Epistemological Problems of Testimony

First published Thu Feb 2, 2006; substantive revision Mon Aug 27, 2012

Given that speakers of a language sometimes assert falsehoods and fail to be sincere, under what conditions, if any, is someone’s word alone sufficient to justify the beliefs a hearer acquires from those assertions? Of course, besides the word of the speaker, hearers also causally depend on believing testimony on other fundamental sources of knowledge like perception, memory, learning, and inference. Can the reliability of testimony be justified by appeal to these sources? This question represents the dominant epistemological problem of testimony—is testimony an autonomous source of epistemic authority? Reductionists answer negatively. They are opposed by anti-reductionists who hold, characteristically on a priori grounds, that testimony is a source of warrant in itself, not reducible to warrant derived from these other sources, even if empirically dependent on them.

1. The Nature of Testimony and its Epistemological Vulnerability

The primary speech-act of testimony is a speaker’s saying, telling, or asserting something (Searle 1969). Assertion puts forth a proposition that the speaker represents as true (see the entry on assertion, on norms of assertion, Rescorla 2009):

The utterance of a sentence serves not only to express a thought, and to refer to a truth-value, but also to assert something, namely that the thought expressed is true, or that the truth-value referred to is truth. (Dummett 1981, 298)

Standard assertions are not epistemically qualified or ‘guarded’ (e.g., I am pretty (very) sure that p), but they are the expression of the corresponding all-out (or full) belief (see Toulmin 1958, 85; also, Coady 1992; Fricker 1995, 2004; Graham 1997; Goldberg 2001; Lackey 2008, especially Ch.1; Cullison 2010).

In assertion, the speaker extends an invitation to the hearer (to understand him) e.g., Thomson (1990). To use Kant’s example: If I start to pack my suitcase in front of you, but I have no plan to leave then I intentionally deceive you by giving you evidence that I plan to leave. But I do not invite you to notice or to understand what I am doing. By contrast, if I said to you either “I am leaving town” (a lie) or “Don’t worry if you do not find me here tomorrow” (an intentionally misleading assertion), I do invite you to understand and believe me. Thereby, I assume responsibility for the truth and veracity of my assertion, though arguably less so for the implicature that “I am leaving town,” see Adler (1997).

Discussion is restricted to cases in which the speaker’s utterance is meant literally, rather than rhetorically, playfully, figuratively, fictionally, or ironically. These restrictions are imposed for brevity, though the discussion is oriented to the primacy of literal usage and informativeness (see, e.g., Bach and Harnish 1979; McDowell 1980). The primacy of the aim of informativeness explains why the untruths of tact and related forms of social politeness should be set aside. The norm of truthfulness is relaxed. The relaxation is, presumably, a product of tacit consent and coordination for purposes of sociability and social harmony. Vagueness and ‘loose talk’ e.g., “The meeting is around 3 pm” are pervasive and essential for at least economy and ease of comprehension, but they are not treated separately (Bach 2001).

Since we are in great need of information from others, we will not be so demanding that in order to avoid error, we refuse to take any risks of misinformation to gain valuable truths. Gelfert (2006) presents Kant as arguing that we have a presumptive (imperfect) duty not to distrust others and a duty of fidelity to trust the word of others because a stance of incredulity is an active suspicion of others and imposes a higher standard than is socially, conversationally, or epistemically appropriate.

An epistemological problem enters, however, if our ground for coming to these beliefs is only the speaker’s word, since that seems a very weak basis. What reason, if any, is there for a hearer to just take the speaker’s word, given that the speaker is capable of lies, deception, error, and poor, ambiguous, or misleading expression? For the hearer to trust the speaker’s word is for the hearer to ascribe authority to the speaker. Within the limits of presumed competence, the hearer ascribes to the speaker justification or warrant or knowledge for what she asserts. The hearer takes the speaker to be in a better position to settle the matter easily and transmit the relevant information, and so seeks the speaker’s testimony (Gibbard 1990; Brandom 1994; Faulkner 2007; Keren 2007). Does the hearer have good reason to ascribe that authority? In what follows, this is referred to as the Vulnerability Problem.

In order to focus on just the Vulnerability Problem, it helps to identify a class of core cases that isolates our dependence on the word of the speaker and whatever epistemic resources are available in ordinary conversational contexts. The following conditions help to delineate the class of core cases:

  • The speaker’s testimony is a single sentence. This eliminates any justification an assertion might receive by being part of a group of cohering, mutually-supportive assertions.

  • There is a single speaker. This eliminates the justification the testimony might receive by corroboration from other speakers.

  • The context is one where the norm of truthfulness holds and the purpose is primarily to inform.

  • The testimony sustains the corresponding belief in the hearer. This rules out cases such as acquiring the belief that Joan is in Arkansas because Mary says so. But then you subsequently receive a card from Joan postmarked in Arkansas. The card enormously diminishes your epistemic dependence on Mary’s testimony.

  • The speaker is assumed not to have any special “expert knowledge” on the topic of their assertion. The topic of expert knowledge in relation to testimony is prominently discussed within scientific or legal settings. (See Kitcher 1993; Walton 1997; Brewer 1998; Golanski 2001; W. Jones 2002. For a survey of research on eyewitness testimony in the law, see Wells and Olsen 2003. We also set aside testimony whose content is independently problematic for the ascription of expertise e.g., moral testimony, Nickel 2001; Hopkins 2007; Driver 2006.)

  • The speaker is not acting under professional or institutional demands for accurate testimony. This is necessary to focus on the justification for accepting testimony that derives only from the norms of the conversational practice.

  • Finally, the hearer has no special knowledge about the speaker. For the purposes of the present discussion the ideal speaker should be a stranger to the hearer, since personal knowledge of a speaker will affect a hearer’s justification for accepting the speaker’s testimony.

One might think that a typical core case like asking local directions from a stranger satisfies this condition. However, the hearer is likely to quickly recognize whether the speaker is native to the area, among other easily or effortlessly known matters.

When the above conditions are met, if only approximately, the settings will be the proper ones for investigating the Vulnerability Problem. These are ordinary contexts where the norm of truthfulness holds, the purpose is primarily to inform, the hearer’s information about the speaker is minimal and there is little or no motivation to deceive e.g., the time, the weather, driving directions, the location of notable places, prominent historical facts, sports scores, the whereabouts of acquaintances, explaining why you are going to the shopping mall. In these core cases, hearers generally have no special reason to doubt the speaker’s word, as they would if the speaker’s assertion is controversial or self-serving.

Three features of our conversational practice indicate the wide scope of the Vulnerability Problem. The first is our far-reaching dependence on testimony—a vast number of our beliefs arise through it and the inferences it justifies (Price 1969; Sosa 1994; Schmitt 1994a; Insole 2000; in the history of science, Shapin 1994). After all, our knowledge about how babies are born, how the blood circulates, the geography of the world, etc. are not acquired by observation and direct experience (Coady 1992, 82; see also Stevenson 1993; Sosa 1994). Hume correctly noted that “there is no species of reasoning more common, more useful, and even necessary to human life, than that which is derived from the testimony of men, and the reports of eyewitnesses and spectators” (1977 [1748], 74).

A second feature of our conversational practice is that in core cases hearers normally accept the assertions of speakers. A difficulty for securing behavioral evidence for this empirical claim is that a hearer’s noticeable response to the speaker may appear as acceptance, while in the privacy of the hearer’s mind there is no unqualified acceptance. However, if this dodge became frequent enough, it would come to be known. We would noticeably diminish our trust in the testimonial practice. Assuming then that we do typically or, more strongly, uniformly accept ordinary informative testimony, the practice is robust. If speakers were to epistemically qualify their assertions (e.g., with variants of “I’m pretty sure that p”), they would risk less blame if mistaken, yet their assertions would still display responsiveness to the hearer’s informational interest.

The third feature that attests to the wide scope of the Vulnerability Problem is the typical infeasibility for hearers to seriously check or confirm either the speaker’s reliability or sincerity within the normal constraints of testimonial transmission and exchange.

2. Background Evidence and the Vulnerability Problem

In responding to the Vulnerability Problem, the goal is to show that even given the infeasibility of checking on the speaker, there is much evidence available to us of the trustworthiness of the testimonial setting and of the credibility of what is asserted in the core cases and well beyond. For example, a hearer can easily detect the speaker’s competence and sincerity with various prospects of success (e.g., the speaker answers with hesitancy). But the background evidence to be set out is more general, applying to most ordinary conversational settings and available with competence in the practice (Adler 1994, 2002; Faulkner 2000, 2002; Siegel 2005):

1. The predominance of truthful testimony.
Testimony overwhelmingly transmits truth (non-accidentally). Since actions often ensue from testimony, we are positioned to notice failure and we would be responsive to it. So, it is plausible to conclude that where testimony thrives, it is by-and-large reliable.

However, it has been observed that false testimony is frequent and unsurprising (Fricker 1994; McDowell 1994). But the significance of this observation is subject to exaggeration. We expect correct testimony, and so it is hardly noticed. We are much more attentive to, and recall much better, erroneous testimony. An illusion arises if the estimation of the frequency of erroneous testimony is due to comparisons mainly with cases that one recalls. But the relevant reference class is the actual totality of testimony.

2.Truthfulness as the norm.
Truthfulness is a presupposition of the practice of linguistic communication (Lewis 1969, 1975/1983; Schiffer 1972). Truthfulness governs conversational exchange, allowing assertion to serve its function. Defection from it can only come in small doses, since otherwise it would undermine the trust that the defector (‘free rider’) requires. Lying and deceiving (evasion, misleading) are typically much more troublesome and riskier than simple honesty, which is reasonably presumed in myriad everyday social interactions (Fallis 2010, discussion forward is mainly under the assumption that speakers are sincere; Williams 2002).

Given general conformity to truthfulness and accuracy, the testimonial practice promises great overall epistemic benefits, which is so obvious to participants as to go unremarked.

3. Reputation and Sanctions.
The expectation of truthfulness is sufficiently strong that those who are the victims of false testimony, whether through error or deception, are likely to become less trusting. But the scope of that loss of trust will be extremely narrowly circumscribed, partly because we lack other means than testimony to acquire the information we seek. In small communities and institutional settings, though far less so in large communities where anonymity can be maintained, sanctions and reputation are a forceful constraint. “Gossip” columnists probably would not keep their jobs if the readily verified portions of their factual reports were not largely accurate (see Coady 2006; also Pullum 1989 on rumors).

Although the Vulnerability Problem has been most provocatively pressed about science, the constraint of reputation is particularly forceful in it. Additionally, there are the related constraints of replication, publicity, and peer review (Shatz 2004). Consequently, despite the intense competitive nature of science, major defections are unusual. One overview concludes

No reliable data exist on the incidence of scientific misconduct, but it is likely that the serious form of it—fabrication and falsification of data—is rare. (Kevles 1996, 109; however, see Judson 2004 and Freeman 2010)

4. Impersonal knowledge of our informants.
For their beliefs, informants mainly depend upon reliable sources such as perception, memory, reasoning, and testimony. Standard moral development, upbringing, and education aim to instill fundamental values, honesty and concern for others, in particular. These values are easily learned because of the obvious advantage and mutual benefit of receiving accurate information. We learn of types of speakers who will be more or less trustworthy, depending on circumstances, as well as topics on which strangers are likely to be more or less competent.
5. Motivation, Social-Moral Bonds, Cooperation.
It is only very occasionally that lying is well motivated. In the absence of that motivation, Burge observes that: “Lying for the fun of it is a form of craziness” (1993, 474). In general, only occasionally do speakers stand to gain by transmitting false or unwarranted testimony.

In conversational exchange, a moral and social bond is generated between speaker and hearer, even when strangers. The speaker appropriately feels some duty to answer the hearer’s inquiry, if she can, or to deny knowing, apologetically, (“Sorry, I don’t know”) if she cannot. The speaker, though, is promised no informational compensation in typical exchanges. The only immediate compensation promised is the hearer’s gratitude.

Speculation on the evolution of communication, however, is that the practice arose from benefits to the speaker in manipulating the beliefs of the hearer, since much of the information a speaker has would be highly valuable, e.g., location of a scarce food source (Sperber 2001). Still, in cases where there is incentive to defect, the evident benefits of cooperation suggest a repeated Prisoner’s Dilemma, where the strategy of tit-for-tat—cooperate to start, and then mimic the other player—scores better overall in simulated environments than other strategies. (On tit-for-tat, Axelrod 1984. See also Blais 1987, 1990; Woods 1989; Parikh 2001.) Additional to its overt features of cooperativeness, tit-for-tat seeks to be recognized (‘overt’) and it is not a ‘sucker’ as it will retaliate. Yet, tit-for-tat does not hold a grudge. After punishing a defector by defecting, tit-for-tat resumes cooperation. Trustworthiness is then likely to emerge from repeated Prisoner’s Dilemma-like settings, since fixed, recognizable dispositions attract others because it is a commitment not to be swayed case-by-case (Gauthier 1986; McClennen 1990).

Speakers’ assertions are expected to be cooperative contributions in accord with Gricean maxims—to be truthful, relevant, informative, and well mannered (economical) to the hearer in conveying a communicative intention (Grice 1989; Neale 1992; the entry on implicature; see further on communicative intentions Strawson 1971 and Schiffer 1972). The Gricean maxims aid us in explaining why there is a difference between what is said and the meaning conveyed by the saying of it. Normally, no one would assert “I know there is an earth.” But that is because it would be uninformative to assert, not because it is not true. Grice plausibly claimed that the conversational practice should be thought of “as something that it is reasonable for us to follow, that we should not abandon…” (Grandy and Warner 1989, 29).

6. Prior Plausibility.
To be accepted, the content of testimony must meet a minimal standard of prior plausibility. Given the bulk of well founded (obvious) beliefs that hearers bring to the testimonial setting, they are equipped with a powerful filtering device that automatically sorts assertions to challenge or, for the starkly implausible, dismiss e.g., “There was a snowstorm in Miami Beach, last July.”

Since speakers obviously know of this filtering device (as they are regularly hearers), it will be pointless for them to assert what manifestly lacks plausibility. Consequently, the simple assertions we mainly hear are heavily pre-selected, which lends credibility to the claim that our response to ordinary testimony is typically acceptance. Prior plausibility plays a crucial role in the corroboration of testimony—the conditions under which agreement of independent witnesses raises the probability conferred on what each one testifies to individually. A theorem on corroboration is proven by Cohen (1977, 1982) and it is critically discussed by Olsson (2002) and Bovens, et al. (2002). However, as noted earlier, this work is not discussed because the raising of probability is not through the speaker’s word alone.

To review: Condition 1 is that testimony is predominantly successful in fulfilling its claim to truth. Conditions 2–6 explain why such success should not be surprising. The conversational or testimonial practice is robustly maintained despite wide variation in circumstances and vulnerability to misunderstandings, as well as to speakers’ hasty or ill informed judgments and their ability to lie, deceive, and mislead. Conditions 2–6 can serve as evidence or epistemic reasons because they are incorporated into our corpus of belief and shape our testimonial practices—specifically, our ease of acceptance or not.

Given the forceful background evidence that we share in acquiring the practice, the Vulnerability Problem weakens. Our typical acceptance of testimony does not rest only on the word of a speaker alone, who we cannot check on and who is capable of unreliability and insincerity. Our background evidence is much more extensive and solid.

The restriction to core cases is to ensure that no further evidence is available to the hearer than is found in typical testimonial settings. Our background evidence (1–6 above) meets this condition. The restriction to core cases, however, is a restriction imposed to address the Vulnerability Problem. Now that we have addressed it, the restriction is lifted (for concerns about the restriction, see Greco 2012). The obvious advantage is to comprehend more of the epistemological problems of testimony. In numerous cases well beyond the core, we are as willing to accept testimony as for the core cases: “The Giants should have gone for the first-down, rather than punt”; “DNA is a double helix”; “Marcia is sad because Tom is on the road so much” (Weiner 2003).

Still, in lifting the restriction, the danger it sought to avoid returns. When we inquire as to the justification or warrant for accepting testimony, we need to avoid importing evidence or information that goes beyond what is commonly available.

3. A Default Rule for Testimony

Epistemological problems related to the Vulnerability Problem can be clarified and sub-divided by reference to a putative default rule for testimony (DR) (on default rules, see Bach 1984). The rule is an explicitly normative analogue to the fact that hearers do typically accept speakers’ testimony:

If the speaker S asserts that p to the hearer H, then, under normal conditions, it is correct for H to accept (believe) S’s assertion, unless H has special reasons to object.

The use of “correct” in the DR refers to norms that are not committed to the prescriptive readings of “ought” or “should” (Shah and Velleman 2005). What is correct for the assertional practice need not be what is prescribed for the individual hearer, who might be better off without the belief. Nevertheless, a natural corollary of the DR is that the hearer ought to accept the speaker’s word. But would such an ought be epistemic and prescriptive? If so, would it be in conflict with the thesis that believing is non-voluntary (Williams 1973)?

“Accept” is short for “acceptance as true,” which issues in full or unqualified belief (on accepting for a purpose, Stalnaker 1984; Cohen 1992). One argument for unqualified belief as the right aim of hearers is the advantage for cognitive memory—the difficulties, specifically, of storing, accessing, working with, and updating qualified beliefs, given acquisition of new information (Harman 1986; Gilbert 1991, 1993 presents evidence that believing is psychologically prior to evaluation).

Other versions introduce minor variation on the “normal conditions” or “unless” clause, which does not bear on the main issues. However, without restrictions on what counts as a ‘special reason’ or what satisfies the ‘unless’ clause, independent of conditions on acceptance, the DR is threatened with vacuity (see Sutton 2007).

Asking for simple directions provides a handy illustration of the DR: If a stranger (speaker) tells you to turn right at the next corner in answer to your request to find a gasoline station, you are justified in accepting the assertion without being told you how the speaker knows it. Unlike argument, where a speaker explicitly presents reasons to back the assertion, in normal testimony the speaker does not. Strangers are not expected to tell you why they are in a position to know that their directions are correct. (Some languages, however, contain evidentials, which indicate their sources or types of evidence. See Aikhenvald 2004.)

If after receiving directions from the stranger, you asked another who was in plain view of the stranger, you would expect the stranger to be offended. You would be embarrassed if the stranger’s gaze fell upon you. Corresponding to the authority you ascribe and the trust you extend to the stranger, you impose a duty on yourself to accept the testimony, unless you have specific reasons to object. (Contrast the hearer with the over hearer).

The DR should not be construed as proposing that the hearer accept the speaker’s testimony without warrant or justification. Rather, sufficient justification or warrant for acceptance, whether a priori or a posteriori, is present, factoring in both the background evidence (1–6) noted above and the constraints that are inherent in the normal conversational setting. (Exactly how the constraints of the conversational setting, like the constraint to economize, is to justify governance by the DR is a difficult one, which cannot be undertaken here.) On a priori views the DR has a standing of initial entitlement to acceptance (section 8.1 below).

The DR derives direct epistemic support if a thesis about assertion introduced by Unger (1975) and developed by Williamson (1996, 2000) and others (Slote 1979; McDowell 1980; Brandom 1994; Williams 2002; Adler 2009) holds:

Knowledge Norm of Assertion (K-norm): One correctly asserts that p only if one knows (or represents oneself as knowing) that p.

On the assumption that speakers generally conform to the K-norm, which would help explain why the norm continues to hold, hearers will correspondingly ascribe to speakers knowledge that their assertions hold. These ascriptions support the DR, since speakers’ knowing is excellent reason to accept their assertions.

According to the K-norm, if you do not know that p, you should not assert it. A crucial argument for the K-norm is via a version of Moore’s Paradox, see e.g., Hintikka 1962, Green and Williams 2007; see also the entry on epistemic paradoxes, which treats of related paradoxes, the Preface Paradox, in particular.

Arguments for the K-norm assume that knowledge is factive, if S knows that p then p (for difficulties, Hazlett 2010). The K-norm seems to capture the hearer’s point of view: The hearer accepts the speaker’s testimony without learning of the speaker’s evidence or reasons or credentials, since the hearer takes the speaker to know. While cases in which speakers assert without believing they know is troubling for the K-norm, problems still lurk, even if speakers assert what they falsely believe they know (see Williamson 2000, ch.11). (For criticisms of the K-norm that are related to epistemological issues of testimony discussed below, see Weiner 2005; Douven 2006; Lackey 2008.)

The K-norm exposes one qualification required for the DR—a sensitivity to context, in particular, the importance of the testimony. After a brief look, you assert that the plastic ring I thought I dropped in your apartment is not there. I respond: “It’s not plastic, it’s diamond.” Now you would say instead something like “Well, I guess I’m not sure [or, I don’t know]. I better check more carefully.” If this variation in willingness to assert is due to a variation in standards for knowledge, the DR requires a relativization to contexts. Epistemic contextualists explain the assertional data as due to attributions of knowledge of the form “S knows that p” varying according to context. “Knows” like “tall” is relative to a standard (comparison class) or indexical (Lewis 1979/1983, 1996; Unger 1984; Cohen 1988, DeRose 1992, 1995, 2002; see the entry on epistemic contextualism).

There is another contextual sensitivity that arguably should be incorporated into the DR. On a Wittgensteinian view, particularly derived from On Certainty (1969), justification of belief is ended by ‘groundless’ beliefs. Anscombe (1981) argues that historical knowledge does not eventuate in, or only in, the direct testimony of the senses, as proposed by Hume (1978 [1740], Book I part III section IV). Rather, there will be certain historical truths (like that Caesar was assassinated) that serve as a Wittgensteinian ‘hinge’ or groundless propositions which are “exempt from doubt” (OC 341). They are to be default-accepted for those who participate in these historical inquiries, serving to confirm a historical chain’s accuracy, rather than conversely confirming the historical truth of the event (Coady 1992; Traiger 1993; Elgin 2010). But they need not be taken for granted in other contexts of inquiry.

The DR is a step towards introducing a broad epistemic model which can explain a difference between ultimate or philosophical justification and conversational justification. When justification is called for, the infinite regress argument for justification–ultimate justification—concludes that no justification chain is ever complete, since what confers justification must itself be justified (by a different proposition). Yet, the regress problem does not have a grip on conversation. Why?

Within conversational justification (e.g., justification to competent peers), we are called on to justify a belief only through a legitimate challenge “How do you know that p?” The presupposition of this question is that the hearer has a specific reason to challenge the speaker’s assertion or position to know. So a challenge to an assertion itself carries a burden of legitimation, and the regress route to skepticism is blocked, if this default-challenge structure can be defended as epistemic, not merely practical or pragmatic. The model answers the regress problem without commitment to the standard alternatives: skepticism, foundationalism, coherentism (Rorty 1979; Williams 1991; Brandom 1994; for a view of these restrictions as pragmatic, see Unger 1975; Stroud 1984).

Admittedly, there are numerous circumstances and examples which do not seem in accord with the DR. The testimony of witnesses in a law court are not default-accepted by the jury. Given the central motivation of advertisers to persuade, rather than inform, there is no default rule for accepting their testimony. You do not default-accept the stranger’s driving directions to the nearest gas station in a town, if the stranger tells you it is over 3 hours away. You do not default-accept testimony when a speaker offers an opinionated pronouncement e.g., “Raising property taxes is regressive,” or “Housing prices will fall further next quarter.” But in these cases, there is a special reason for the hearer to not accept the speaker’s testimony. They satisfy the DR’s “unless” clause. With learning, application of the DR is fine-tuned, so that further distinctions are drawn between those who should be default-trusted and those who should not e.g., the proverbial used car salesmen.

The DR is not the weakest principle that might govern conversational acceptance. Rather than holding that testimony transmits warrant or justification or knowledge, a weaker claim is that it yields to the hearer only some (pro tanto) epistemic reason to believe the speaker’s assertion (Pritchard 2004; Graham 2006a). But this weaker version of the DR would yield only entitlement to qualified, not all-out, acceptance. The result is weaker than conversational practice reveals.

If testimony does follow the DR, that is a parallel with immediate perception and memory. But testimony suffers a distinct vulnerability in our exercise of judgment and free will (Graham 2004). Testimony, unlike perception and memory, is a product of communicative intentions that are not lawlike under the relevant intentional description. Our free will allows for deliberate deception—lying and other forms of intentional untruthfulness (on insincerity as distinctive of our functioning as persons, Faulkner 2000). Speakers do not respond mechanically to hearers’ simple inquiries. They may refuse to answer, and if they answer, they select, for example, how much detail to provide.

Nevertheless, speakers’ assertions are explained by our viewing them as rationally motivated without denying free will or responsibility. The speaker offers an assertion to a hearer with the (Gricean) presumption that the speaker has an interest in informing the hearer. On matters where the speaker has nothing to gain, there is no rational motivation to lie (see further sections 6.4 and 7.1) Lacking rational motivation, the speaker does not lie. But in telling the truth, the speaker exercises free will, satisfying a necessary condition for the ascription of responsibility for the assertion.

4. Transmitting Knowledge

Both the K-norm and the DR support a principle for the transmission of knowledge by testimony that has attracted a number of discussants:

If S knows that p and S asserts that p to H, and H accepts p on the basis of S’s testimony, then H knows that p. (Hintikka 1962; Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1993; Evans 1982; Ross 1986; Craig 1990; Adler 1996; Audi 1997; Reynolds 2002; Sutton 2007)

If the K-norm is correct and on the assumption above that speakers generally conform to it, then in normal conditions, a hearer has sufficient reason to treat the speaker’s assertion as what the speaker knows. To the challenge to accept ordinary testimony “Why do you believe that stranger’s testimony?,” a common response is: “Why shouldn’t I?” That response implies that the burden is on the challenger to justify any doubts. Hearers so respond because they recognizes themselves as having good reasons to accept the speaker’s assertion.

A number of examples, deriving from the ‘Gettier literature’, raise problems for this and similar models. Consider a variant of a well known example. Jones asks a stranger in Manhattan for directions to the Brooklyn Museum, and the stranger’s answer “Take the #2 to Eastern Parkway.” Jones picks out the stranger by accident from a group of strangers, most of whom are not reliable. Does Jones’s luck in picking out a reliable speaker undermine his coming to know based on the stranger’s testimony? A reason to answer ‘No’ is that the question is whether Jones comes to know the directions, not whether the speaker is reliable. Since the speaker does know the directions, why should Jones not come to know from the speaker’s testimony? But this is contestable given the general response to the well-known “Fake Barn” example. Related problems pull defenders of the transmission model toward including conditions that hearers’ cognitive faculties are functioning well to realize the aim of truth in appropriate environments (Plantinga 1993).

Perhaps, though, the starting assumption that knowledge by the speaker is necessary for transmission of knowledge to the hearer can be abandoned. One proposal is that a speaker’s asserting that p can be sufficient to generate knowledge for a hearer, in the absence of defeaters, even if the speaker lacks knowledge (Lackey 1999, 2003, 2008; Graham 2000c; Kusch 2002).

An example in support of this proposal is of a student who would, it is held, know that p (e.g., that she lives on Elm St.) except that she suffers skeptical doubts having been swayed by the dreaming argument. Yet, the student’s assertion as to where she lives is sufficient for a hearer, who lacks these doubts, to know. Examples like this are problematic, however, since if the K-norm holds and the student lacks knowledge, she misrepresents herself, even if she does transmit knowledge.

Independent of the K-norm, the example implies an instability of belief, allowing that a counter-argument, which strikes the believer as unrefutable, is sufficient for belief-undermining-doubts. But do your students, avowing persuasion in your class by the dreaming argument, cease believing that they are in your classroom? The student who appropriately suffers skeptical doubt about her living on Elm St. manifests no change in behavior, signaling that her current doubts are transitory. Belief cannot be as subjective or unstable as to allow for any reasonable doubts to unseat it, e.g., Romeo’s (transitory) doubts about Juliet’s love for him, occasioned by her going without him to an office party with eligible bachelors. The unsettling by epistemic anxiety cannot be sufficient for loss of entitlement to belief, if belief is to serve in the analysis of knowledge. The point generalizes. These counterexamples to the knowledge-transmission thesis are supposed to work, in part, by satisfaction of the other conditions for knowledge besides belief. If belief is not merely a psychological condition, whose contrary is doubt, but has a normative dimension in its role in knowledge, like entitlement to believe, there will be a close tie between conditions that undermine the entitlement and conditions that undermine one’s epistemic position to know. If so, assertion by the student is justified, and knowledge is transmitted to, not generated for, the hearer.

These and other difficult cases for the transmission model are offered on behalf of a rejection of that model. Lackey’s (2008) alternative is that the words of the speaker, and specifically their reliability, are the locus of testimonial knowledge, rather than, say, the speaker’s knowledge.

A very different model for the transmission of testimonial knowledge draws on Dretske’s information theoretic model of knowledge:

If S’s assertion that p to H carries the information that p, and H accepts that p on the basis of S’s testimony, then H knows that p. (Dretske 1981; Graham 2000a, 2000c)

The carrying of information is a matter of lawlike relations between a signal and a source. The signal cannot carry the information that p, unless p, and thus information meets the factivity implication of knowledge (that if S knows that p then p).

Like knowledge as well, whether the signal carries the information that p can depend on what the relevant alternatives are. In Harman’s (1973) Newspaper Case, a reliable newspaper reports its knowledge of a certain political event, and the report is accepted by one of its readers, H. But newspapers other than H’s reliable, local newspaper erroneously, but sincerely, report differently. These dissenting reports count as relevant alternatives to the reader’s belief. The dominant response is that these other sources bar the transmission of H’s newspaper’s knowledge to H, since H could easily have read one of the other ones, and so the information would not be transmitted.

Further perplexities for a transmission condition are introduced by an example of Dretske’s (1982) of a connoisseur, who can well discern Medoc wines, which he knows to be from Bordeaux. However, he falsely believes that Chiantis are also from Bordeaux, although he can readily distinguish a Medoc from a Chianti. He tells a novice truly that the wine that they are now drinking, which is a Medoc, is a Bordeaux. Dretske claims that whereas the connoisseur knows that the wine is from Bordeaux, the novice does not. The connoisseur passes on his vulnerabilities to the knowledge-seeker, though Dretske concludes that the connoisseur is himself immunized from them:

You cannot learn that P from someone who tells you that P if they would say that P whether or not P, and that holds even if the person happens to know that P. (Dretske 1982, 110)

Besides appeal to a subjunctive analysis, Dretske’s argument assumes that the connoisseur’s vulnerabilities undermine only the novice’s knowing, not his own. If these assumptions are accepted, the transmission model is in trouble, Dretske concludes, whereas the prospects for the informational one are brighter, since the expert’s testimony at best “carries the information that the wine was a Bordeaux or a Chianti” (Graham 2000a; Coady 1992, ch. 12, my emphasis).

5. Reductionism and Anti-Reductionism: Preliminaries

When hearers are epistemically entitled to accept the speaker’s assertion, is the entitlement due to testimony itself or instead to other sources? Is the entitlement conferred a priori or is it to be justified a posteriori? These questions have been the center of discussions, though their presuppositions have been questioned (Kusch 2002, part I; Fricker 2007; Lackey 2008).

The view that our ordinary acceptance of testimony is justified only a posteriori has been taken as requiring the reductionist thesis that testimony, unlike perception, is not a fundamental source of warrant. The acceptance of testimony resides in other familiar empirical and a posteriori sources, notably perception, memory, and induction.

The anti-reductionist admits that testimony depends on other sources like perception, unlike its converse. And the dependence, it is claimed, is only psychological or causal. But the epistemic warrant or justification for accepting testimony need not essentially appeal to these other sources. It may refer only to the speaker’s knowledge, word-giving (promising), and other principles that are purely testimonial (Audi 1997; related claims are made by Coady 1992; for criticisms, Fricker 1995; Graham 2000b).

Strictly, reductionism and anti-reductionism are not incompatible. The same testimonial transmission can be justified either way, so that justification can be overdetermined, meeting both inferential and non-inferential conditions (Graham 2006b). Nevertheless, we will assume that reductionist and anti-reductionist sources of justification (warrant, entitlement) are incompatible in cases of testimonial transmission, which is how they are dialectically presented.

Hume is taken as the main proponent of reductionism (e.g., Hume 1978 [1740], Bk I part III section IV) due largely to the views he expresses in “Of Miracles” (1977 [1748]), an essay directed to the warrant for accepting testimony of miracles (on testimony for the supernatural, see Coady 1994). Key statements are these:

our assurance in any argument of this kind [from testimony] is derived from no other principle than our observation of the veracity of human testimony, and of the usual conformity of facts to the reports of witnesses. (Hume 1977 [1748], 74)

The reason why we place any credit in witnesses and historians is not derived from any connexion, which we perceive a priori, between testimony and reality, but because we are accustomed to find a conformity between them. (Hume 1977 [1748], 75)

On the usual readings of these passages, each instance of testimonial transmission is justified only by an implicit record of the agent’s ratio of past testimonial success, perhaps restricted to communicational communities of types of testimony and speakers. If so, a Humean view would be in opposition to the DR (for discussion of Hume’s views on testimony that are wary of the usual readings, Traiger 1993; Faulkner 1998; Root 2001; Van Cleve 2006; Gelfert 2010a). This unadorned empiricist model is the basis for the standard contrast to a “Reidian” view:

Reid’s position is that any assertion is creditworthy until shown otherwise; whereas Hume implies that specific evidence for its reliability is needed. (Stevenson 1993, 433. See also Wolterstorff 2001; Audi 2006)

The Reidian account of testimonial trust is that since God intended us to be ‘social creatures’, he implanted in us “a propensity to speak the truth,” the principle of veracity, as well as, correspondingly “a disposition to confide in the veracity of others, and to believe what they tell us,” the principle of credulity (Reid 1983, 94–95).

The Reid-Hume contrast needs tempering, however, if the usual way to obtain specific evidence is by checking on the reliability and sincerity of a speaker, which, as noted earlier, is generally not feasible. The implication that offering and accepting testimony could not be a regular habit or practice fuels anti-reductionism. Reductionism cannot work, it is claimed, because hearers know too little about speakers and cannot find out more within the testimonial exchange (Webb 1993; Foley 1994). Hume’s position is salvageable—his endorsement, noted earlier, of our far-reaching (epistemic and doxastic) dependence on testimony, specifically—if there are, and must be, ways to acquire evidence favoring the acceptance of testimony that do not involve burdensome checks on the credentials of particular speakers, as with background evidence. The salvage would neutralize Coady’s observation:

In our ordinary dealings with others we gather information without this concern for inferring the acceptability of communications from premises about honesty, reliability, probability, etc. of our communicants…. (Coady 1992, 143; for similar concerns, Audi 1997)

Schiffer objects that this argument conflates the epistemic and the psychological:

Whether knowing p is based on knowing q, isn’t about the actual movement of thought, the considerations one actually ponders; it’s about the structure of beliefs that sustain one’s conclusion (2003, 303; Fricker 1995; Burge 1997).

If the automaticity of our response to testimony is not decisive for whether the epistemic basis is a priori, innate, or empirical, then, similarly, the evidence of a typical acceptance of testimony is evidence that our trust in speakers is not ‘blind,’ given that hearers are responsive to when speakers are unreliable or insincere.

Another objection to Humean reductionism is that any attempt to justify testimony through an inductive inference will inevitably be circular. For the justificatory grounds will almost certainly be obtained, in part, through testimony (Coady 1992). This criticism assumes that to justify reliance on testimony overall or in a particular case bars appeal to evidence of past testimonial success. But it is not evident that this assumption is correct, or that the restriction would not equally exclude justification of perception (by its ‘track record,’ Alston 1993).

Shogenji (2006) responds to this circularity objection and a related “transcendental” one (a Davidsonian (1984) type argument that interpretation assumes the general credibility of testimony) together in two steps. The general credibility of testimony is put forth as a hypothesis, so that the credibility of testimony is subject to confirmation or disconfirmation. Our testimonial practice turn out to be extremely well, albeit tacitly, confirmed, through its overwhelming success. Confidence in the practice draws epistemically on this tacit confirmation as part of our inherited and developing competence in the testimonial practice (Adler 1990, 2002).

Another difficulty alleged against the Humean is that his denial of any a priori connection “between testimony and reality” implies that

we might have discovered (though in fact we did not) that there was no conformity at all between testimony and reality. (Coady 1992, 85)

If Hume does allow for this discovery, it would be difficult to understand how the practice of testimony persists so robustly, since the failings would undermine trust. But the result also suggests that Hume need not allow for the possibility (Schmitt 1994a; Lyons 1997). The demand to empirically justify reliance on testimony does not entail that there are not necessary conditions, which must be satisfied for the practice to be sustained. There is no a priori connection between private swimming pools and wealth. Yet, a high level of wealth may be an important necessary condition for the continued construction of private swimming pools.

Still, if Hume allows for the possibility of a world in which testimony and reality are discovered not to match, a further, related, difficulty is held to arise:

whenever they [the ‘Martians’] construct sentences addressed to each other in the absence (from their vicinity) of the things designated by the names, but when they are, as we should think, in a position to report, then they seem to say what we (more synoptically placed) can observe to be false. But in such a situation what reason would there be for believing that they even had the practice of reporting? (Coady 1992, 85)

These objections culminate in an argument that meaning or content, as well as language learning, are claimed to be impossible absent an a priori connection of testimony and truth. For if we are constantly frustrated in checking the truth of our attempts to translate native utterances, we thereby undermine our claim to understand, or even to attribute content, to them (Coady 1992; for criticisms Graham 2000b).

The argument is derived from Davidson (1984). He holds that it is a conceptual truth that we attribute rationality to speakers in interpreting them, which Davidson understands as implying that the speaker’s beliefs are predominantly like our own, and, more disputably, that they are predominantly true.

However, even if these Davidsonian claims hold, there is a barrier to transferring them to testimony. The vast, shared collection of beliefs that, in Davidson’s words, are “too dull, trite, or familiar to stand notice,” (1984, 199) dwarf by comparison the set of beliefs likely to be expressed in testimony, since the latter are presented only on the presumption of their informativeness to hearers. But if testimony is informative, the assertions are among the riskier constituents of our vast background of ‘dull’ beliefs. Consequently, they are lesser candidates for Davidson’s a priori interpretational justification. Among the beliefs a priori guaranteed of truth by the Davidson-type reasoning would be ones like that there is an earth, 2+2=4, and bacteria do not study astro-physics. Except under unusual circumstances, these are not the kind of beliefs that would be informative to assert (Adler 1994; Fricker 1995; Elgin 2002; for doubts about a Davidsonian approach, Ebbs 2002).

This section presented a sketch of reductionism sufficient to survey some anti-reductionist and a priori criticisms of it. But we have not provided detailed accounts of either. Although the background evidence outlined above (section 2) does not strictly favor either reductionist or anti-reductionist views, it plays a crucial role for the reductionist, which is discussed next in section 6. Section 7 covers a diverse range of anti-reductionist views.

6. A Posteriori or Reductionist Approaches

Appeal to the background evidence of the testimonial practice lends itself to the development of a number of approaches to the a posteriori justification of testimony with varying implications for reductionism. The enumerative induction account attributed to Hume’s ‘On Miracles’ is only one kind of a posteriori position (Lyons 1997; Rysiew 2000). There is no assumption that these approaches are exclusive of one another, and in obvious ways a number of them are complimentary.

6.1 Background Evidence and Learning

The background evidence enumerated above (section 2) is incorporated into one’s corpus of beliefs. They constitute a vast source of evidence for us in regard to the reliability of testimony (but see Pritchard 2004). We acquire knowledge of the trustworthiness of testimony, as well as knowledge of domains in which the word of others is not to be default-accepted (e.g., salespeople on the quality of competing brands).

Along these lines are resources to object to those who have used our far-reaching dependence on testimony to press that much of our beliefs rests on a fragile ethical, basis e.g.,

the trustworthiness of members of epistemic communities is the ultimate foundation for much of our knowledge. (Hardwig 1991, 694; for developments and criticism see Webb 1993; Govier 1993; Adler 1994; Baier 1994; Holton 1994; Shapin 1994)

In opposition to this fragility claim, we enter testimonial settings with powerful background beliefs (evidence) to trust the word of the speaker.

Recent empirical work shows that young children do trust testimony. However, the trust is selective enough to raise doubts about Reidian views of children as highly credulous (Harris 2002). In an overview of current findings, evidence is presented that young children “keep track of the epistemic reliability of potential informants” and “monitor the cultural standing of potential informants” (Harris and Corriveau 2011; extending a theme from Koenig and Harris 2007). Harris and Corriveau (2011) conclude that “taken together, these two heuristics favour the transmission of information that is either true or culturally typical.”

Even though the knowledge that subtly guides our patterns of acceptance of testimony is obtained prior to the testimonial setting, it is clearly not knowledge a priori—knowledge not dependent on experience. The appeal to background evidence to justify our testimonial practice is at variance with the accusation that an empirical or a posteriori approach demands that “we remain neutral or skeptical of information unless we have empirical grounds for thinking it trustworthy…” (Burge 1993, 473).

6.2 A Minimal Reductionist Position

Elizabeth Fricker (1987, 1994, 1995, 2004, 2006) argues for a reductionist and internalist justification for particular (local) testimonial exchanges, in which testimony is taken as inferential or indirect, in contrast to perception which she takes as providing a direct justification for corresponding beliefs (see also Sutton 2007). She is skeptical of a global reductionist thesis to establish the general reliability of testimony. With qualifications, Fricker denies that we are entitled to default-accept the reliability of testimony, although she does think a default applies to judging the sincerity of the speaker. She regards any rule like the DR as “an epistemic charter for the gullible and undiscriminating” (1994, 126; but see also, 1995). Fricker claims that hearers can obtain independent evidence to confirm the belief that a speaker is trustworthy. She stresses that “insincerity and honest error are both perfectly possible”:

a hearer should always engage in some assessment of the speaker for trustworthiness. To believe what is asserted without doing so is to believe blindly, uncritically. This is gullibility. (145)

Later, explicitly contrasting her view with an analogue of the DR [the PR thesis], she writes that

My account requires a hearer always to take a critical stance to the speaker, to assess her for trustworthiness;…on my account, but not on the PR thesis, the hearer must always be monitoring the speaker critically. (1994, 154; 1995)

However, if the critical monitoring required is only the “counterfactual sensitivity” that “if there were any signs of untrustworthiness, she would pick them up” (1995, 154; Weiner 2003), so that no special efforts are required of hearers, her differences with those who uphold the DR or a minimal anti-reductionist thesis seems to vanish (Goldberg and Henderson 2006). If, instead, special efforts are required by the hearer, and if our actual practice is in accord with the DR, it is doubtful whether her proposal satisfies the claim that checking is infeasible. This difficulty applies as well to contextualist approaches like that of Jones (1999) or Kusch (2002).

6.3 Inferential Structure 1: A Bayesian Analysis

The role of prior plausibility or epistemic probability at the heart of a Humean view of testimony can be turned into a Bayesian justification of testimony (for Bayesian analyses of Hume’s argument in “On Miracles,” Owen 1987; Sobel 1987). Based on an analysis of Friedman’s (1987) for legal settings, Goldman (1999, 4.2–4.4) presents the following model: Given that a witness testifies to a fact X, what is the probability of X? The answer, given by Bayes’ Theorem, is that X’s probability is a function of the likelihood that the witness would so testify, if the fact X held, and the prior probability of that fact. If the likelihood of the testimony is greater given X than not, then testimony raises the probability of X compared to its original or prior probability. As is typical of Bayesian analyses, a key question is how individuals are to estimate the various likelihoods and to secure the prior probabilities (Friedman 1987; Goldman 1999).

Also along Bayesian lines, Goldman (1999) applies a related theorem of his and Shaked (Goldman and Shaked 1991) to testimony. The theorem establishes that under certain conditions (e.g., that there is an objective likelihood that the witness will testify that p, if p), one’s posterior degree of belief based on testimony will reflect an objectively greater nearness to truth than one’s prior degree of belief.

The Bayesian model provides for a representation of an important epistemic value of testimony. But its application to the acceptance of testimony requires an account of the relation of degrees of belief to full or all-out beliefs, if speakers typically enter unqualified assertions and hearers typically accept them as stated.

6.4 Inferential Structure 2: Inference to the Best Explanation

If acceptance of current testimony is based on enumerative induction over past acceptances, the induction requires verification of the assertions that hearers accept. These verifications will themselves appeal to testimony for corroboration. Even if this kind of circularity is acceptable, as suggested earlier, the correlations alone do not seem strong enough to justify our conformity to the DR and to the typical acceptance claim. Further, what will count as epistemically similar instances of the testimonial setting? Testimonial settings are diverse in circumstances and speakers.

But instead of relying just on extrapolation from correlations, inductive inference, including enumerative induction, can take the form of inference to the best explanation (ibe). (See the entry on abduction.) Ibe is particularly powerful in science as justifying inferences from observational surprises or puzzles to the existence of theoretical entities to explain them e.g., to explain why ice floats on water by appeal to hydrogen bonding (Lipton 2004 on the difference between inference to the loveliest and inference to the likeliest hypothesis).

The role of ibe in testimony is straightforward. Normally, if a stranger responds to your inquiry as to how to get to Harlem by uttering “Take the uptown #1 to 125th St.,” the best explanation of why she said that is that she believed it (for good reason) and that she cared to inform you of it. The inference is mutually supportive of the counterfactual we assume as hearers:

One wouldn’t have asserted that p unless one believed one knows p and one wouldn’t have that belief if p weren’t the case. (Harman 1965; Fricker 1995; Lipton 1998, 2007; Schiffer 2003; Malmgren 2006)

Obviously, people have false beliefs. Our appeal to the counterfactual assumes that by-and-large people have true beliefs or at least this is so for the everyday information that hearers seek from testifiers, which is easily obtained and readily shared, e.g., local directions.

If ibe provides sufficient reason to accept the speaker’s testimony, it may be argued it obviates the need for the DR. The hearer treats the stranger’s uttering what she did as evidence of what she believes or what she believes that she knows. The inference involves no explicitly normative notion, yet it yields the same pattern of virtually automatic acceptance of testimony in normal settings.

If testimony diminished in reliability—if there were more lies and errors–the above ibe may still be the best explanation of why a speaker said what she did: that she believed it because it is true. If a stranger gives me directions to take the A subway line downtown, and I recall hearing something to the effect that there was smoke reported on a subway line in the area, then I have a specific reason to challenge the stranger. Nevertheless, I am not thereby in a position to deny that the best explanation of why she said what she did goes according to the ibe. To accept the speaker’s testimony, the hearer requires not only that the truth of the speaker’s testimony provide the best explanation of why she said what she did, but also that it is good enough.

7. A Priori Defenses of Testimony and Opposition to Reductionism

The representation of Anti-Reductionism so far has been very limited. Coady’s (1992) critique of reductionism is only one of a number of forceful anti-reductionist approaches. More recent writings have taken new turns. Goldberg’s (2007) anti-reductionist leanings, for example, are one facet of his appeal to testimony for an extended defense of externalism about content and a reliabilist epistemology.

7.1 A Priori Entitlement

In a foundational article, Burge (1993, 1997) offers an a priori defense of a variant of the DR. His “Acceptance Principle” is an easily defeasible norm which only describes our epistemic condition. Its pivotal epistemic term is entitlement:

A person is entitled to accept as true something that is presented as true and that is intelligible to him unless there are stronger reasons not to do so. (1993, 467; Edwards 2000 defends a restatement of the Acceptance Principle)

The “Acceptance Principle” is comparable to Davidson’s (1984) “Principle of Charity” and Grice’s (1989) “Cooperative Principle” in endorsing the hearer’s default bias to accept the speaker’s assertions. The hearer does not begin in the neutral position of treating the speaker’s act of assertion as requiring evaluative certification as a condition of its acceptance. The entitlement is conferred by the nature of the testimonial setting. The entitlement applies independent of whether the hearer has any particular reasons to trust the speaker.

The argument disassociates the Acceptance Principle from the essential epistemic dependence on perception or memory. These only serve as sources to preserve content (Burge 1997, 28; responding to Christensen and Kornblith 1997). Burge summarizes his main argument as follows:

We are a priori entitled to accept something that is prima facie intelligible and presented as true. For prima facie intelligible propositional contents prima facie presented as true bear an a priori prima facie conceptual relation to a rational source of true presentations-as-true: Intelligible propositional expressions presuppose rational abilities and entitlement; so intelligible presentations-as-true come prima facie backed by a rational source or resource of reason; and both the content of intelligible propositional presentations-as-true and the prima facie rationality of their source indicate a prima facie source of truth. Intelligible affirmation is the face of reason; reason is a guide to truth. We are a priori prima facie entitled to take intelligible affirmation at face value. (Burge 1993, 472–473. For criticism, Audi 2004; Malmgren 2006 offers an extended critique of Burge, defending a form of ibe)

Burge’s reasoning applies beyond testimony as becomes manifest by way of the objection that if the intelligibility of the speaker’s affirmation depends upon the inferential structure of the communication mechanism, then an impurely preservative mechanism would be required for understanding, contrary to Burge’s claim of an a priori entitlement (Bezuidenhout 1998). However, even if the hearer directly or non-inferentially grasps the speaker’s meaning, the epistemological question—of what entitles or justifies belief—remains open. For epistemological purposes, many details of the actual nature of the communicational mechanism can be abstracted from.

Burge’s argument reaches beyond testimony. If the intelligibility of the speaker’s contribution is not dependent on the specifics of the comprehension process—if the a priori entitlement resides in the speaker’s reason–then the entitlement is applicable not only to learning of other’s beliefs (Moran 2005) but also to acquiring beliefs. But beliefs purport to respond to reason.

Even if the scope of Burge’s argument goes as far as just proposed, the entitlement it confers requires “empirical supplementation” to meet counter-considerations. (Burge 1997, 23) Without empirical supplementation, normally highly implausible possibilities of error count as undermining reasons. A stranger provides me with driving directions. But he speaks with the same accent as another stranger who recently gave me false directions. Without bringing in additional empirical information, I am not in a position to exclude viewing the current informant as suspect because of his affinities with the previous one. I thereby impugn individuals as speakers for their membership in a group that share an accent (see further section 8.1 on “silencing”). The flimsy evidence is, though, enough to override my entitlement. However, against the background of common knowledge, this flimsy evidence—the very weak correlation between accents and reliability or veracity—is easily outweighed.

Burge’s argument begins with a contrast between justification and entitlement. Justification calls for the articulation of one’s reasons. This demanding notion of justification explains why Burge thinks that the positive-bias or default proposal can be defended only on a priori grounds. Presumably, Burge takes us not to have access to background knowledge of empirical reliability, since we can not generally articulate that knowledge in defense. But must the reductionist endorse the articulation and accessibility requirement? The reliability of testimony could be a central, but inaccessible or not readily accessible, belief that structures how we accept testimony without representation as a simple propositional belief (but see Bergmann 2006).

7.2 Self-Trust

Our cognitive or epistemic activities have (Reidian) presuppositions not only of trust in perception or memory, but of oneself (Lehrer 1997, 2006). From this presupposition of self-trust a parity or consistency argument can be developed to trust the word of others (Gibbard 1990; Foley 1994, 2001). For if we trust our own beliefs, as we do, we ought to trust the beliefs of others, since we extensively rely on others for our own opinions and

it is reasonable for me to think that my intellectual faculties and my intellectual environment are broadly similar to theirs. (Foley 1994, 63)

As stated, this argument contains a posteriori inputs, specifically in the “similarity” assumption, besides the safe assumption of our extensive dependence on the testimony of others for our own opinions.

The parity argument from self-trust also assumes a parallel grounding for our trust in ourselves and our trust in others. But when I trust my own beliefs and their sources, my trust is first-personally compelled. I cannot think “p, but maybe I should not trust myself or my sources in believing that p.” But there is no such compulsion from my point of view to regard the beliefs of someone else as rightly based. I can believe that you believe p, while I do not.

Proponents of the parity argument could respond by shifting emphasis to the conditions that verify that I do correctly trust myself, maintaining that they are just conditions for endorsement of the outputs of our cognitive mechanisms. The argument would now invoke the similarity of those mechanisms across the human community to reach its conclusion. (For critical examination of the parity argument, Schmitt 2002; for further issues of self-trust in relation to testimony, K. Jones 2002.)

7.3 Moral Groundings for the Epistemics of Testimony: The Assurance View

The “Assurance View” (Ross 1986; Moran 2005; see also Hinchman 2005; Faulkner 2007; for objections, see Lackey 2008; Schmitt 2010) claims that a speaker’s assertion is not evidence for what he believes or the truth of what he asserts. The hearer’s entitlement to belief resides in the speaker’s standing behind his word, giving his assurance.

If a speaker’s testimony is evidence of the truth of the belief expressed by his assertion, then if the hearer could get directly to that belief, there is no further epistemic force to testimony. On the Assurance View, there is: The speaker freely takes responsibility for the truth of his assertion. What is distinctive of testimony on the Assurance View is that

when the hearer believes the speaker, he not only believes what is said but does so on the basis of taking the speaker’s word for it. (Moran 2005, 2)

This normal situation is epistemically different from one in which the hearer does acquire the intended belief, however

the hearer might not believe the speaker at all, taking him to be a con man, but yet believe that what he has said is in fact true. (Moran 2005, 2)

Some hold that the requisite assurance is sufficiently binding that the speaker’s assertion to a hearer, under standard conditions, amounts to the speaker’s giving his word to the hearer (Thomson 1990; Elgin 2001; for comparisons of promising and asserting, Watson 2004). To trust a speaker is to dismiss (within limits) counter-evidence to what he asserts. (Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1993). If I believe that the #2 train stops at Eastern Parkway, but I trust a stranger who tells me that it does not, then I suspend judgment on my prior, contrary belief and typically come to his.

The Assurance View draws on Grice’s (1989) distinction between natural and non-natural meaning. A photograph of a man and a woman together is evidence for their meeting, regardless of the intentions of the photographer or the presenter of the photograph. By contrast, a drawing of the two persons in a similar scene has the non-natural meaning of their illicit meeting, dependent on the intentions of the artists. This non-natural meaning is what a speaker’s communicative intentions confer on his assertion. The speaker cannot first-personally view his assertion merely as evidence for its truth. He must take his assertion as up to him (voluntary) and as expressing his belief, rather than serving as an indicator of the existence of a state of affairs, which is its truth condition. On the Assurance View, what gives the speaker’s intention as the reason to believe his words “independent epistemic value”

can only be…the speaker’s there and then explicitly presenting his utterance as a reason to believe, with this presentation being accomplished in the very act of assertion. The epistemic value of his words is something publicly conferred on them by the speaker, by presenting his utterance as an assertion… (Moran 2005, 15)

On the Assurance View, the speaker constitutes his utterance as a reason for belief, whereas when presenting evidence, its epistemic import is independent of the presenter.

Because the speaker stands behind his words and invites the hearer to understand him, the hearer is entitled to hold the speaker to his words. Someone who overhears a conversation cannot complain should the speaker’s assertion turn out false (see Hinchman’s 2005 distinction between telling and asserting.) Does—can—this moral difference make an epistemic difference? The overhearer has no such social-ethical duty to the speaker, and the speaker feels no ethical obligation of veracity toward the overhearer. Yet the overhearer has, it would seem, the same evidence as the hearer.

Drawing on Moran (2005) and related works, anti-reductionists have emphasized that testimony is second-hand knowledge in the following way: a hearer can defer to the speaker when the hearer passes on the speaker’s testimony to another, and the hearer challenges it. For example, Joe tells Mary that Bill and Jane are divorcing. Mary tells this to Fred. If Fred questions (challenges) Mary’s testimony, Mary can defer or deflect Fred’s challenge: “Well, I’m sorry, but that’s what Joe told me.” Joe will accept this “buck-passing” as appropriate to his responsibility. Anti-reductionists take this feature as showing that the epistemology of testimony is dependent on social relations and the conferring of epistemic authority on speakers. For if Joe cannot meet Fred’s challenge to Mary, Mary loses her justification for asserting that Bill and Jane are divorcing (see Hinchman 2005; Goldberg 2006; McMyler 2007).

Normally, a speaker bears a ‘buck stops here’ responsibility for mistaken testimony. An analogous contrast holds for arguments. If Alex tells Jane that tonight there will be a snow storm and Jane passes on to another that school will be closed tomorrow because the storm will require a snow day, she cannot defer a challenge to how she knows that the school is closed back to Alex. She can, of course, defer to Alex for her belief that tomorrow will be a snow day. But she cannot defer to Alex for her argument that the storm will require a snow day. For she has accepted Joe’s testimony (or evidence) and made it into her own reason to draw out the conclusion.

Deferment to the original testifier can then be offered as a problem for reductionism. Were testimonial transmission inferential, the deferment to the original speaker is ruled out. Only the hearer who draws the inference, given the evidence of testimony, is responsible to meet the challenge. But this conclusion is in conflict with the permissible ‘buck-passing’ when testimony serves as the basis for further testimony.

But why does Mary’s deferment to Joe preempt her responsibility? After all, even though Mary accepts Joe’s word according to conversational norms, she in turns provides the guarantee or assurance for the truth of her assertion to Fred. So while Mary rightly defers to Joe to meet Fred’s challenge (since, specifically, she does not yet have Joe’s reasons), the deferment cannot eliminate Mary’s responsibility. Again, this is evident when the hearer discovers or suspects that the assertion is false.

8. Further Moral and Social Issues of the Epistemology of Testimony

8.1 Epistemic Justice: “Silencing”, Prejudice and Virtue Theory

The Assurance View is only one entrance point for illuminating overlaps between the ethics and the epistemology of testimony. The dependence of successful testimonial transfer on the hearer’s trust is another. Trust implies vulnerability, positive expectations of good will, and, arguably, empathy (Baier 1994; Jones 1996; Faulkner 2007). These discussions, and in less direct ways those for the Assurance View, pose a difficult question: How can, or how does, this vulnerability (to insincerity, specifically), dependence on good will, and empathy constitute part of the hearer’s reason to accept the testimony of the speaker?

Hearers’ trust and positive bias toward speakers highlight by sharp contrast cases in which hearers are guilty of silencing speakers. Hearers silence speakers when they do not accord them the standard authority to have their assertions taken as truth-claims without cause. The topic is explored by Miranda Fricker (2007) as a form of epistemic injustice. (Pragmatic arguments have been offered for pornography as silencing women. For different pragmatic approaches see Langton 1993; McGowan 2003; Saul 2006. For an overview, Hornsby 2000. For silencing in regard to testimony from memory (“false memory”), see Campbell 2003.)

According to Fricker, we do someone an epistemic injustice when we do not accord his or her testimony the level of trust it is due, especially because of prejudice. One of Fricker’s examples is of Tom Robinson, the central character in To Kill a Mockingbird, on trial for his life. Because he is a ‘Negro’ in this early 20th century viscerally racist southern town, his honest testimony is rejected, unlike the manifestly not credible testimony of the prosecution’s local, white witnesses. Fricker argues that epistemic injustice is rooted in culpable prejudice, given the evidence available to citizens. Fricker provides other examples, particularly one from the book and movie “The Talented Mr. Ripley,” to draw out differences in degrees of culpability.

Silencing in its myriad forms is a serious epistemic injustice. Silencing of citizens, particularly as members of a minority group, threatens their autonomy. It threatens pluralist democratic values, which depend on individuals being afforded opportunities to express and defend their views in public forums, and to have those views heard respectfully (Habermas 1996, Rawls 1996).

An informal way to appreciate how serious the injustice is is to think of how resentful and offended you would be in ordinary gatherings, if your contribution to the on-going discussion is rudely interrupted or ignored. The ordinary entitlement to have one’s words heard and responded to is fundamental to human learning, respect, enjoyment, and engagement with others.

In legal testimony, worries over a kind of prejudicial, but largely non-conscious, silencing of a defendant is the ground for a forceful, and disputed, rule that restricts information (Goldman 1991). Character evidence about a witness suffers few restrictions. Jurors need to know how trustworthy and reliable witnesses are. But when it comes to defendants, courts are circumspect about admitting character evidence. In civil trials, it is generally inadmissible, and in criminal trials it is freely introduced only by defendants. Nevertheless, there is probabilistic relevance. In discussing the legal rules of evidence (Rule, 404) about character, Walton reports:

Character evidence of this kind [a defendant’s prior assaults in relation to his current trial], like evidence of previous convictions, is known to exert such influence on a jury that the lawyers for both sides will argue strenuously about whether it should be judged relevant even in the pretrial stages. (2004, 19)

The probative value of character evidence is easily overridden by its potential influence on the jury (Walton 1997, 20–21). While the exclusion as a rule depends on practical and legal considerations, there is a theoretical and empirical justification for it as well. We are subject to non-conscious prejudices or biases on our judgments of speaker credibility that we will not recognize, accept, or endorse. (Non-conscious prejudices or biases are the subject of extensive research. See, for example, Wilson 2002; Gendler 2008.)

How should silencing due to prejudice, as a form of testimonial injustice, be conceptualized for epistemological purposes? What lessons should be learned? Prejudice resists modification with available, clear, contrary information or evidence.

Fricker (2007) develops a virtue epistemic perspective on the model of Aristotelian virtue ethics (Zagzebski 1996). The epistemically virtuous agent perceives or discerns which speakers are credible typically without special effort. The agent overcomes prejudices, being motivated to judge correctly by an interest in good information. (There are complexities of Fricker’s account: she is a contextualist about testimonial justice, she takes the moral perception of the virtuous agent to be theory-laden, and she views the virtue of testimonial justice to be both intellectual and ethical—a hybrid virtue that aims at once at truth and justice.)

However, does epistemic virtue theory provide the best model for the ordinary epistemic agent in conversational exchanges across a variety of inquiries? One contrast is with Peircean models of inquiry. The Peircean model requires that participation in inquiry be open, among other conditions (e.g., competition). In the ideal case, there are internal incentives against silencing; modest prejudices or biases tend to cancel out. Self-correction replaces strong demands for the development of virtuous character traits (beyond some minimum). Not only is there less of a burden on participation than on Aristotelian approaches, but individual differences in these traits, like a tendency to be dogmatic, will likely be better at preserving a diversity of ideas, particularly minority or disfavored ideas (Mill 1978 [1859]; for development, Kitcher 2001; Sunstein 2003. On good biases, Antony 1993).

8.2 Testimony as Favoring a Social Epistemology

Reductionists are held to be in the grip of an individualism which maintains that testimony is an inferior source of knowledge because the hearer believes the speaker’s assertion without the hearer’s own autonomous judgment of its truth. Clearly, knowledge that derives purely from testimony cannot meet the (Platonic) requirement that a person knows that p only if that person can explain why p is the case. I can know from testimony that Bill despises Jim without knowing why Bill despises Jim. My knowledge that Bill despises Jim will then not be as stable. But if I have an explanation of why Bill despises Jim, because, say, of Jim’s role in denying Bill tenure, I will be suspicious of testimony that Bill and Jim are very friendly.

Critics of reductionism identify it with an individualistic epistemology for maintaining that testimonial knowledge depends epistemically only upon non-social sources, rather than being an autonomous epistemic source of knowledge. Were reductionism to restrict basic sources for testimonial inference and transition to only non-social sources, reductionists would fail a ‘litmus’ test for an adequate epistemology (Schmitt 1994a, 4).

The alleged neglect of testimony in epistemology generally has been taken as the result of the dominant influence of epistemologies that are not just individualistic, which neglect ethical and social dimensions of inquiry like trust (Hardwig 1985, 1991; Welbourne 1981, 1993; Schmitt 1987, 1994a; Baier 1993; Webb 1993; Goldman 1999; K. Jones 1999, 2002; Fricker 2006; Faulkner 2000; Kusch 2002. For Kant’s contribution, Gelfert 2006, 2010b; see the entry on social epistemology). One hypothesis to explain the neglect within the main epistemological traditions is just that testimony will at best transmit knowledge, rather than playing a role in its discovery or generation, a hypothesis denied by anti-reductionists and others (Lipton 1998; Kusch 2002; Lackey 2008).

A strong view among social epistemologists is that an individual cannot be said to know, via testimony, that p, unless p is known in the community (Welbourne 1993; Brandom 1994; Faulkner 2002). In contrast, an apparent individualist tradition broached in Plato’s Theaetetus is that the ideal for knowledge is that of the autonomous knower judging the truth for himself without dependence on others. The dependence on others, unlike the dependence on perception, filters one’s information through another interpretive mind with its own biases and fallibility.

In a section of the Theaetetus arguing that true judgment and knowledge are different, Socrates hypothesizes that

a jury has been justly persuaded of some matter which only an eye-witness could know, and which cannot otherwise be known; suppose they come to their decision upon hearsay, forming a true judgment: then they have decided the case without knowledge, but, granted they did their job well, being correctly persuaded? (Plato 1992, 201b–c)

More pointedly, Locke:

we may as rationally hope to see with other men’s eyes as to know by other men’s understanding…The floating of other men’s opinions in our brains makes us not one jot the more knowing, though they happen to be true. What in them was science is in us but opiniatrety. (Locke 1961 [1689], 58)

Although these quotes capture the worry of something epistemically inferior about learning of an event second-hand, the epistemologies that Plato and Locke are working with do not align with contemporary views, e.g., assuming that the hearer is more epistemically high-minded than the casual speaker in the contrast of belief (or opinion) and knowledge. In the Theaetetus there are suggestions that the testifiers are “orators and lawyers” who are skilled at persuasion, rather than ordinary cases of transmitting information by a stranger like the Meno, a case of a guide telling you the road to Larissa (Plato 2002, 97a–c). The passage from the Theaetetus also involves tight time demands in informing others about complex matters (201a–b). Similarly, there are passages that indicate that Locke’s disfavor with the value of testimony was limited to judgements outside secure and pedestrian domains (e.g., Locke 1961 [1689], Bk 4 ch.16 sec8–9). For Kant, moral principles are not properly learned through testimony, thereby reconciling Kant’s view of learning from testimony with his demand that moral principles be autonomously endorsed (Gelfert 2006). (For historical background on testimony generally, Coady 1992, part II; Kennedy 2004.)

An epistemic agent whose beliefs do not depend upon testimonial transmission knows very little. The individualism-autonomy ideal only appears plausible if we ignore our limitations and our need to economize. If we do not ignore these, autonomy will appear irrational for accepting a huge loss of information, ignoring how we exploit a division of epistemic labor (Putnam 1975; Kitcher 1993). We usefully divide roles in the kind of information we acquire and so can transmit, e.g., about world events, the weather, sports scores, which no one, nor any small group of us, could achieve on his or her own. Our reliance on the division of epistemic labor extends not just to the pronouncements of others better positioned, but to their reasons or evidence. Owens (2000) offers the provocative thesis that when a speaker transmits the knowledge that p to a hearer, the hearer may be held to have borrowed the speaker’s reasons for p, without necessarily knowing their content.

The worries over autonomy are forceful in cases in which there is reason not to fully trust the judgments of others. In a wide range of ordinary cases, however, it is evident that others, either singly or as a group, are bound to be more reliable than oneself and to report accurately. Consequently, it would be self-defeating to ignore, or to unfeasibly try to regularly check upon, their transmissions.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Certain Doubts: a blog devoted to matters epistemic and administered by Jonathan L. Kvanvig, University of Baylor.


I am grateful for comments from Claudio de Almeida, John Greco, Peter Graham, Arnon Keren, Jennifer Lackey, David Owens, Michael Rescorla, a referee, readers, and especially Catherine Z. Elgin.

Editor’s Note: The August 2012 update was completed by Jonathan Adler before he passed away.

Copyright © 2012 by
Jonathan Adler

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