge water is essentially XYZ.

This pattern of dispositions to apply the term ‘water’ can be depicted on a 2D matrix as follows:

Empiricist 2D matrix for ‘water’:
Earth Twin Earth
\(\langle\)Earth, \(a, t\rangle\) H2O H2O
\(\langle\)Twin Earth, \(a, t\rangle\) XYZ XYZ

Along the vertical axis are ranged centered possible worlds (a possible world, with a designated agent \(a\) and time \(t\) within that world) representing different ways your actual environment could be like; and the same worlds are ranged along the horizontal axis representing different counterfactual circumstances of evaluation. This matrix reflects your commonsense dispositions to apply the term ‘water’ to different chemical kinds on the basis of whether it actually plays certain superficial roles described in other commonsense terms (‘clear’, ‘potable’, ‘liquid’, etc).[12]

Semantic externalists take these sorts of judgments about Twin Earth to militate against a traditional account of meaning—for they suggest that your understanding does not fully determine the nature of the reference. But according to 2D empiricists like Jackson, the only conclusion that is warranted is that the meaning of your term is more complex than the tradition suggests: your verdicts about possible worlds considered as actual reflect your naïve reference-fixing criterion, and your verdicts about possible worlds considered as counterfactual reflect the theoretical criterion you would accept after you learned all the relevant empirical facts about your actual environment. These two types of criterion can be modeled in possible world semantics as intensions: an A-intension (for ‘Actual’) is a function from worlds considered as actual to extensions, while a C-intension (for ‘Counterfactual’) is a function from worlds considered as counterfactual to extensions (Jackson 1998a, ch.2). The diagonal of our matrix corresponds to the A-intension you associate with ‘water’; and the first horizontal row corresponds to the C-intension of your term ‘water’ (assuming that \(\langle\)Earth, \(a, t\rangle\) represents your real-world environment).

While semantic externalists acknowledge only the C-intension as modeling an expression’s semantic content, 2D empiricists will insist that both A- and C-intensions reflect important aspects of a competent English speaker’s understanding of a word like ‘water’. In particular, they take A-intensions to reflect what is understood and communicated by minimally competent English speakers and what guides their everyday classifications. The suggestion, then, is that A-intensions capture the shared, conventionally entrenched understanding of reference-fixing conditions posited by the empiricist approach to meaning.

By itself, this 2D framework offers no guarantee that the hypothetical judgments recorded by an A-intension are produced by a stable reference-fixing criterion. Nor does it guarantee that the very same A-intension will be generated for all competent speakers in your linguistic community. However, according to the 2D empiricist, we have solid empirical reasons to think these conditions are satisfied in the case of names and natural kind terms. First, the widespread acceptance of the externalist thought experiments demonstrates that we do in fact share similar reference-fixing criteria for terms like ‘water’ and ‘Gödel’ (Jackson 1998a, 38–39). Second, the empiricist model of meaning provides the best psychological explanation of how such linguistic coordination is achieved (Jackson 1998b).[13]

4.3 Apriori conceptual analysis

In addition to clarifying the structure of our semantic understanding, the 2D framework can help justify specific conceptual analyses. The criteria that implicitly guide our everyday use of a term are often embodied in recognitional or inferential dispositions rather than in consciously accessible rules. Indeed, Jackson likens grasp of reference-fixing criteria for particular expressions to our ability to recognize the grammaticality of sentences in one’s own language (2000). Just as linguists can construct a grammar for your language on the basis of your judgments about the acceptability of particular sentences, you can construct an analysis of the meaning you associate with an expression on the basis of your application of a term to hypothetical cases. The correct analysis must capture the full range of your confident judgments involving the target expression, while abstracting away from performance errors and other interfering factors (Jackson 1998a, 31–37).

This psychological model helps explain how you can come to know the correct analysis of your term ‘water’ by noting which properties you treat as “obvious and central” when filling in a 2D matrix like the one above (Jackson 1998a, 31). The 2D framework is particularly helpful for analyzing the meaning of proper names or natural kind terms, because it prompts you to consider possible cases in two different ways;–as actual or as counterfactual. Your verdicts about whether the stuff on Twin Earth counts as water, for instance, depends on whether you think of Twin Earth as a hypothesis about your actual environment or as a purely counterfactual possibility. When the A- and C-intensions for your term diverge as they do in the case of ‘water’, 2D empiricists suggest that the correct analysis will take the form of rigidified definite descriptions using the indexical term ‘actual’: water \(=_{df}\) the actual stuff that has such-and-such superficial properties. Moreover, careful attention to your reactions to the hypothetical scenarios will allow you to make explicit which superficial properties implicitly guide your application of the term. For instance, you may discover that your implicit criterion for applying ‘water’ is that water \(=_{df}\) the actual chemical kind in your environment that is a clear, potable, odorless liquid that falls as rain and fills lakes and streams. Alternatively, your use of the term ‘water’ may be guided by the types of causal relations invoked in causal theories of reference: water \(=_{df}\) the actual natural kind that has been the dominant cause of your community’s past use of the term ‘water’. Indeed, Jackson suggests that standard causal theories of reference are based on this method of conceptual analysis (1998a, 37–41). [See the entry on causal theories of mental content.]

The conceptual analyses produced by this method count as apriori, according to the 2D empiricist, because you can know them to be correct “independently of knowing what the actual world is like” (Jackson 1998a, 51). The evidence that supports such analyses consists in purely hypothetical judgments: judgments about how to classify cases on the supposition that your environment is like \(X\), or like \(Y\). Since such hypothetical judgments don’t require you to determine what your real environment is like, your justification for accepting an analysis is not based on empirical knowledge. And to change your judgment about a purely hypothetical case would be to change the meaning of your term (Jackson 1998a, 44–46).

4.4 The role of conceptual analysis in metaphysics

According to empiricist 2D semantics, the truth of any metaphysical reduction depends on the reference-fixing conditions conventionally associated with the terms involved—and these reference-fixing conditions are always knowable apriori. So apriori conceptual analysis plays a crucial role in vindicating metaphysical reductions (Jackson 1994; 1998a).

Metaphysical reductions provide a constitutive account of some target domain (e.g., beliefs, free will, water, moral rightness) in terms of more basic features of the world (e.g., the properties postulated by an idealized physics, ideas in the mind of God, the mosaic of sense data). A physicalist about mental states, for instance, is committed to there being specific facts about the microphysical structure of the world that suffice for the existence of beliefs, desires and sensory experiences. The physicalist is thus committed to metaphysically necessary “entailments” connecting claims about the two domains: it’s metaphysically necessary that if such-and-such physical facts obtain, then such-and-such mental facts obtain. This metaphysical entailment relation can arguably be cashed out in terms of global supervenience (Jackson 1998a, 6–14). [See the entry on supervenience.]

On the empiricist view of meaning, the relevance of conceptual analysis to metaphysics is then straightforward: conceptual analysis establishes that a putative reduction respects the original meaning of the target expression (Jackson 1998a, 28). Obviously, the physicalist won’t succeed in accounting for free will if she identifies free will with having a temperature of 37.4º Celsius. Such a “reduction” would simply change the subject under discussion. A successful reduction must be answerable to our original shared understanding of the target expression—and elucidating this original understanding just is what conceptual analysis does. So if conceptual analyses are knowable apriori, it follows that metaphysical reductions must always be backed by apriori entailments between the base-level claim (such as a physical description of the world) and the target claim (such as the claim that humans have free will).

Conceptual analysis plays a modest role on the empiricist account. Apriori conceptual analysis merely tells you about the relations among your ideas; it cannot tell you whether there are any objects, kinds, or properties that satisfy your current reference-fixing assumptions (Jackson 1998a, 42–4). Moreover, the meaning you currently associate with a term may be pragmatically deficient: e.g., it may not be determinate enough to settle certain hard cases or it may not allow you to draw useful distinctions in your actual environment. In such cases, you would have good pragmatic reasons to change the meaning of your term (Jackson 1998a, 44–6, 53–4). What the empiricist denies is that changing your current criteria for applying a term can ever get you closer to the truth about what you meant all along.

4.5 Objections to the empiricist project

Criticisms of the empiricist use of 2D semantics to explain linguistic coordination can be divided into two broad categories: (i) criticisms that target the account of linguistic conventions, and (ii) criticisms that target the account of individuals’ linguistic understanding.

The empiricist account of linguistic conventions has elicited the most criticism. On this account, A-intensions capture the content of tacit linguistic conventions of the sort outlined by Lewis (1969). If this is right, then the reference-fixing conditions for words like ‘knowledge’, ‘water’, or ‘Barack Obama’ must meet two strong empirical constraints:

  1. All (or almost all) speakers in a community must associate the very same reference-fixing condition with the term.
  2. This convergence must be mutually obvious to all (or almost all) speakers.

Both assumptions have been challenged. On the first point: Most philosophers acknowledge that competent English speakers can have entirely different criteria for identifying the reference of a proper name like ‘Barack Obama’ and many acknowledge significant variability in competent speakers’ initial understanding of natural kind terms like ‘water’: we don’t need to share precisely the same “folk theory” of Obama or of water in order to be linguistically competent with those terms (e.g., Burge 1979; Kripke 1980; Quine 1951a). To back up this intuitive point, experimental philosophers have marshaled survey data to argue that English speakers from different ethnic or socio-economic backgrounds classify hypothetical cases, such as Gettier cases or Twin Earth cases, differently (Machery et al. 2004; Nichols et al. 2004; Stich and Weinberg 2001; Weinberg et al. 2001). In response to such worries, Jackson acknowledges that different speakers’ criteria for applying a term may not be perfectly matched, but he argues that there must be significant overall similarity in reference-fixing criteria for everyday practical coordination. Empiricist 2D semantics is meant to explain this imperfect similarity (1998b, 214–5). See also Lewis (1997), who posits higher-order similarities among speakers’ reference-fixing commitments. On the second point: Critics (Kroon 2004a; Schroeter 2003) challenge 2D empiricist’s assumption of common knowledge of reference-fixing conditions, arguing that speakers are not in a position to know the range of variation and similarity in speakers’ understanding of a term within their linguistic community. If this is right, then tacit linguistic conventions cannot get off the ground: if speakers don’t know what the standard linguistic practices are, they cannot be expected to conform to those standards. In response, an empiricist may claim that communal standards will inevitably involve some indeterminacy.

Criticizing the details of this 2D account of linguistic conventions won’t carry much weight if the only way to explain the phenomena is to posit some similarity (however partial or indeterminate) among speakers’ reference-fixing criteria. Several critics, however, argue that the best explanation of how speakers manage to knowingly coordinate on the same reference does not require individual speakers to share similar criteria for applying the term. Instead, the best explanation is that speakers are causally and historically embedded within the same community and they are generally disposed to hold their own use of a term accountable to that of the community as a whole.

There is, of course, a distinction between understanding a word and not understanding it. One can lack understanding of a word through lack of causal interaction with the social practice of using that word, or through interaction too superficial to permit sufficiently fluent engagement in the practice. But sufficiently fluent engagement in the practice can take many forms, which have no single core of agreement. (Williamson 2007, 126)

On this account, knowing co-reference does not require speakers to share any particular substantive criterion for identifying the reference. What explains interpersonal coordination is speakers’ mutual commitment to a communal referential practice, not some independently specifiable similarity in their associated criteria. See (Kroon 2004b; Schroeter and Bigelow 2009; Schroeter and Schroeter 2009) for similar responses to Jackson, and (Burge 1979; 1989) for an influential defense of a social model of competence.

The second distinctive aspect of the empiricist account of meaning is the idea that individual speakers have implicit knowledge of reference-fixing conditions. This model of linguistic understanding can be challenged in two different ways. First, there is the psychological claim that competent speakers have something like an internal reference-fixing template—a stable set of criteria for identifying the reference that guides the application of the term both in everyday use and in hypothetical reasoning. Some critics argue that individuals’ judgments about cases are more plausibly explained without positing any such stable template (Schroeter 2006; Schroeter and Bigelow 2009). Second, there is the semantic claim that a speaker’s everyday criteria determine the real reference of her words. The semantic claim is challenged by theorists working in a broadly Quinean tradition. Such critics argue that the reference of someone’s word is determined not by the speaker’s settled dispositions to apply a word to cases, but by how these criteria should be refined in light of empirical facts about the speaker’s environment so as to meet broader theoretical and practical interests associated with the speaker’s use of the word (Block and Stalnaker 1999; Schroeter 2003; Williamson 2007; Yablo 2000a, 2000b). While 2D empiricists can acknowledge that refinements of the subject’s current conception are important, they will insist that refinements that depart from naïve understanding (such as a compatibilist conception of free will) constitute a change of meaning. The 2D empiricist thus advocates the sort of position articulated by Carnap (1950), while critics champion views closer to those of Quine (1951a, 1951b) or Putnam (1974).

5. The Rationalist Project

5.1 Connecting meaning, apriority, and possibility

For an empiricist, an expression’s meaning reflects the causal mechanisms guiding everyday classification and communication. For a rationalist, in contrast, an expression’s meaning reflects what is apriori accessible to the speaker on the basis of ideal reflection. The empiricist is primarily concerned with causal explanation, while the rationalist is primarily concerned with idealized apriori rationality. This difference in emphasis on the part of the rationalist can have significant ramifications for a generalized 2D semantics.

David Chalmers has developed a detailed and influential rationalist interpretation of the 2D framework. This semantic project is situated within a broadly rationalist tradition that posits a “golden triangle” of necessary constitutive relations between meaning, apriority, and possibility (2004; 2006a).

Following Frege (1892), the 2D rationalist is interested in capturing a notion of meaning that is finer-grained than reference. Frege pointed out that sentences containing co-referential expressions like ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ can differ in cognitive significance: someone who is competent with these two names may not realize they are co-referential and may therefore use them differently in making and justifying claims. Frege took sameness of cognitive significance to be the mark of sameness of meaning. According to a 2D rationalist, sameness of cognitive significance can in most cases be elucidated in terms of apriori equivalence: two expressions are associated with the same meaning iff one can know that they pick out the very same things on the basis of apriori reflection alone (Chalmers 2002b).[14] This constitutive link between meaning and apriority constitutes the first side of the “golden triangle”.

The second side of the “golden triangle” connects meaning with possibility. Following Carnap (1947), the 2D rationalist suggests that we can use possible worlds semantics to individuate particular meanings in terms of their representational properties. In standard possible world semantics, the meaning of ‘doctor’ is identified with an intension that maps possible worlds to extensions. An expression’s intension reflects the modal profile of the object, kind, or property picked out. Identifying meanings with intensions therefore establishes an important constitutive connection between meanings and modal claims. If ‘doctor’ and ‘physician’ are associated with the same meaning, then it’s true in all possible worlds that all doctors are physicians and all physicians are doctors. And conversely if two expressions are co-extensive in all possible worlds, then they have the same meaning.

The third side of the “golden triangle” connects possibility with apriority. Following Kant (1787), a rationalist about modality holds that what is necessary is always knowable apriori and what is knowable apriori is always necessary. Thus ideal apriori reflection can be trusted to reveal the space of possibility.

This “golden triangle” of constitutive relations generates a distinctive rationalist account of meaning. To be competent with an expression’s meaning is to be in an internal cognitive state that puts one in a position to identify its extension in any possible world on the basis of apriori reflection alone. Apriori reflection will also suffice to determine whether two expressions are associated with the same or different meanings. This rationalist approach to meaning contrasts with the empiricist one: whereas the empiricist uses causally efficacious cognitive mechanisms to isolate the reference-fixing criteria currently associated with an expression, the rationalist uses the subject’s ideally rational judgments to isolate the complex cognitive states that would ground those reflective judgments. As a consequence, the aspect of understanding that corresponds to a rationalist meaning may turn out to be more heterogeneous and less stable than the shared, causally efficacious ‘templates’ postulated by the empiricist. The “golden triangle” also involves a distinctive rationalist account of modal epistemology, according to which ideal apriori conceivability is a fail-safe guide to metaphysical possibility. This modal rationalism affords a simple and attractive account of our access to modal facts (Chalmers 1996, 136–8; 1999, 488–91; 2002a).[15]

This simple rationalist picture of meaning and modality, however, was undermined by externalist thought experiments. Kripke’s (1980) observation that certain necessary truths, like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, are only knowable aposteriori threatens both the idea that linguistic competence affords apriori access to the truth- and applicability-conditions of one’s words and the idea that necessary truths are always apriori knowable. The guiding idea behind 2D rationalism is that a rationalist can accommodate Kripke’s examples by moving to a 2D semantic framework. In particular, the 2D framework can be used to isolate an aspect of meaning that satisfies the “golden triangle” of constitutive relations among meaning, apriority and modality.

Roughly, the idea is that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is aposteriori because we associate distinct reference-fixing criteria with the two names: e.g., being the brightest star visible in the evening and the brightest star visible the morning. According to the 2D rationalist, these reference-fixing criteria are (i) an aspect of meaning, (ii) which can be known apriori via conceptual analysis, and (iii) which suffices to fix the applicability conditions for every possible world considered as one’s actual environment. If the 2D framework can be used to isolate such an aspect of meaning for all expressions, we will have vindicated the rationalist’s “golden triangle” connecting meaning, apriority and possibility.

Vindicating this “golden triangle” constitutes a primary theoretical constraint for a rationalist interpretation of 2D semantics. A 2D semantics that meets this constraint would play a wide-ranging role in philosophy. It would account for core semantic roles associated with the Fregean notion of sense (Chalmers 2002b) and the traditional notion of a proposition (Chalmers 2011a). In addition, rationalist 2D semantics promises to define a versatile notion of narrow thought content suited to playing key explanatory and evaluative roles in commonsense psychology (Chalmers 2002c). Furthermore, the rationalist approach to meaning and modality underwrites a distinctive form of apriori reasoning about the nature of the actual world:

There is a long tradition in philosophy of using apriori methods to draw conclusions about what is possible and what is necessary, and often in turn to draw conclusions about matters of substantive metaphysics. Arguments like this typically have three steps: first an epistemic claim (about what can be known or conceived), from there to a modal claim (about what is possible or necessary), and from there to a metaphysical claim (about the nature of things in the world). (Chalmers 2002a, 145)

Chalmers has developed a highly influential anti-physicalist argument along these lines, which relies on a rationalist 2D semantic framework to establish that facts about phenomenal consciousness cannot be reduced to physical or functional facts about the brain (1996; 2009). [See the supplementary document: The 2D Argument Against Materialism.]

5.2 The epistemic interpretation of the 2D framework

Any interpretation of the 2D framework must answer the following two questions:

  1. What is the nature of the worlds to be considered as actual?
  2. What is the principle for determining an expression’s extension relative to worlds considered as actual?

But the rationalist project imposes specific constraints on how these questions are answered. To vindicate the “golden triangle”, the rationalist must identify a way of mapping an individual speaker’s understanding of particular expressions onto possible worlds that affords apriori access to the entire space of possibility. This is not a trivial requirement: standard ways of interpreting the 2D framework cannot vindicate the rationalist project. However Chalmers has developed a distinctive “epistemic” interpretation of the 2D framework that he believes can establish the relevant constitutive links between meaning, apriority and possibility (2004, 2006a).

A rationalist 2D semantics must vindicate the following principle:

Core Thesis: For any sentence \(S, S\) is apriori iff \(S\) has a necessary 1-intension. (Chalmers 2004, 165)

A sentence’s 1-intension is an intension that corresponds to the diagonal of a 2D matrix. So the Core Thesis affirms that a token sentence is apriori (for a subject at a particular time) just in case there is no possible way the world might be that, if it actually obtained, would make \(S\) false. In effect, the Core Thesis sums up the “golden triangle” of constitutive connections the rationalist hopes to establish between meaning, apriority, and possibility: (i) it postulates a possible way the world could be for every apriori coherent hypothesis, and vice versa; and (ii) this tight connection between apriority and possibility is reflected in an aspect of linguistic meaning, the 1-intension.[16]

The major obstacle to vindicating the Core Thesis for standard interpretations of the 2D framework is the assignment principle—the way 2D theories assign extensions relative to “worlds considered as actual”. A natural way of understanding the injunction to consider a possible world as actual is to simply imagine a possible world, locate oneself in it, and then rely on ordinary interpretive methods to decide what exactly a person in those empirical circumstances is referring to when using a given expression. Chalmers calls this strategy for assigning 1-intensions to expressions a “contextualist” interpretation of the 2D framework. What’s distinctive of a contextualist approach is (i) that a token of the target expression must be located within the world considered as actual, and (ii) that the expression is assigned an extension on the basis of how it’s used in that world. On this approach, a 1-intension will be undefined for possible worlds that do not contain a token of the target expression: no extension can be assigned for such worlds, not even an empty extension.

This contextualist approach to assigning 1-intensions is incompatible with the Core Thesis (Chalmers 2004, 167­–176). Consider sentences like ‘Language exists’ or ‘A sentient being exists’: intuitively the meaning of these sentences will guarantee that they are true in every possible context in which they are used. So on the contextualist approach, these sentences should be assigned necessary 1-intensions, mapping every possible context of use to the truth-value True. But contrary to the Core Thesis, these sentences are not apriori truths knowable independently of any empirical evidence. After all, there’s no contradiction in the very idea of a world without language or thought, and we can imagine perfectly well what such a world would be like. It’s just that our everyday experience allows us to immediately rule out the possibility that our actual environment is like that. The problem is that although it’s both apriori coherent and metaphysically possible for there to be worlds with no language or thought, contextualist 1-intensions are undefined for those possible worlds. So a necessary contextual 1-intension does not track apriority or metaphysical necessity. Contextualist 1-intensions, therefore, cannot satisfy the rationalist’s Core Thesis.[17]

This difficulty can be avoided, Chalmers argues, if we rely on a notion of epistemic possibility—what seems possible after ideal rational reflection—to interpret the 2D framework. More specifically, he focuses on the notion of apriori coherence: claims that could be true for all one can tell on the basis of idealized apriori reasoning.[18] This notion of apriori coherence is used to answer the two interpretive questions highlighted above: (i) apriori coherence is used to characterize the possibilities relative to which 1-intensions are defined, and (2) apriori coherence is invoked to assign 1-intensions to a speaker’s expressions.

First consider the possibilities that define 1-intensions. On the epistemic interpretation, the possibilities are not metaphysically possible contexts of use, but epistemically possible “scenarios”: maximally specific hypotheses about what one’s actual environment might be like that cannot be ruled out through apriori reasoning alone. Scenarios provide a complete characterization of the entire history of a universe, down to the last microphysical detail. They also provide perspectival information—a notional “center”—that indicates the location from which the hypothetical universe is to be considered. The crucial point is that scenarios are defined by their epistemic role: they represent ways we can conceive of the actual world, within which we can try to identify familiar objects, kinds or properties.[19]

The second distinctive element of the epistemic interpretation of 2D semantics is the procedure for assigning 1-intensions to a speaker’s expressions. On the epistemic approach, 1-intensions reflect relations of apriori coherence between descriptions of possible scenarios and ordinary language sentences:

The epistemic 1-intension for a sentence \(S\) is True at a scenario \(W\) iff \((W\) & not\(-S)\) is apriori incoherent. (Chalmers 2004, 180–4)

This principle for assigning 1-intensions relies on the speaker’s ordinary ability to engage in object-level reasoning about combinations of hypotheses: given the assumption that the scenario description \(W\) is true, you’re asked to decide whether \(S\) must be true as well. If it’s incoherent to accept \((W\) & not\(-S)\), your epistemic intension for \(S\) maps \(W\) to True, otherwise \(W\) is mapped to False. This epistemic assignment principle contrasts sharply with the contextualist principle. The contextualist approach requires us to engage in explicit meta-linguistic reasoning to interpret the expression ‘\(S\)’ as it’s used within the possible world \(W\). On the epistemic approach, in contrast, an extension is assigned to ‘\(S\)’ on the basis of the subject’s own object-level reasoning using the expressions ‘\(W\)’ and ‘\(S\)’.

Unlike the contextualist approach, therefore, the epistemic assignment principle does not explicitly require that a scenario contain a token of the relevant expression type in order to assign an extension relative to that scenario. As a consequence, sentences like ‘Language exists’ seem to pose no special problem for satisfying the Core Thesis. The sentence ‘Language exists’ will have a contingent epistemic 1-intension, because there are possible scenarios that are apriori consistent with both the truth and falsity of that sentence. For instance, consider a scenario in which the only object is a giant lump of salt. To test whether your sentence ‘Language exists’ is true at this scenario considered as actual, you ask whether there is any incoherence in combining the claim ‘The only object that exists is a lump of salt’ with the claim ‘It’s not the case that language exists’. Intuitively, this combination is coherent: there is no language in the salt world. So the epistemic 1-intension for your sentence ‘Language exists’ yields the value False for that scenario. Since there are other scenarios relative to which the sentence ‘Language exists’ will have the value True, your sentence will have a contingent epistemic 1-intension. This contingent epistemic intension for your sentence ‘Language exists’ reflects the fact that it’s not apriori true that language exists. So it seems the epistemic assignment principle will allow apriority and necessity of the 1-intension to go hand in hand, as required by the Core Thesis.

5.3 Defining the E2D Framework

There is further work to do in spelling out Chalmers’ E2D framework in such a way as to vindicate his rationalist project. One way to think about the rationalist project is as a combination of the following theses:

  1. Semantic foundationalism holds that there is a canonical level of description that affords transparent epistemic access to an objective space of apriori possibilities – i.e. ways the world might be for all that can be known independently of all experience.
  2. Meaning rationalism holds that implicit conceptual competence puts one in a position to conclusively know the applicability conditions of one’s words relative to every such scenario considered as actual.
  3. Modal rationalism holds that the space of apriori epistemic possibility is a failsafe guide to the space of metaphysical possibility: there are no modal illusions when scenarios or worlds are described in canonical terms

Together, 1 and 2 constitute a sort of semantic reductionism: the meaning of any ordinary language expression is reduced to the meanings of the base vocabulary via the epistemic exercise of considering scenarios as actual and worlds as counterfactual. And 3 ensures that this epistemic exercise is an accurate guide to metaphysical possibility. Chalmers’ Core Thesis is meant to capture this tight relationship between grasp of meaning, apriori reflection, and metaphysical possibility.

However, simply rejecting C2D in favor of E2D does not yet provide any positive account of what it is to entertain an epistemic scenario W, and how we should update our beliefs in the light of the supposition that W is actual. Without these details, it’s impossible to determine whether the Core Thesis is true. Perhaps it’s impossible to consider a scenario as actual without presupposing one’s own existence, or perhaps our best epistemic methods for updating our beliefs presupposes the existence of those very beliefs; or perhaps there is no way of thinking about the world that doesn’t rely on some further empirical assumptions about the world.

Chalmers has entered into these interpretive questions in considerable detail over many publications. The starting point for his approach is outlined in (Chalmers and Jackson 2001), where he suggests that scenarios can be understood as PQTI sentences: where P states microphysical truths, Q states phenomenal truths, T is a ‘that’s all’ clause indicating that P and Q provide a complete description of a possible universe, and I indicates the subject’s notional location within that universe. P and Q employ a canonical vocabulary that fully specifies the essential nature of the fundamental properties upon which all other properties in a possible world supervene. Thus, PQTI sentences provide an epistemically transparent access to the space of epistemic and metaphysical possibility (simply removing the self-locating information from a PQTI sentence yields a complete description of a corresponding possible world, PQT). The 1-intensions of one’s ordinary language expressions are then determined by the individual subject’s ideally reflective dispositions to judge sentences true, assuming the truth of different PQTI-sentences. And 2-intensions are fixed by one’s reasoning about PQT sentences considered as counterfactual (given assumptions about PQTI). (Chalmers 2006, 2011b) further articulates how the space of epistemic possibility can be understood, how scenarios are related to possible worlds, and how 1- and 2-intensions are assigned to token representations.

Most recently, in Constructing the World (2012), Chalmers has focused squarely on the epistemic ‘scrutability’ relation that connects our understanding of ordinary language expressions to base-level descriptions of scenarios.

Apriori Scrutability: There is a compact class of basic truths D such that for any truth S, one can conclusively know ‘D \(\supset\) S’ apriori.

Chalmers still takes PQTI sentences to be a promising candidate for specifying a scrutability base D, but he is open to the possibility that the descriptive vocabulary in PQTI may need to be supplemented in order to capture some truths, such as truths about causal relations or quiddities. But while he can afford to be flexible about the exact nature of the scrutability base, Chalmers’ rationalist program depends on vindicating Apriori Scrutability for any sentence that is evaluable as possibly true or false (169–71). A good deal thus hangs on whether he is right that ideal epistemic procedures allow for apriori justification, given an exhaustive base-level description of a scenario. Chalmers offers two complementary arguments to support the plausibility of this view in (2012, ch. 4.).

It’s worth noting that there are other ways of interpreting an E2D framework defined on epistemic and metaphysical possibilities, which do not support Chalmers’ rationalist program. Wolfgang Spohn, for instance, suggests that the epistemically possible scenarios should be understood along the lines of concrete universes, whereas counterfactual metaphysical possibilities should be understood as ‘totalities’ constructed from the best descriptions of a concrete environment (Spohn 2016). Spohn suggests that this interpretation of the 2D framework does a better job in capturing the ways in which our ways of categorizing our actual physical environment is partly pragmatic and not fully determined by its physical structure, and while also vindicating metaphysical essentialism for counterfactual possibilities. The result is a pragmatist approach to E2D that is ill suited to Chalmers’ rationalist project.

5.4 Semantic pluralism

Epistemic 2D semantics differs in important respects from other theoretical accounts of meaning. Semantic theories normally describe general semantic rules governing expression types, whereas epistemic 2D semantics is based on a single individual’s current understanding of a token expression. Kaplan and Jackson, for instance, use the 2D framework to characterize the implicit conventions governing syntactically individuated expressions like ‘I’ or ‘water’ in our linguistic community. In contrast, the rationalist uses the 2D framework to characterize your potentially idiosyncratic understanding of a particular use of an expression on a given occasion—e.g., the way you understood Al Gore’s fifth use of ‘water’ during a speech on climate change. On the epistemic approach, moreover, 2D semantic values depend on the upshot of ideal rational reflection about apriori coherence relations. Just what is involved in ideal rational reflection is an open question. But it’s plausible that it may depend on substantive constructive theorizing about the empirical scenario in question and on various non-obvious and idiosyncratic aspects of the subject’s initial cognitive state. In that case, identifying the precise epistemic 1-intension associated with your understanding of ‘water’ will be a highly non-trivial matter, and it may be far from obvious when your understanding of the term shifts so that two tokens no longer share the same epistemic 1-intension. This is why, in contrast with 2D empiricists like Jackson, a rationalist like Chalmers denies that epistemic 1-intensions reflect the subject’s “implicit knowledge” of a reference-fixing criterion (e.g., Chalmers 2002a, 185; 2006b, §5).

Of course, it’s possible that some epistemic intensions will reflect stable reference-fixing rules that are entrenched by implicit linguistic conventions. But it’s also possible that some epistemic intensions will reflect highly abstract, heterogeneous, unstable, and idiosyncratic aspects of a speaker’s understanding at a given time. As a consequence, epistemic intensions are not guaranteed to line up with conventional linguistic meanings (Chalmers 2002b). Given this divergence from standard semantic theories, one may wonder whether epistemic intensions deserve to be considered a kind of meaning.

However, according to the 2D rationalist, epistemic intensions play the core semantic roles associated with Fregean senses (Chalmers 2002b). Like Fregean senses, epistemic 1-intensions lend themselves to a compositional semantic theory: the epistemic intension of a sentence is determined by the epistemic intensions of the component expressions. Moreover, epistemic 1-intensions, like Fregean senses, reflect the speaker’s own rational perspective on what her words represent. Two token names ‘\(A\)’ and ‘\(B\)’ have the same Fregean senses iff the identity ‘A = B’ would strike the speaker as trivially true. Similarly, a subject associates two token expressions with the same epistemic intension iff they are apriori equivalent.[20] Finally, epistemic intensions may play a role similar to that of Fregean senses in the semantics of attitude reports (Chalmers 2011a). Overall, then, epistemic intensions seem to provide an attractive theoretical refinement of the Fregean notion of sense.

In addition, epistemic intensions arguably carve out a well-defined notion of narrow content suited to playing key roles in commonsense psychology (Chalmers 2002c). Epistemic intensions reflect rational relations among a person’s thoughts that are discernible independently of any empirical inquiry. As a consequence, epistemic intensions identify representational states that are relevant to assessing a person’s rationality and to explaining rational thought processes.

It’s important to note that epistemic 1-intensions are intended to explain only one aspect of meaning. The 2D semantic framework also posits 2-intensions (“counterfactual” or “subjunctive” intensions), which reflect the modal profile of the object, kind or property picked out by an expression. All 2D theorists agree that 2-intensions play an important role in explaining the semantics of modal sentences. Moreover, the two aspects of meaning captured by the epistemic 2D framework are not intended to provide an exhaustive characterization of all semantically relevant phenomena:

Two-dimensionalism is naturally combined with a semantic pluralism, according to which expressions and utterances can be associated with many different semantic (or quasi-semantic) values, by many different semantic (or quasi-semantic) relations. On this view there should be no question about whether the primary intension or the secondary intension is the content of an utterance. Both can be systematically associated with utterances, and both can play some of the roles that we want contents to play. Furthermore, there will certainly be explanatory roles that neither of them play, so two-dimensionalism should not be seen as offering an exhaustive account of the content of an utterance. Rather it is characterizing some aspects of utterance content, aspects that can play a useful role in the epistemic and modal domains. (Chalmers 2006a, §3.5)

5.5 Objections to the rationalist project

Two distinctive aspects of the rationalist project are (a) its commitment to the modal rationalist thesis that we have apriori access to the space of metaphysical possibility and (b) its commitment to an apriori aspect of meaning that can be captured with the 2D modal framework. Both aspects of the rationalist project have been challenged by critics.

a. Modal rationalism

According to the modal rationalist, if a hypothesis cannot be ruled out by idealized apriori reflection then it’s metaphysically possible for it to be true. So the space of apriori coherent scenarios is a failsafe guide to the space of metaphysical possibility. This thesis is crucial if one hopes to draw metaphysical conclusions on the basis of apriori conceptual analysis (e.g., the 2D argument against materialism). Critics have challenged the extensional adequacy of modal rationalism on the basis of putative counterexamples. The thesis is also open to more general theoretical challenges.

Certain examples suggest that a hypothesis can be apriori coherent even though it’s metaphysically impossible for it to be true. Sometimes a claim and its negation both seem apriori coherent. For instance, it seems apriori coherent that there could be a necessarily existing god and that there could be no such god—but obviously it’s impossible for both of these claims to be true. This suggests that apriori coherence is a fallible guide to genuine possibility (Yablo 1999, 2000b). Other examples of this sort include unprovable mathematical necessities and metaphysically necessary laws of nature. Chalmers (1999, 2002a) argues that all such alleged counterexamples fail: either they are not apriori coherent (e.g. necessarily existing beings) or they are not necessary (e.g., necessary laws of nature). A different type of counterexample turns on concepts whose applicability is determined by a subject’s ostensive or recognitional capacities in the actual world (Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Perry 2001; Yablo 2002). For instance, we may recognize ovals by the way they would visually strike us. Since the applicability of such concepts depends on the actual exercise of these psychological capacities (whose nature we don’t fully understand), it’s impossible to know apriori whether a certain equation in analytic geometry captures the shape of ovals. To know this, one must actually see the shapes generated by the equation (Yablo 2002, §13–19; 2006). In response, (Chalmers 2002a, §12) argues that the alleged counterexamples can be accommodated within his 2D framework.

A third type of alleged counterexample hinges on objects, kinds or properties whose intrinsic character is not exhaustively knowable (Schroeter 2004). For instance, it might be impossible to fully understand the intrinsic character of quarks and gluons—we can only know them by their causal effects at the macro-level. It seems apriori coherent that there could be such unknowable properties. But then according to modal rationalism itself, there must be distinct metaphysical possible worlds that cannot be distinguished through apriori reflection: e.g., two possible worlds in which different intrinsic properties play the gluon role. So apriori coherence would fail to provide an accurate guide to the space of metaphysical possibility. In response, (Chalmers 2002a, §10–11; 2006a, §5) argues that (i) unknowable essences are controversial and may be incoherent, (ii) the 2D framework can still capture what is possible for all we can know, and (iii) there will still be at least one metaphysical possibility for every apriori coherent scenario, so apriori coherence is still a failsafe guide to metaphysical possibility.

Finally, the underlying rationalist claim that objective metaphysical possibility is constitutively bound up with ideal rationality is controversial. Modal conventionalists seek to explain the access to modal facts by denying their objective status: facts about what’s possible are mere projections of our implicit semantic rules or psychological dispositions (e.g., Kant 1787; Carnap 1950; Sidelle 1989). Modal empiricists, in contrast, insist on the judgment-independent nature of metaphysical facts and deny that we have apriori access to them: our access to the nature of empirical objects, kinds, and properties is always based on and corrigible by experience (e.g., Putnam 1975; Stalnaker 2003; Williamson 2007; Yablo 2000). In contrast, the modal rationalist seeks to vindicate the objectivity of modal facts by appealing to idealized apriori reasoning (Descartes 1641; Chalmers 2002a). [See the entry on the epistemology of modality.]

b. The Core Thesis

Even if one rejects modal rationalism, the semantic rationalist insists that epistemic 2D semantics may capture an important aspect of meaning that connects meaning, apriority, and the space of epistemic possibility. A crucial criterion of adequacy for this project is to provide a way of interpreting the 2D framework that satisfies the rationalist’s Core Thesis:

Core Thesis: For any \(S, S\) is apriori iff its epistemic intension is necessary.

Some critics have sought to show that epistemic 2D semantics cannot satisfy this constraint. The problem is that epistemic intensions are assigned on the basis of the speaker’s commonsense standards for evaluating the apriori coherence of combining the target sentence with a description of a scenario. But commonsense standards may presuppose that the speaker, her words or her thoughts exist within the hypothetical scenario. If so, the epistemic approach will run into similar problems to those that plagued the contextualist approach: the necessity of the epistemic intension will not line up with genuine epistemic or metaphysical necessity.[21]

According to Yablo (2002: §1–10), commonsense evaluations of the kind of conditionals Chalmers uses to assign epistemic intensions are sensitive to information about how words are used within a hypothetical scenario. By commonsense standards, Yablo contends, the following type of conditional is apriori true:

If my word ‘wing’ actually means tail and horses have tails, then horses have wings.

If epistemic intensions are assigned on the basis of these sorts of judgments about conditionals, then every sentence will have a contingent epistemic intension: even mathematical necessities like ‘\(2^2 = 4\)’ will yield the value False for scenarios in which your sentence ‘\(2^2 = 4\)’ means tomatoes are numbers. Epistemic 2D semantics would therefore violate the Core Thesis. According to Chalmers, this problematic result can be avoided if the assignment principle is formulated more carefully. The antecedent of Yablo’s conditional is making a claim about how the quoted word (‘wing’) is used at the center of a scenario. But there is no apriori reason to suppose that anything at all follows about the physiology of horses from such a linguistic fact. The key difference between Yablo’s understanding of the conditional and Chalmers’ is that Yablo assumes that you’ll treat the word quoted in the antecedent as identical in content to the homophonic word used in the consequent. Chalmers denies this assumption and so allows for necessary epistemic intensions (2002a, 169–71).

Schroeter (2005) presses a similar objection. To assign epistemic intensions to expressions, we must evaluate conditionals like ‘if the actual world is like Twin Earth, then water = XYZ’. Schroeter argues that commonsense epistemic norms presuppose that the token of ‘water’ being used in the consequent must itself exist within the scenario considered as actual in the antecedent. Consider a scenario in which there is both H2O and XYZ in your vicinity: it may be that you’ve only been using the term ‘water’ to interact with one of these substances. By commonsense standards, which stuff counts as water will depend crucially on which stuff is causally hooked up in the right way with the very token of ‘water’ whose applicability you’re trying to adjudicate: without such a causal hook-up, no verdict is justifiable. If this is right, epistemic intensions will be undefined for scenarios in which the target expression does not exist. And then the same type of counterexamples to the Core Thesis that undermine the contextualist approach will also apply to the epistemic approach: aposteriori sentences about the existence of language or thought will have necessary epistemic intensions. Speaks (2010) builds on this line of thought. He argues that it’s not just commonsense epistemic norms that generate the problem: any interpretive norms consistent with Chalmers’ restrictions on the canonical specification of scenarios will generate necessary epistemic intensions for sentences that are not plausibly apriori. In particular, certain complex disjunctions involving the existence of individuals, their properties and their relations to oneself will have necessary epistemic intensions. For a continuation of this debate, see (Elliott, McQueen, and Weber 2013; Schroeter 2013; Speaks 2014; Stillman 2015).

Finally, Derek Ball (2014) articulates a social challenge to necessary 1-intensions based on Tyler Burge’s anti-individualism. According to Ball, our willingness to revise virtually any belief in the light of others’ testimony undercuts the claim that any thoughts have necessary 1-intensions. As a consequence, he argues, E2D cannot explain Fregean cognitive significance or the rationalist connection between conceivability and possibility.

6. Objections to Generalized 2D semantics

Although empiricists and rationalists invoke the 2D framework for different explanatory purposes, they agree on three important theses. They defend apriori conceptual analysis, and take it to play an important role in metaphysics. They hold that the 2D framework captures a kind of meaning: a genuinely semantic aspect of linguistic understanding, rather than a merely contingent pattern of beliefs. And they use the 2D framework to represent a broadly internalist approach to reference determination. These positions are distinctive of the generalized 2D semantics and all three are controversial.

A common complaint about generalized 2D semantics is that there are no plausible extant analyses of names or natural kind terms, and the 2D framework provides no assurances that an analysis will be forthcoming (e.g., Block and Stalnaker 1999; Byrne and Pryor 2006; Soames 2005). Chalmers, for instance, characterizes the 1-intension of ‘water’ as follows:

As a rough approximation we might say that the primary intension picks out the dominant clear, drinkable liquid in the oceans and lakes; or more briefly, that it picks out the watery stuff in a world. (Chalmers 1996, 57)

This informal definition is obviously sketchy and incomplete. Critics contend that any attempt to provide a more precise definition will be subject to counterexamples: we can imagine empirical situations where the definition would fail to give the intuitively correct verdict about the extension. Insofar as this claim is based exclusively on induction from past failures, however, it is unconvincing. Generalized 2D semantics is not committed to any particular analysis, and the correct 2D analysis may be quite complex. Indeed, the 2D framework allows for “analyses” in the form of 1-intensions that cannot be finitely specified in any natural language. So 2D theorists can simply accept the intuitions that critics cite against particular analyses: in their view such intuitions help to elucidate the correct 2D analysis of a term. To establish that no such 2D analysis is possible, therefore, one must appeal to broader theoretical considerations. Critics have targeted each of the three key theoretical commitments of generalized 2D semantics. More recently, some critics have raised worries about whether the 2D semantic framework is well-defined.

6.1 Apriority

Proponents of generalized 2D semantics hold that verdicts about hypothetical cases that ground the assignment of 1-intensions capture a priori conceptual truths: propositions that can be conclusively justified without relying on any information about one’s real-world environment. Chalmers and Jackson (2001) argue that we can have conclusive apriori knowledge of “application conditionals” like ‘if the actual world is like Twin Earth, then water = XYZ’. They argue that any empirical information relevant to justifying a verdict about the conditional is packed into the specification of the antecedent. So information about your real-world environment plays no essential role in justifying verdicts about the conditional: it is either redundant or irrelevant. However, facts about one’s real environment may play a purely causal role in shaping your current understanding of ‘water’. Moreover, any changes in your understanding of ‘water’ that would suffice to justify different verdicts about the application conditionals, they contend, would eo ipso change the meaning of your word ‘water’ – such changes would therefore be irrelevant to justifying verdicts about what water is (given your current meaning).

The apriori status of application conditionals can be challenged in many different ways. One type of challenge targets the prior understanding that justifies verdicts about application conditionals. Verdicts about which items count as water in a scenario considered as actual will be justified on the basis of a complex pattern of initial assumptions about water–one’s implicit “folk theory” of water. Critics argue that each element of this folk theory was originally based on empirical experience and is corrigible in the light of further experience. Therefore, the verdicts based on one’s folk theory should also count as aposteriori, not apriori (e.g. Putnam 1970; Block and Stalnaker 1999; Laurence and Margolis 2003; Nimtz 2004; Byrne and Pryor 2006). A related criticism is that generalized 2D semantics makes implausible assumptions about what’s required for possessing the same concept or meaning (Schroeter 2006; Diaz-Leon 2011). If the patterns of understanding that ground verdicts about application conditionals are not required for sameness of concept, then successful empirical inquiry can justify changes in one’s ideal verdicts about application conditionals without changing the meaning of one’s terms. So these conditionals cannot be conclusively known apriori. See (Pickel 2016) for a formal model of how such changes might be rationally justified. .

A second type of challenge to the apriority of application conditionals focuses on the process of reflection on hypothetical scenarios. These critics argue that purely hypothetical reasoning about a scenario may not reliably reflect the verdicts one would endorse if one were actually confronted with the relevant scenario. For instance, (Williamson 2006, 2007) and (Jenkins 2008, 2012) contend that the intellectual skills involved in coming to judgments about hypothetical cases will justify verdicts only if those skills have been honed through empirical feedback. So reasoning about application conditionals depends for its justification on experience of one’s real-world environment, even if it is not based on any empirical premises. (Rupert 2016) takes this line of thought further, arguing that the intellectual skills relevant to determining the application of scientific concepts are typically acquired through embodied training – and such skills cannot be replicated via reasoning about descriptions of hypothetical scenarios. In a slightly different vein, (Dowell 2008) argues that actually believing an empirical claim S may ground different verdicts than merely supposing S. In particular, when a hypothetical scenario conflicts with your core empirical beliefs, your armchair reasoning may fail to track the reasoning you would endorse if you actually found yourself forced to accept that scenario as actual. The crucial question for generalized 2D semantics is whether such mismatches between hypothetical reasoning and real-life reasoning can be explained as failures of ideal rationality or conceptual change. If so, a two-dimensionalist can insist that application conditionals are apriori accessible in principle, even if our actual armchair judgments will inevitably fall short due to psychological limitations (Braddon-Mitchell 2015; Chalmers 2012: 181–84).

A third type of challenge targets a specific class of concepts, demonstrative or recognitional concepts. Critics argue that the applicability conditions for these concepts depend essentially on actually having certain experiences: e.g. having the experience of seeing that color, or seeing that canary, or seeing a shape that’s similar to an egg (Loar 1990, 1999; Perry 2001; Pryor 2006; Valaris 2009; Yablo 2002, 2006, (Williamson 2012)). Apriori reflection on a possible scenario cannot elicit the relevant experiences, nor can it establish that you would have the relevant experiences if actually confronted with the scenario in question. So these critics conclude that apriori reflection alone cannot justify verdicts about the applicability of this type of concept. In response, proponents of generalized 2D semantics will seek to show either (i) that the relevant experiences can be included in specifications of scenarios considered as actual or (ii) that the 2D framework can be used to capture the way the reference of such concepts is fixed (Chalmers 2002a). More recently, Chalmers argues that recognitional capacities for non-basic concepts are never essential to one’s ability to apply the concept: in principle you can always justify verdicts about a scenario without relying on a basic recognitional capacity (2012: 139–148).

A final type of objection seeks to show that generalized 2D semantics over-generates apriori truths. For instance, (Speaks 2010, 2014) argues that generalized 2D semantics is committed to the apriority of contingent facts about the existence of individuals – a result that conflicts with commonsense intuitions about what’s knowable apriori. See (Elliott, McQueen, and Weber 2013) for a defense of the apriority of such claims. And (Williamson 2006, 2007) argues that there are no conclusively justifiable conceptual truths, even in the case of conventional kinds like ‘vixen’ or logical vocabulary like ‘all’. See (Boghossian 2011) for a reply.

Chalmers’ Constructing the World (2012) provides a systematic defense of the apriority of application conditionals, and responds in detail to many individual critics. The book’s central claim is that there is some compact base-level vocabulary, such that application conditionals formulated using that base vocabulary are conclusively knowable on the basis of apriori reflection and conceptual competence alone. Chalmers articulates the underlying epistemic relation, ‘apriori scrutability’, that defines epistemic 1-intensions, and explores different potential base vocabularies. Chalmers seeks to show that the apriori scrutability of all truths is an intuitively plausible generalization of a thinker’s ability to justify verdicts on the basis of empirical information about her environment. And he provides two arguments, (i) from the suspension of belief and (ii) from Bayesian principles to support the apriority of application conditionals (2012, ch 4). For recent discussion of Chalmers’ arguments along with Chalmers’ replies, see (Neta 2014; Schroeter 2014; Stanley 2014; Chalmers 2014; Soames 2014; Turner 2014; Wilson 2014; Chalmers 2014; Tiehen 2014; Pickel 2016).

6.2 Semantic status

The semantic status of 1-intensions has also been challenged in different ways, reflecting different assumptions about what is crucial to meaning.

Some critics argue that the semantic values generated by generalized 2D semantics are too unstable to provide plausible conditions for competence with a meaning or a concept. In particular, the 1-intensions assigned to names and natural kind terms will be too sensitive to idiosyncrasies in a subject’s current understanding to be stable through reasonable changes in belief or shareable by different members of a linguistic community (e.g., Block and Stalnaker 1999; Kroon 2004a; Schroeter 2003; Soames 2005; Stalnaker 2004; Yablo 2000b). Whether this is a telling objection depends on larger issues about the explanatory role of meanings—in particular, to what extent meanings must be stable through disagreement and theory change. The 2D account can vindicate some stability, but it will not be able to vindicate all commonsense epistemic intuitions about sameness of meaning. See Chalmers (2012: ch. 5, and 9th excursus) for a recent reply to worries about stability of meaning.

A different objection argues that 1-intensions misrepresent the intuitive subject matter of language and thought. According to this objection, generalized 2D semantics has the implausible consequence that one cannot speak or think directly about individuals: the real subject matter of our ‘Obama’ talk is not the man himself, but whoever happens to satisfy a particular reference-fixing criterion. Similarly, the real subject matter of our ‘water’ talk is not H2O, but whatever fulfills our commonsense reference-fixing role. Critics argue that this misrepresents our ability to think directly about individuals and natural kinds (Byrne 2001; Perry 2001, ch. 8; Soames 2005, ch. 10; 2006a; Stalnaker 2004). Proponents of generalized 2D semantics argue that the second aspect of meaning, the 2-intension, fully explains such intuitions about the intuitive subject matter of names and natural kind terms.

Finally, critics have argued that generalized 2D semantics faces difficulties in providing a compositional semantic theory. Diego Marconi (2005) argues that generalized 2D semantics faces difficulties integrating the two distinct aspects of meaning into a unified semantic theory. In particular, he argues that the role of two distinct intensions in compositional semantics gives rise to something like a semantic ambiguity, which generates problems for the interpretation of subjunctive conditionals. See (Bealer 2002) for another ambiguity interpretation of 2D semantics. In a similar spirit, Scott Soames (2005) objects that 2D semantics cannot explain Kripke’s examples of necessary aposteriori truths, since there is no single proposition (understood as a set of possible worlds) that is both necessary and contingent. Soames (2005, ch. 10) goes on to argue that generalized 2D semantics cannot provide a plausible compositional semantics for the sentences involving both epistemic and metaphysical operators: e.g. he argues that 2D semantics generates incorrect interpretations when modal operators, indexicals, or de re propositions are embedded within attitude reports. And Graeme Forbes (2011) raises a group of puzzle cases for 2D semantics involving the interaction of factive operators like ‘someone establishes that’, with epistemic and metaphysical operators like ‘it’s apriori that’ and ‘it’s necessary that’. Forbes sees this as a challenge to any two-factor theory of meaning. And Wlodek Rabinowicz (2010) suggests that a one-dimensional semantic framework with a more sophisticated interpretation function is better suited to handling the distinction between ‘it’s apriori that’ and ‘it’s analytic that’ than a two-dimensional framework like that of Chalmers and Jackson.

In response, proponents of generalized 2D semantics have sought to clarify their own core commitments at the level of compositional semantics. (Chalmers 2006b) strongly denies that he is committed to ambiguity, since the two elements of meaning are necessarily correlated. (Chalmers 2011) argues that worries about embedding within attitude reports can be handled by an explicitly two-dimensional account of propositions and a better analysis of the semantics for attitude reports (together with appropriate pragmatics). And in response to Forbes’ puzzles, (Chalmers and Rabern 2014) argue that the source of the tension is not the 2D semantic machinery, but rather commonsense commitments about apriority, necessity and contingent apriori truths. So any semantic theory will face similar difficulties in reconciling these commitments. They go on to articulate two possible responses on behalf of two-dimensionalism. See (Fritz 2013; Johannesson and Packalén 2016; Kipper forthcoming) for alternative semantic accounts of the puzzle cases that are compatible with generalized 2D semantics.

6.3 Defining 1-intensions

A different type of worry focuses on whether the epistemic factors cited by generalized 2D semantics can generate determinate 1-intensions in the first place. As we saw, 1-intensions are intended to capture an individual’s implicit epistemic commitments about the application-conditions of her words. Some critics, however, raise worries about whether 1-intensions are well-defined. Chalmers and Jackson (2001) assign semantic values relative to a base-level description of a scenario — something like a PQTI-sentence stating basic microphysical, phenomenal, and self-locating information, together with a ‘that’s all’ completeness claim. Ordinary conceptual competence is then supposed to put one in a position to conclusively justify any conditional truth of the form (PQTI \(\supset\) S). According to generalized 2D semantics, this epistemic procedure generates a determinate 1-intension for any meaningful sentence S. Although Generalized 2D can allow that some sentences may have indeterminate truth-values relative to some scenarios, too much indeterminacy will undermine the viability of the approach. A number of critics argue that 1-intensions are not well-defined for many, perhaps most sentences.

Justin Tiehen has raised an important difficulty for defining an adequate ‘That’s all’ clause, T, in a PQTI-sentence (Tiehen 2014). Without this sort of completeness clause, it will be impossible to come to any justified verdict about the truth of ordinary sentences. For instance, consider the sentence ‘There is no ectoplasm’ relative to a purely physical Earthlike scenario E. A PQI-sentence that exhaustively describes E’s microphysical, phenomenal and self-locating features, will not allow one to rationally determine whether E contains further non-physical ectoplasm over and above the physical features explicitly mentioned in PQI. In order to conclude that ‘There is no ectoplasm’ is true in E you need to know that PQI is a complete base-level description of that scenario. The question, then, is how to analyze ‘That’s all’. Chalmers’ solution to this problem is to appeal to a distinction between positive and negative truths: intuitively ‘There is no ectoplasm’ is a negative truth, whereas ‘Ectoplasm exists’ a positive one. Chalmers suggests that T should be understood as a claim about all positive truths:

(T) All positive truths are apriori entailed by PQI truths. (2012: 111).

Tiehen argues, however, that the distinction between positive and negative truths cannot cleanly drawn in the way Chalmers hopes, so most ordinary truths will end up as partly negative. The upshot is that even a parade case like ‘water = H2O’ will not be apriori entailed by PQI truths. If Tiehen is right that no better formulation of T is available, then the 2D framework cannot be used to define 1-intensions for most ordinary language sentences.

Another worry focuses on the descriptive vocabulary in PQTI-sentences. If the description of a scenario is to ground determinate verdicts about 1- and 2-intensions, the predicates that attribute base-level microphysical and phenomenal properties should afford transparent access to the instantiation conditions of those properties. But many externalist critics will be skeptical about the possibility of such ideal descriptive language (e.g. Stalnaker 2008, Schroeter 2004).

Setting aside worries about the PQTI-descriptions, a different line of objection questions whether your current epistemic commitments generate determinate extensions for possible scenarios considered as actual. Many externalist critics of Chalmers’ rationalist Core Thesis can be interpreted as challenging the assumption that an individual’s conceptual competence grounds determinate 1-intensions (e.g., Yablo 2002, 2006; Schroeter 2006, 2013; Ball 2014; Pickel 2016). The worry would be that conceptual competence and ideal epistemic norms don’t suffice to generate determinate verdicts for application conditionals of the form (PQTI \(\supset\) S): in many cases at least, ideal verdicts about application conditionals will depend essentially on empirical presuppositions about the real world and one’s own representational states. If these critics are right, 1-intensions are not suited to capturing individuals’ epistemic commitments about the truth-conditions of sentences (and the thoughts they express). On this approach, competence with the same word meaning or concept will depend in part on facts outside the epistemic purview of the individual subject.

6.4 Internalism

Proponents of generalized 2D semantics aim to vindicate an internalist approach to assigning semantic content to an individual’s expressions. Both the empiricist and the rationalist versions of generalized 2D semantics assign 1-intensions to words in such a way as to reflect individual speakers’ current rational dispositions: 1-intensions are therefore fully determined by the speaker’s current internal states. In contrast, semantic externalists hold that the aspects of meaning that 1-intensions are intended to explain—reference determination and competence conditions—depend in part on the subject’s relation to external facts, and so cannot be fully determined by the subject’s internal states at a given time.

Internalism is a deep methodological point of contention that separates proponents of generalized 2D semantics from many of their critics (e.g., Soames 2005; Stalnaker 2004). Internalists take the notion of meaning to capture an aspect of an individual’s current state of understanding, while externalists take the notion of meaning to reflect how an individual is embedded within her social and physical environment. Adjudicating this disagreement raises difficult issues about the explanatory role of semantic theories and how that role is best fulfilled. As we’ve seen, traditional empiricists aim to explain the causal mechanisms that allow individual speakers to coordinate their everyday classificatory dispositions, while rationalists seek to identify the aspect of understanding that grounds an individual’s ideal apriori judgments about what’s possible. Both of these projects focus squarely on the individual’s current subjective perspective, and thus naturally suggest an internalist approach to intentionality. Proponents of generalized 2D semantics maintain that the individual’s current state of understanding fully determines the relevant truth- and applicability-conditions for her words (Chalmers and Jackson 2001; Gertler 2002; Braddon-Mitchell 2004). In contrast, semantic externalists tend to emphasize different explanatory projects: e.g. situating individuals with respect to objective features of their environment and vindicating the holistic, falliblist, and open-ended character of empirical inquiry. These explanatory projects highlight individual’s relation to aspects of her real-world environment and her fallibility about those relations, and thus naturally suggest an externalist approach to intentionality. Just which explanatory projects are most central to intentionality and how the relevant phenomena are best explained are both hotly contested issues. [See the entries on externalism about mental content and narrow mental content.]

7. The Metasemantic Interpretation

7.1 Overview: 2D semantics for externalists

Generalized 2D semantics seeks to vindicate a traditional internalist conception of meaning: it posits an extra aspect of meaning for all expressions (the intension corresponding to the diagonal of a 2D matrix) that is fully determined by a subject’s internal states, and which in turn determines objective truth-conditions for her sentences. By enriching compositional semantics in this way, generalized 2D semantics promises a straightforward explanation of a variety of epistemic properties of sentences: e.g., why a necessary sentence like ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is not apriori knowable, what the subject learns by accepting the sentence, or how the subject uses the sentence in reasoning.

But using the 2D framework to characterize the subject’s epistemic perspective is not beholden to this internalist project. Semantic externalists reject the traditional view that our purely internal states afford apriori access to reference-fixing conditions for our words and thoughts. According to externalists, the basic assignments in a compositional semantics relate the subject’s words and thoughts to objective features of her environment—objects, kinds and properties whose nature is captured by standard (1D) possible world semantics. Even externalists, however, can define 2D matrices that reflect the subject’s epistemic perspective on the reference of her words and thoughts. For the externalist, however, these 2D matrices will not represent meanings—a specific aspect of understanding that is required for linguistic or conceptual competence and which figures in a compositional semantic theory that determines truth-conditions for sentences. On an externalist interpretation, 2D matrices merely reflect one aspect of a subject’s partial semantic understanding of what her words and thoughts represent. Because externalist 2D matrices don’t represent meanings, moreover, the externalist is free to use the 2D framework strategically to focus on different aspects of the subject’s understanding for different explanatory purposes.

Robert Stalnaker has articulated such an externalist interpretation of the 2D framework in a series of influential papers spanning some thirty years. He was the first to introduce 2D matrices to specify what is communicated in situations where conversational partners are partly ignorant or mistaken about the nature of the objects, kinds or properties their words pick out (1978), and he later extended his 2D framework to characterize the content of certain thoughts and attitude attributions (1981; 1987; 1988). In both cases, the 2D framework is used to define “diagonal” intensions that reflect the subject’s partial understanding of which objects, kinds or properties her words and thoughts represent. These diagonal intensions are not meanings or semantic values, since they do not figure in a compositional semantic theory and they do not reflect conditions for conceptual or linguistic competence. The only meaning of an expression on this account is its ordinary “horizontal” intension. In effect, Stalnaker’s 2D matrices represent different meanings that an expression could have had if it had occurred in different empirical circumstances. This “metasemantic” interpretation of the 2D framework contrasts sharply the “semantic” interpretations favored by theorists like Jackson and Chalmers (Stalnaker 2001, 2004).

Proponents of generalized 2D semantics were influenced by Stalnaker’s early papers developing the 2D framework, and their views are often presented as continuous in motivation and form. But there are important theoretical consequences that flow from the choice between 2D metasemantics and generalized 2D semantics. Indeed, Stalnaker himself is a vocal critic of generalized 2D semantics, rejecting its commitment to the semantic status of 2D matrices, its commitment to apriori conceptual analysis, and its internalist approach to reference determination.

7.2 A two-dimensional account of assertoric content

The metasemantic interpretation of the 2D framework was originally developed as a way of explaining how the propositions conveyed by the assertion of a sentence can vary depending on the conversational context (Stalnaker 1978). In this seminal paper, Stalnaker proposes an attractive theoretical account of the role of assertion in a conversation, which is then used to explain how the assertoric use of a necessary sentence like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, can convey a specific empirical proposition within a given conversation. In particular, Stalnaker argues that our commitment to construing such sentences as making felicitous and informative assertions will lead us to reinterpret their content in ways that can be modeled using the 2D framework.

The guiding idea is that in making an assertion the speaker is trying to get the audience to rule out certain possibilities. In asserting ‘It’s cold today‘, for instance, I may be trying to get you to rule out possibilities in which today’s temperature in Melbourne is over 10° C. We can model what my assertion conveys, then, as a function that maps possible worlds in which today’s temperature is under 10° C to True and all other worlds to False. However, the precise truth-conditions communicated by an assertoric use of a sentence depend in part on the conversational context in which it takes place. Just which temperatures count as cold, for instance, depends on shared background assumptions in a particular conversational context: what’s cold in Melbourne is mild in Manitoba.

A second guiding idea is that the proposition actually conveyed by the assertion of a particular sentence depends on presuppositions shared by the participants in the conversation—including presuppositions about what particular words represent and presuppositions about actual empirical circumstances. If you’re a Chinese speaker who doesn’t understand anything at all about what the term ‘cold’ represents in English, then I cannot use ‘It’s cold today‘ to convey facts about Melbourne’s weather. And if you’re a Canadian who doesn’t understand anything about Australian weather conditions, you won’t understand precisely what I am saying to my fellow Melburnians when I assert that sentence. Stalnaker calls the set of presuppositions that conversational partners treat as common knowledge that they can rely on to get their point across the “context set”—which he models as the set of possible worlds that satisfy all of these mutual presuppositions. The context set will encode shared assumptions about the meaning of words, about general empirical facts, about the what’s happened so far in the conversation, and so on.

The goal of assertion, Stalnaker suggests, is to shrink the context set. In making an assertion, the speaker tries to get the audience to accept a new proposition as one of their shared presuppositions, thereby shrinking the set of possible worlds that are considered live options. For instance, in asserting ‘It’ll be very cold today’ to a group of Melburnians, I exploit background knowledge of local weather conditions in June to get my audience to accept that the temperature outside is somewhere between 5–10° C, ruling out live possibilities that it might be in the 15–20° C range. If all goes well, further planning will proceed on the basis of a smaller and more accurate range of possibilities. In contrast, if I were to assert ‘It’s cold’ to the monolingual Chinese speaker or to the parochial Canadian, my assertion would be defective, since my audience wouldn’t be able to figure out which temperatures are ruled out by my assertion.

Identity claims, however, do not seem to fit this simple model of assertion. As Kripke (1980) argued, identities are either necessarily true or necessarily false. So accepting an identity will either leave the context set unchanged or it will eliminate it altogether. Either way, asserting an identity would be pointless. But clearly it is not. Asserting an identity such as ‘Lloyd is I.L. Humberstone’ can be genuinely informative, ruling out empirical possibilities previously taken to be live options. According to the metasemantic account, (i) the goal of assertion can explain why the assertion of a necessary sentence will lead to a reinterpretation of the content of the asserted sentence, and (ii) the 2D framework helps to specify just which proposition will be conveyed by the sentence within a given conversation.

In general, an identity claim is appropriate when one of the parties to a conversation is (partially) ignorant about which object is picked out by a name like ‘Lloyd’. For an externalist like Stalnaker, this is a case of semantic ignorance. If O’Leary doesn’t know that ‘Lloyd’ is co-referential with ‘I.L. Humberstone’, then he does not fully understand the semantic rules governing these names: i.e., that both names are associated with a constant function from any possible world to a specific individual. But O’Leary isn’t utterly incompetent with the meaning of these terms: he implicitly understands both names as rigid designators, and he has some substantive understanding of the object each name picks out. For instance, he may understand that ‘Lloyd’ refers to the person to whom he’s just been introduced and that ‘I.L. Humberstone’ refers to the author of ‘Direction of Fit’. O’Leary’s semantic deficiency—his failure to fully understand the meaning of these names in a contextually appropriate way—is grounded in his ignorance of the ordinary empirical fact that the man to whom he has been introduced is the author of ‘Direction of Fit’.

2D matrices can be used to represent this sort of partial semantic understanding. O’Leary knows that \(if\) the man in front of him is the author of the famous article, then ‘Lloyd = I.L. Humberstone’ expresses a necessary truth; and he knows that \(if\) the man in front of him isn’t the author, the sentence expresses a necessary falsehood. What O’Leary doesn’t know is which of these two possibilities corresponds to his actual situation. Call the first possibility \(i\) and the second \(j\). O’Leary’s epistemic situation can then be summed up in a 2D matrix:

O’Leary: ‘Lloyd = I.L. Humberstone’
\(i\) \(j\)
\(i\) T T
\(j\) F F

The matrix is defined only with respect to a specific set of relevant alternative possibilities, \(i\) and \(j\), chosen in such a way as to reflect the subjects’ semantic understanding and our own explanatory interests. The vertical axis represents these possible worlds in their role as contexts of use, which determine the literal semantic content of the expressions used in them. The horizontal axis represents those same possible worlds as circumstances of evaluation, relative to which we evaluate the truth or falsity of the proposition expressed. Each row of the matrix thus represents a different proposition that might be literally expressed by the sentence. Stalnaker calls such matrices propositional concepts, since they reflect the subject’s current imperfect conception of the meaning of the sentence.[22] This particular matrix reflects the fact that O’Leary’s current epistemic state is compatible with the identity sentence expressing either a necessary truth or a necessary falsehood, depending on empirical facts about the actual context of use.

What does O’Leary learn when he comes to accept Daniels’ assertion of ‘Lloyd is I.L. Humberstone’? Since the actual world is like \(i\), the literal semantic content of the asserted sentence is a necessary truth. But necessary truths rule out no empirical possibilities whatsoever, so this cannot be the informative proposition that is conveyed by Daniels’ assertion. Moreover, O’Leary is not in a position to recognize that this is the literal semantic content of the sentence, since he doesn’t know whether the actual world is like \(i\) or \(j\). The natural suggestion is that the information conveyed by Daniels’ assertion is that the real world is like \(i\) and not \(j\). When O’Leary accepts ‘Lloyd is I.L. Humberstone’, he will no longer treat the possibility that the man in front of him is not the author of the famous article as a live option: this empirical possibility will be eliminated from his context set. Thus, the proposition that seems to be conveyed by Daniels’ assertion corresponds to the diagonal intension determined by our 2D matrix for that assertion. Moreover, this observation generalizes: when subjects are partially ignorant of the semantic values of their words, the diagonal proposition determined by the propositional concept can capture the empirical information conveyed by the assertion.

But why is this so? To explain why assertions sometimes express the diagonal proposition, the metasemantic account appeals to rational maxims governing conversational cooperation. The following maxim seems to govern the practice of assertion:

The very same proposition should be expressed relative to every possible world in the context set. (Stalnaker 1978, 88)

Speakers should conform to this maxim, because assertion involves an intention to get one’s audience to eliminate worlds from the context set in accordance with the proposition expressed—and in order for this intention to succeed the audience must be in a position to figure out just which worlds they are being asked to eliminate. When this sort of rational maxim governing the communication of information is flouted, the audience will look for a non-standard interpretation of the utterance that would bring it back into conformity with the maxims (Grice 1989). [See the entries on pragmatics and on implicature.]

According to Stalnaker, this is precisely what is going on in the case of identity claims like the one we have been considering. Daniels’ assertion of ‘Lloyd is I.L. Humberstone’ clearly flouts the proposed maxim. We can assume that Daniels is aware that O’Leary doesn’t know whether he is in a world like \(i\), where the man to whom he’s been introduced is the famous author, or a world like j where they are distinct. Yet Daniels utters a sentence that expresses a different proposition depending on whether the actual world is like \(i\) or like \(j\). In such circumstances, the audience should look for an alternative interpretation of the assertion. Daniels’ assertion can be brought back into conformity with the maxim by re-interpreting it as conveying the proposition expressed by the diagonal of the matrix. At a rough intuitive level, we can say that Daniels is trying to get O’Leary to accept that the sentence ‘Lloyd is I.L. Humberstone’ expresses a truth. But the 2D framework also allows us to specify more precisely just what empirical information is conveyed within a given conversational context. Given O’Leary’s and Daniels’ common presuppositions about what the two names represent, Daniels’ assertion also expresses the proposition that the man to whom O’Leary has just been introduced is the author of ‘Direction of Fit’.

It’s worth emphasizing, however, that the very same sentence asserted in a different conversational context could express an entirely different empirical proposition: just which proposition is expressed, on this metasemantic account, depends on what the individual parties to the conversation are currently presupposing about the meanings of the expressions used.

In recent work, Stalanaker has enriched his notion of a context. In addition to a sets of possible worlds, he introduces (i) multiple centers within those worlds representing the participants in a conversation, and (ii) accessibility relations among the centers representing interlocutors’ ways of identifying each other (Stalnaker 2008, 2014). This added structure is intended to capture self-locating presuppositions that can help explain what’s communicated by indexical expressions like ‘I’, ‘you’ and ‘now’. For a helpful overview of the motivation for such an approach, see (Ninan 2010a) and for further development of multi-centered accounts of propositional content see (Torre 2010, Ninan 2013).

7.3 Propositional attitudes

The metasemantic 2D framework was originally developed to explain communication, but the framework can also be used to specify the content of certain beliefs and the content of assertions that attribute beliefs.

Stalnaker (1984) defends a coarse-grained account of belief contents, which individuates particular belief states in terms of a set of possible worlds that would make them true. If this project is to succeed, it must be possible to fully specify beliefs without invoking anything like Fregean senses or conceptual structure. But there is an important class of beliefs that seem to pose insuperable problems for a simple possible worlds account of their content: beliefs in necessary truths. The problem for a standard possible worlds analysis is that all necessary truths have precisely the same content (the function mapping every world to True). So on a simple possible worlds account, the belief that Hesperus = Phosphorus will have exactly the same content as a belief that Hesperus = Hesperus & Fermat’s last theorem is true. But these are clearly distinct belief states. Beliefs in identities have been particularly important in motivating theories of finer-grained thought contents.

But fine-grained Fregean senses or conceptual structures are not strictly required to distinguish beliefs in identities. Stalnaker (1981; 1987) argues that the metasemantic 2D framework he developed to explain what is communicated by an assertion of an identity sentence can also explain the content of the belief states attributed using an identity sentence to specify its content. If O’Leary were to notice the pole star and think to himself that’s Mars, for instance, the truth-conditions of his thought can be captured by a judiciously defined diagonal proposition (Stalnaker 1987, 125). In this case, the worlds we include in the context set may involve facts about which object is the target of O’Leary’s visual attention and facts about salient empirical properties he associates with the name ‘Mars’. On the metasemantic approach, then, the proposition we attribute in saying O’Leary believes that that is Mars is the proposition that the visually salient object is the object that has those Martian properties.

A further complication arises in specifying the content of attitude attributions. On the metasemantic account of assertion, the content conveyed by a sentence depends on the shared presuppositions of the speaker and audience. But sometimes the parties to a discussion are better informed than the person they are describing. In philosophical discussions, for instance, it is standardly presupposed that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are co-referential. So the diagonal intension associated with sentence ‘Hesperus \(\ne\) Phosphorus’ will be necessarily false when it’s asserted in philosophical contexts (i.e., it will be false when uttered in any situation compatible with what is being presupposed in the philosophical conversation). And yet when a philosopher says that O’Leary doesn’t know that Hesperus is Phosphorus, she still manages to communicate that O’Leary fails to grasp some contingent empirical proposition. On the face of it, the metasemantic account of assertion cannot explain how this is possible, since every cell of the metasemantic matrix for the sentence in this philosophical conversation will be assigned the value True.

Stalnaker’s response to this problem is to suggest that the context set for a belief report must be expanded so as to include worlds that correspond to the way that the believer himself (i.e. O’Leary) takes things to be. The diagonal proposition of the philosopher’s sentence is thus determined by considering what she would be saying if her sentence were asserted in contexts compatible with O’Leary’s beliefs (1987; 1988). However, there is no general rule for choosing which worlds are the relevant ones:

The procedure I am proposing for extending propositional concepts so that the diagonalization strategy can be applied to problematic belief attributions takes examples case by case. It is not, as yet, very satisfactory if we are looking for a systematic way to explain why the complements of belief attributions denote the propositions that they seem to denote. But if, using this procedure, we can find a possible worlds proposition that is a plausible candidate to be the object of belief being attributed in the various problematic examples, then […] it will not be completely mysterious how these propositions can be expressed by the sentences that seem to express them. (Stalnaker 1987, 129)

Thus, the metasemantic 2D framework provides adequate descriptive resources for characterizing mental states and our discourse about them, without invoking fine-grained Fregean senses, concepts, or syntactic structures. However, the metasemantic theory used to construct the relevant 2D matrices relies on unsystematic norms of charitable interpretation to identify the precise contents of particular attitudes and attitude reports (Stalnaker 1999b, 18–19).[23]

7.4 Metasemantic vs. semantic

The semantic vs. metasemantic distinction was first drawn by Kaplan (1989b, 573–6). A semantic theory for a language assigns semantic values (meanings) to particular expressions in the language. In contrast, a metasemantic theory explains why expressions have those semantic values: i.e., what facts about an expression make it the case that it has a certain meaning. A semantic theory, for instance, might tell us that the semantic value for ‘Barack Obama’ is a 1D intension that maps any possible world to a specific individual, while the semantic value for ‘I’ is a 2D intension that maps contexts of utterance to a constant function from any possible world to the individual who is the speaker in the context. A metasemantic theory will tell us what makes it the case that these are the correct interpretations of their meaning: e.g., the metasemantic theory might appeal to the speaker’s dispositions and history, how she is causally connected to her social or physical context, the linguistic conventions of the local linguistic community, details about the conversational context, and so on.

A semantic interpretation of the 2D framework takes the 2D framework to specify a semantic value of an expression. Kaplan’s theory of indexicals is a semantic interpretation of the framework, as are Jackson’s and Chalmers’ generalized 2D semantics. Stalnaker calls his own interpretation of the 2D framework a metasemantic one because his 2D matrices reflect general principles for assigning semantic values (horizontal intensions) to expressions on the basis of empirical facts about their use. Stalnaker’s 2D matrices thus reflect metasemantic facts about interpretation, not semantic facts about the meanings of specific expressions.

The metasemantic interpretation of the 2D framework is structurally different from semantic interpretations like Jackson’s and Chalmers’ in a number of important respects. First, on the metasemantic approach, 2D matrices are defined in terms of a restricted set of possible worlds. Metasemantic 2D matrices are defined only with respect to those worlds that are consistent with some relevant set of the subject’s background assumptions. On a semantic interpretation, in contrast, 2D matrices are defined on the set of all centered possible worlds.

Second, just which set of possible worlds is used to construct a metasemantic 2D matrix depends in part on the theorist’s contingent explanatory interests. For instance, Daniels’ current internal state of understanding the expression ‘Mars’ may be associated with different 2D matrices, depending on whether we are interested in characterizing his conversation with O’Leary or in characterizing his thought identifying a speck visible in the night sky as Mars. In many contexts, moreover, we can characterize the content associated with Daniels’ internal state without resorting to the 2D apparatus at all: e.g., when Daniels asserts ‘Mars is a planet’ we can usually model what he says and thinks in terms of a simple horizontal intension. Semantic interpretations of the 2D framework treat the intension corresponding to the diagonal of a 2D matrix as fully determined by the subject’s internal states, whereas on a metasemantic approach which diagonal intension is assigned—or whether a diagonal intension is invoked at all—depends on the explanatory interests of an interpreter.[24]

Third, the assignment principle used to fill in a metasemantic 2D matrix for a subject’s words is not beholden to an internalist account of reference-fixing. On a semantic interpretation, 2D matrices are filled in on the basis of the subject’s idealized judgments about hypothetical scenarios. But the metasemantic approach is not committed to relying on the subject’s epistemic judgments to fill in 2D matrices: it’s the theorist who must be able to assign horizontal intensions to the subject’s words and thoughts on the basis of the totality of empirical facts about her. Nor should we think of reference-fixing as somehow determined by the internal states of the theorist, since even theorists are prone to mistakes on externalist accounts of reference-fixing.

Fourth, on the metasemantic approach, the basic semantic assignments are always horizontal intensions, which reflect the nature of the objects, kinds and properties the subject is thinking and talking about. On a metasemantic account, diagonal intensions represent ad hoc reinterpretations that we resort to when the normal horizontal intension for a subject’s sentences or thoughts is necessarily true or necessarily false, and hence makes no substantive claim about the empirical world. Such diagonal intensions, moreover, are theoretical abstractions derived from a set of horizontal intensions that are compatible with the subject’s partial ignorance about nature of the objects, kinds, and properties she is representing (i.e., her partial ignorance of the horizontal intensions for her words and thoughts). Semantic interpretations of the 2D framework, in contrast, treat the intensions picked out by the diagonal of a 2D matrix as basic semantic values in their own right.

As a consequence of these structural features of the metasemantic interpretation, metasemantic diagonal intensions play none of the basic explanatory roles attributed to 1-intensions by proponents of generalized 2D semantics. In particular, (i) diagonal intensions do not figure in a compositional semantic theory, (ii) they do not reflect stable aspects of linguistic or conceptual competence, and (iii) they do not represent apriori accessible reference-fixing conditions for the subject’s words or thoughts (Stalnaker 1999b, 2004 , 2007).

7.5 Objections to the metasemantic interpretation

The metasemantic interpretation uses the 2D possible worlds framework in an ad hoc, context-sensitive way to isolate certain aspects of a subject’s understanding that are not captured by standard possible worlds semantics. This metasemantic project can be challenged on a number of different fronts.

First, one might object to the account of how metasemantic diagonal propositions are generated for particular assertions. The account developed in ‘Assertion’ relies on Gricean norms for felicitous communication to identify an empirical proposition expressed by a necessary sentence. However, Gricean mechanisms may not determine the intuitively correct semantic assignments (e.g., Brehany 2006). Indeed, some critics argue the diagonalization strategy may fail to determine any semantic assignment at all, because of its commitment to transparent mutual knowledge of the context (Hawthorne and Madigor 2009; see (Stalnaker 2009) for a reply). More generally, Stalnaker emphasizes that his primary commitment is not to specific Gricean mechanisms for assigning diagonal intensions to assertions, but rather to the idea that possible worlds semantics can fully capture the content of thought and talk and how it evolves through conversation and inquiry (Stalnaker 2014).

Second, one might challenge the background assumption that one-dimensional possible world semantics, with its coarse-grained representation of truth-conditions as functions mapping possible worlds to truth-values, is the best way to characterize the content of language and thought. Stalnaker introduces the 2D framework in order to address cases that are problematic for standard possible world semantics: the assertion of necessary truths and certain types of attitude reports. But many theorists contend that functions from worlds to truth-values cannot fully capture the content of thought and talk. For instance, we may need to invoke finer-grained syntactic or conceptual structures (i) to explain what is said when we report the content of a person’s words or thoughts (e.g., Crimmins 1992; Richard 1990), (ii) to capture apparent differences in content between logically equivalent claims (“the problem of logical omniscience”), (iii) to account for our ability to think de re thoughts about particular objects (Soames 2005, ch. 5; 2006a; 2006b), (iv) to capture the subject’s understanding of her own location within the world (“the problem of the essential indexical”) (Perry 1979, 2006), or (v) to capture the subject’s perspective on sameness of subject matter (Perry, 1980; Kaplan 1990; Fine 2007). Even if the metasemantic approach has the resources to describe these phenomena, critics may question whether it provides the best, most perspicuous explanation of mental and linguistic content.[25] [See the entries on structured propositions, situation semantics, and propositional attitude reports.] The addition of multi-centered possible worlds for keeping track of conversational dynamics and thought content may help address some of these worries (Stalnaker 2008, 2014; Torre 2010; Ninan 2013).

Third, proponents of generalized 2D semantics challenge the idea that there is a principled distinction between semantic theories and metasemantic theories. Perhaps the distinction is merely a verbal dispute over whether the 2D matrices assigned to a person’s words and thoughts deserve the name ‘semantic’ (Chalmers 1996, ch.2 §4; Jackson 2006; Lewis 1981). Stalnaker himself holds that the distinction is a theoretically important one that has implications for compositional semantic theory and apriori knowledge of truth-conditions. This dispute between 2D metasemantics and generalized 2D semantics may ultimately turn on whether one accepts an externalist or an internalist account of metasemantics—i.e., whether the subject’s purely internal states fully determine how the extension of her words and thoughts is fixed. Proponents of generalized 2D semantics hold that the individual’s own cognitive dispositions suffice to fix the propositional content of her words and thoughts. In contrast, Stalnaker holds that the propositional content of language and thought depends in part on external facts to which subjects have no privileged apriori access and it varies according to contingent explanatory interests.

In his recent book, Context (2014), Stalnaker focuses on the nature of common ground, context, the dynamics of conversation – issues that are central to his metasemantic interpretation of the two-dimensional framework. For a helpful author-meets-critics discussion of his current views and the prospects for extending them, see (Camp forthcoming, Greene forthcoming, Szabó forthcoming, Stalnaker forthcoming).


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Other Internet Resources

  • Hidden Indexicality and Subjective Meaning , Ulrike Haas-Spohn,(PDF): an early and very clear characterization of the motivations and semantic framework for generalized 2D semantics, (Originally a Phd thesis,1995, Tübingen), published in German as Versteckte Indexikalität und subjektive Bedeutung (1995, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag).
  • “Two-Dimensional Semantics—the Basics” (PDF, 4,000 words) Christian Nimtz: a concise overview (Erlangen-Nürnberg University) compares Kripke, Kaplan, Stalnaker and Chalmers.
  • “Varieties of Two-Dimensionalism”, Jim Pryor (PDF, 5,000 words): a somewhat more technical discussion explores different ways of interpreting 2D matrices.
  • “Two-Dimensional Semantics”, David Chalmers: a pdf manuscript version of (Chalmers 2006b) compares the most influential interpretations of two-dimensionalism, and outlines and defends the epistemic interpretation.


Many thanks to David Chalmers, Lloyd Humberstone, Frank Jackson, Robert Stalnaker and an anonymous referee for very helpful feedback on this entry.

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