Supervenience in Ethics

First published Wed Oct 7, 2015

We sometimes think about the ethical significance of merely possible circumstances. People sometimes wonder, for example, if it would have been wrong to break certain promises that they in fact kept. Examples like this do not exhaust the significance of possibility—or modality more generally—in our ethical thinking. Rather, we also seem to be committed to a certain modal structure in our ethical commitments. To see this, consider an example. Suppose that a bank manager wrongfully embezzles his client’s money. If we imagine holding fixed how much the bank manager stole, and how; the trust his customers placed in him; what he did with the money; all of the short- and long-term consequences of his actions; and so on, it seems that there could not be a second action that perfectly resembled this embezzlement, except that the second action was right rather than wrong. Cases like this one seem to show a necessary connection: they suggest that the ethical character of the bank manager’s act cannot vary without some other facts varying as well.

While the embezzling bank manager example concerns a specific necessary connection, many philosophers also find it plausible that there are general necessary connections between ethical properties and certain other properties. For example, many philosophers have been inclined to accept:

There can be no ethical difference between two possible states of affairs or actions without there being some natural difference between them.

Following R. M. Hare (1952), claims of such general necessary connection are called ethical supervenience theses. Such theses have played a key role in arguments for and against a variety of influential views about ethics. This entry aims to introduce the idea of ethical supervenience and its philosophical significance. The entry considers ways of making more precise the claim that the ethical supervenes, and what case can be made for the supervenience of the ethical. It then considers arguments that use ethical supervenience as a premise, and doubts that ethical supervenience has the sort of significance suggested by these arguments.

1. Theorizing Ethical Supervenience

Many philosophers hope to make significant arguments about ethics using ethical supervenience as a premise. However, there are many distinct ethical supervenience theses that philosophers might be interested in. Understanding the differences between these theses can help to clarify which of them deserve our allegiance. It is also important because different supervenience theses will support quite different arguments about ethics.

To begin, it is worth briefly characterizing certain core features of supervenience relations, as they are now standardly understood in metaphysics (see, e.g., the entry on supervenience). Supervenience relations are typically understood as relations between pairs of classes of properties. Consider the claim that a certain class of properties—the A-properties—cannot vary without the B-properties also varying. In this claim, we can call the A-properties the supervening properties, and the B-properties the subvening or base properties.

Supervenience relations are covariance relations that have three logical features: they are reflexive, transitive, and non-symmetric. The claim that supervenience is reflexive means that every set of properties supervenes on itself: for any class of properties A, there can be no difference in the A-properties without a difference in the A-properties. The claim that supervenience is transitive means that: if the A-properties supervene on the B-properties, and the B-properties supervene on the C-properties, then the A-properties supervene on the C-properties. The claim that supervenience is non-symmetric means that supervenience is compatible with either symmetry (A supervenes on B and B supervenes on A; as in the case of the ethical and itself) or asymmetry (A supervenes on B but B does not supervene on A; as may be the case between the biological and the microphysical).

These claims reflect how use of the term ‘supervenience’ has come to be usefully regimented in contemporary metaphysics. It is worth emphasizing this point, because there is a significant history of “supervenience” being used in ways that depart from this contemporary orthodoxy. For example, for a time it was quite common both in metaphysics and in ethics for supervenience to be assumed to be (or to be used as a proxy for) an asymmetrical dependence relation. Such uses of ‘supervenience’ are inconsistent with the contemporary regimentation. This is a point about terminological clarity, not a substantive barrier to discussing such asymmetric relations. It is no barrier to characterizing other relations that ensure asymmetry or explanatory power, if doing so is of interest. For example, one could name the asymmetric relation that holds when A supervenes on B but B does not supervene on A. Or one could name the relation that holds when the supervenience of A on B is accompanied by an adequate explanation. One influential variant of this explanatory relation has been dubbed ‘superdupervenience’ (Horgan 1993, 566). More recently, many philosophers have suggested that a certain asymmetric dependence relation—grounding—is of central importance to our metaphysical theorizing. (For discussion, see the entry on metaphysical grounding.)

Given the standard contemporary regimentation, however, supervenience claims state a certain pattern of covariation between classes of properties, they do not purport to explain that pattern, as a grounding or superdupervenience thesis would (compare DePaul 1987). This point is crucial to several arguments from ethical supervenience, as we will see below.

These clarifying remarks put us in a position to introduce four central questions that can be used to develop alternative supervenience theses:

  • How can we best characterize which properties the ethical properties supervene on?
  • Should we characterize the supervenience of the ethical in terms of facts about individuals, or about whole possible worlds?
  • What is the modal strength of the supervenience relation? Does it hold only across worlds with the same laws of nature as ours, or across all metaphysically, conceptually, or ‘normatively’ possible worlds?
  • Thus far I have introduced ethical supervenience as a thesis about what there is; is it better stated as a commitment concerning combinations of our ethical attitudes?

The next four subsections consider these questions in turn. Before turning to these questions, it is worth briefly highlighting a different issue: which class of supervening properties to focus on? A survey of the literature provides a variety of suggestions: relevant supervening properties are characterized as ethical, moral, evaluative, or normative. Both the nature of each of these categories, and the relationship between them, are controversial. For example, some philosophers will question the normative authority of morality, while others will think of normativity as a very broad tent, including any rule- or convention-governed activity, such as chess or etiquette. This entry will not explore these interesting issues. Instead, it will provisionally assume that the significance of supervenience is similar for each of these classes of properties. For the sake of uniformity, the entry will focus on ethical properties throughout.

1.1 What does the ethical supervene on?

Somewhat surprisingly, the idea of ethical supervenience can be made to seem plausible despite the fact that it is difficult to provide a characterization of what the ethical supervenes on that is at once uncontroversial and theoretically interesting (see Section 5.4 for further discussion of this point). This section briefly sketches the options for characterizing what the ethical supervenes on, and some difficulties that these options face.

The thesis used to introduce supervenience above—Initial—suggested that the ethical supervenes on the natural properties. This is the most common way of characterizing ethical supervenience in the literature. However, there are at least two difficulties with this idea. The first difficulty is ambiguity: the term ‘natural’ has been characterized in wildly varying terms in metaethics (see the introductory section of the entry on moral non-naturalism for a brief survey of characterizations of the natural; see McPherson 2015, §3–4 for one constructive proposal). The second difficulty is that on many conceptions of the natural there will be counterexamples to Initial. For example, many philosophers want to contrast natural properties with supernatural properties. Even if we assume that there are no actually instantiated supernatural properties, we might allow that such entities are possible. But this might in turn seem to suggest that two possible states of affairs could be naturalistically identical, but ethically different. For example, they might be different because of ethically significant interactions between supernatural beings (Klagge 1984, 374–5; for some complications see McPherson 2015, 134–5).

This sort of worry might lead one to reject the common assumption that the ethical supervenes on the natural as misguided; instead, one might propose that the ethical supervenes on the non-ethical. This might seem promising: the point of the embezzling bank manager case might seem to be that there would need to be some non-ethical difference between cases—natural or not—in order for there to be an ethical difference in the bank manager’s actions. However, there is an important worry about this way of characterizing the supervenience base (compare Sturgeon 2009, 70–72), which can be brought out briefly by example. Some philosophers are sympathetic to ambitious reductive hypotheses about ethics. On one such example, the ethical property of goodness is just identical to the property of pleasantness. Because identicals have all of the same properties, this would entail that pleasantness is an ethical property. Some philosophers also think that certain experiential or ‘qualitative’ properties, such as pleasantness, are metaphysically fundamental, such that two possible circumstances could differ only in how much pleasantness they contained. Together, the points entail the conclusion that two worlds could differ from each other solely in an ethical respect: how much goodness/pleasantness they include. This is inconsistent with the supervenience of the ethical on the non-ethical, but it is not clear that we should be prepared to dismiss out of hand the assumptions that generate this conclusion. This might in turn lead us to think that there can at least be reasonable controversy concerning the supervenience of the ethical on the non-ethical.

One can avoid this problem by proposing that the ethical supervenes on the distribution of all of the properties. But this formulation purchases plausibility at the price of triviality. Ethical differences are differences, so there can obviously be no ethical difference without some difference. In light of its triviality, this sort of supervenience thesis fails to identify anything in ethical supervenience that is of philosophical interest.

An influential alternative way of characterizing what the ethical supervenes on begins with a distinction in language. Some philosophers think that we can intuitively distinguish evaluative predicates (like ‘is right’, ‘is good’, ‘is virtuous’, etc.) from descriptive predicates (like ‘is round’, ‘is accelerating’, ‘is a badger’ etc.). We can then ask about the relationship between the properties that are picked out by these two sets of predicates. Frank Jackson has argued that this allows us to state an ethical supervenience thesis: there is no possible difference that can be stated using evaluative predicates between states that are identical with respect to all properties picked out by descriptive predicates (1998, 118–125).

Jackson’s proposal seemingly avoids triviality, because evaluative and descriptive predicates appear to be distinct. However, the detour through language faces significant challenges. One challenge concerns the expressive power of a language like ours: if it is limited, then there seemingly might be ethical differences between states of affairs that are not correlated with descriptive differences expressible in a language like ours (for related worries, see Sturgeon 2009, 73–79). A second challenge questions whether the distinction between description and evaluation is characteristically a distinction in the semantic properties of various of our predicates, as Jackson assumes. On one contrasting view, evaluation might instead characteristically be a pragmatic property of whole speech acts (see Sundell, ms. for discussion).

In the face of these difficulties, some philosophers have sought to develop accounts of the base property that are substantive enough for ethical supervenience to do dialectical work, but avoid some of the difficulties just sketched. For example, it has been proposed that the ethical supervenes on the non-ethical or descriptive (Ridge 2007). And, in the context of discussing arguments concerning supervenience and non-naturalism, it has been proposed that the ethical supervenes on the set of properties that are not ethical properties as those are understood by the non-naturalist (McPherson 2012).

As this brief survey makes clear, it is not yet entirely clear how to characterize what the ethical supervenes on, in a way that makes the ethical supervenience thesis both plausible and theoretically interesting. Now that the difficulties here have been made clear (especially by Sturgeon 2009), this is an important potential locus for future research. The following discussion largely sets aside these debates, speaking of the supervenience of the ethical properties on the ‘base’ properties, as a placeholder for a satisfactory account of those base properties.

1.2 The structure of ethical supervenience

There are many possible structures of covariation that have been called supervenience theses in the metaphysics literature. For our purposes, it will be convenient to distinguish four of the most influential formulations. (The literature on supervenience contains several other variations; see the entry on supervenience for an excellent introduction, from which this entry adopts some of the formulations below. That entry also has very helpful discussion of the contrast between supervenience and certain other metaphysical relations with which it is often associated. The contrast between supervenience and the closely-related notion of entailment, discussed in section 3.2 of the entry on , is especially germane to the topic of this subsection.)

One important structural distinction concerns whether a thesis concerns the properties of individuals (individual supervenience theses), or is cast in terms of the character of whole possible worlds (global supervenience theses). The ethical properties globally supervene on the base properties just in case:

For any [possible] worlds w1 and w2, if w1 and w2 have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of base properties, then they have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of ethical properties (cf. the entry on supervenience).

Individual supervenience theses are so-called because they explicitly state patterns of instantiation of properties by individuals (rather than across whole possible worlds). Individual supervenience theses are distinguished depending on whether the covariation they claim is localized within a single possible world (weak individual supervenience theses), or extends across a set of possible worlds (strong individual supervenience theses). The ethical properties weakly supervene on the base properties just in case:

Necessarily, if anything x has some ethical property F, then there is at least one base property G such that x has G, and everything that has G has F (cf. the entry on supervenience).

The ethical properties strongly supervene on the base properties just in case:

Necessarily, if anything x has some ethical property F, then there is at least one base property G such x has G, and necessarily everything that has G has F (cf. the entry on supervenience).

It is generally agreed that strong supervenience entails global supervenience and weak supervenience; there is considerable controversy about whether global supervenience entails strong supervenience (see §4.3 of the entry on supervenience).

The crucial difference between Strong and Weak supervenience is the second necessity operator in Strong: in a slogan, weak supervenience requires covariation between certain pairs of properties only within possible worlds, while strong supervenience requires covariation between specific pairs of properties across all possible worlds. To make the difference here vivid: weak ethical supervenience is compatible with it being a brute fact that rightness covaries with happiness maximization in one possible world, with satisfying the categorical imperative in another, and with exemplifying virtue in a third. By contrast, strong supervenience states that there is some base property that covaries with rightness in every possible world.

Consider another important individual ethical supervenience relation, inspired by Brian McLaughlin (1995, 24) but stated less technically:

Strong Intuitive.
If two possible entities are alike in all base respects, they are alike in all ethical respects.

If we interpret ‘possible’ here as representing metaphysical modality, both McLaughlin and Jaegwon Kim (1993, 81) note that the Strong and Strong Intuitive supervenience relations are equivalent. However, Section 2 below will show that if we reinterpret the modalities involved, these theses will no longer be equivalent.

1.3 The modal strength of ethical supervenience

So far this entry has talked freely of necessity, possibility, and possible worlds. However, one can use such talk to discuss importantly different modal standards: for example, philosophers talk of logical necessity, conceptual necessity, metaphysical necessity, nomic necessity, and normative necessity. The aim of this section is to briefly orient readers to the general ideas associated with each of these notions. To begin, consider some examples:

  1. All bachelors are bachelors
  2. All bachelors are unmarried
  3. Nothing can travel faster than light
  4. Atoms of gold contain 79 protons
  5. Pain is bad

On one traditional gloss, a sentence is logically necessary if it would remain true given any uniform and grammatically legitimate reinterpretation of the non-logical expressions of that sentence. Sentence (1) is a promising example: the only non-logical word in (1) is ‘bachelor’, and any uniform and grammatically appropriate interpretation of ‘bachelor’ in (1) will result in a true sentence. (For more on logical truths, see the entry on logical truth. Section 1.1 of that entry discusses the alleged modal force of logical truths.)

By contrast, (2) is not a logical truth: one could easily hold fixed its logical structure, but vary the meaning of ‘bachelor’ or ‘unmarried’ and thereby produce a grammatical but false sentence. However, (2) is a promising candidate to be conceptually necessary. On one gloss, a sentence is conceptually necessary (or ‘analytically true’) if it is true solely in virtue of the meanings or concepts involved in the sentence. Sentence (2) is a traditional example. If ‘bachelor’ means unmarried male, then the meaning of the sentence suffices to explain why it is true. (The notion of analyticity is famously controversial; for discussion, see the entry on analytic-synthetic distinction.)

Two notes are relevant here. First, some philosophers will talk of ‘logical’ necessity or supervenience as a way of discussing what this entry is calling conceptual necessity or supervenience. Here, as elsewhere, it is important to keep track of what exactly an author intends to express by their terms. Second, some proponents of analytic truth will nonetheless reject the idea of a distinct conceptual modality (e.g. Jackson 1998, Ch. 3). Such philosophers can, however, capture importantly related phenomena by discussing modal claims formulated in terms of sentences and their intensions.

Next consider (3): this does not seem to be true simply because of the concepts it expresses. Rather, if it is true, it seems to reflect an important law of nature: a deep and non-accidental pattern in our universe. Some philosophers think that such laws underwrite a distinctive sort of modality: a proposition is nomically necessary just in case its falsity is incompatible with the laws of nature. On this view, (3) is nomically necessarily true, because it follows from the laws governing the speed of light.

Now consider (4). It is commonly thought that (4) is necessarily true, for example: a substance composed overwhelmingly of atoms that do not contain 79 protons in their nuclei just is not gold. But (4) does not on its face look like a conceptual truth: it was a substantive discovery that there were protons at all, let alone how many protons an atom of gold characteristically possesses. Further (4) does not seem like it reflects a law of nature in the way that (3) does: rather, (4) seems to follow immediately from facts about what it is to be gold. Examples like (4) thus purport to give us an initial grasp on metaphysical modality as distinct from the other modalities considered thus far.

Still more controversial is the notion of normative necessity. One way of understanding this idea appeals to an analogy with nomic modality. We can think of nomically necessary facts as those which follow from facts about the laws of nature. For example, the nomic impossibility of something traveling faster than light is a direct consequence of it being a law of nature that that nothing can travel faster than light. Someone might similarly claim that there are fundamental normative laws or principles. Suppose that (5) stated one of those laws. Then the normative impossibility of a state’s being good just because it is painful could be understood as expressing a consequence of that underlying normative law.

There is enormous controversy about each of these alleged varieties of modality. For each of logical, conceptual, nomic, metaphysical and normative flavors of modality, some philosophers have raised important challenges to whether that flavor of modality is well-regimented, theoretically useful, or genuinely distinct from others on the list. This entry will not enter seriously into those debates. (For discussion of some of the issues, see the entry on varieties of modality.) If we instead provisionally assume that each of these notions is legitimate, this will put us in a position to ask (in Section 2, below): what is the modal strength of the supervenience thesis that we should accept?

1.4 Ontological and ascriptive supervenience

The ethical supervenience theses discussed thus far are ontological: they propose various covariance relationships between ethical properties and certain other properties. However, James Klagge (1988) introduced a helpful way of expanding our understanding of ethical supervenience. Call two circumstances that a thinker believes to be identical in all base respects base-identical. Now consider the following claim:

Anyone who treats base-identical circumstances as ethically different from each other thereby makes a mistake.

Unlike the supervenience theses encountered so far, Ascriptive is fundamentally a claim about ethical judgments: it is a claim that someone who makes a certain pair of ethical judgments thereby makes a mistake. Klagge usefully dubs claims like this ascriptive supervenience theses.

A fully informative ascriptive supervenience thesis would explain how we should understand the mistake claimed by Ascriptive. There are several possibilities, of which four are worth emphasizing. The claimed mistake could be alethic, consisting in having made at least one judgment with a false content. Or it might be epistemic: consisting in making at least one epistemically unjustified judgment. It could be conceptual, consisting in judging in a way that is inconsistent with the meanings of ethical words. Finally, it might be characterized as ethical, consisting in making a judgment in a way that is vicious or ethically objectionable.

Because ascriptive supervenience theses are about judgments rather than relations between classes of properties, they are quite different from the ontological supervenience theses we have considered thus far. One way to bring this out is to notice that one could potentially accept Ascriptive without thereby having any views about whether there are ethical properties. On the other hand, there are interesting connections between certain ascriptive and ontological supervenience theses. For example, anyone who accepts Strong Intuitive seems to be committed to a version of Ascriptive, with an alethic gloss on ‘mistake’.

1.5 Summing up: Options for understanding ethical supervenience

This entry began with the suggestion that it is plausible that the ethical supervenes. This section has aimed to clarify some of our options for understanding that idea. Section 1.1 introduced some competing approaches to characterizing what the ethical supervenes on (the natural, the descriptive, etc.). Section 1.2 introduced a variety of ways of modeling the structure of ethical supervenience (such as weak, strong, and global). Section 1.3 considered different interpretations of the modal strength of the supervenience relation (metaphysical, conceptual, normative etc.). Finally, Section 1.4 distinguished the ontological understanding of supervenience from an ascriptive thesis about ethical judgments. A supervenience thesis can be made more precise along each of these dimensions, and together the options discussed in this section constitute a dizzying space of possible ethical supervenience theses. This in turn raises a pressing question: which of these theses (if any) best articulate the plausibility and significance that philosophers have often taken ethical supervenience to have? That is the topic of the next section.

2. Arguments for Ethical Supervenience

It is common for philosophers to endorse ethical supervenience without much argument (an important exception is Smith 2004). Part of the reason for this is that ethical supervenience is taken to be both obvious and uncontroversial. The discussion just completed, however, suggests reason to worry about this approach: there is not one ethical supervenience thesis but instead a complex variety of such theses. It is far from clear that we should accept all of these theses, and a substantive question how to assess each of them. This section sketches a general strategy for arguing for ethical supervenience. It begins by setting out a case for the general idea of ethical supervenience, exemplified by a thesis like Initial (introduced at the beginning of this entry). It then explains how that strategy can be extended to address the controversies introduced in the previous section.

The general strategy has two elements. The first element begins by pointing to our initial case of the embezzling bank manager. This case provides us with a specific ethical supervenience thesis: it suggests that the ethical quality of the manager’s action cannot vary without something else varying as well (compare Horgan and Timmons 1992, 226 on specific supervenience facts). The next step of the strategy is to notice that there is nothing special in this respect about the bank manager case: we can construct parallel cases about anything from genocide to insulting your neighbor’s hat. Each such case we consider posits an interesting necessary connection involving ethical properties and some base properties. It is theoretically unattractive to rest satisfied with a long list of such necessary connections. Instead, we should look for a single thesis that unifies all of these specific theses into a single pattern. This pattern can be captured by a general ethical supervenience thesis such as Initial (compare McPherson 2012, 211).

The second element of the general strategy emphasizes the independent credibility of such a general supervenience thesis. This element takes inspiration from a comment by Henry Sidgwick:

In the variety of coexistent physical facts we find an accidental or arbitrary element in which we have to acquiesce…. But within the range of our cognitions of right and wrong, it will be generally agreed that we cannot admit a similar unexplained variation. (1907, 209)

It is plausible to interpret Sidgwick as suggesting that although we seek explanatory power when we develop our account of the physical world, we need to be prepared to admit brute contingency: the possibility that our best theories or explanations include claims like “and these just happened to be the initial conditions”, or (to be anachronistic) “it is a brute fact that the quantum wave function collapsed this way”. By contrast, we cannot admit the analogous idea that it is a brute contingent fact that an ethical property covaries with a certain base property. Because of their modal scope, general ethical supervenience theses such as Initial reflect this ban on brute ethical contingency (compare also Shafer-Landau 2003, 78; Smith 2004, 225).

The two parts of the strategy complement each other: The first part of the strategy defends general ethical supervenience on the basis of unification, which is a familiar and domain-general theoretical virtue. The second part of the strategy suggests that we have further reasons to accept such a general thesis that stem from a feature of our understanding of the ethical domain specifically.

While Initial is a general supervenience thesis, it is silent on many of the issues broached in Section 1. The next task is thus to extend the strategy just introduced to discuss those issues. Before doing so, it is important to emphasize that many of the options considered in Section 1 are compatible: for example, supervenience on the natural properties entails supervenience on all of the properties. Because of this, an argument for the former thesis is not an argument against the latter thesis. Because stronger ethical supervenience theses are potentially both more illuminating and more dialectically significant, this section will focus on examining competing cases concerning what the strongest well-supported ethical supervenience thesis is.

The general strategy just canvassed has two stages: the first stage carefully examines cases, and the second appeals to our more general understanding of the ethical. Consider how this strategy applies to the question of what the ethical supervenes on. Both parts of the strategy can be useful here. For example, Section 1.1 appealed to possible cases involving supernatural beings as part of an argument against the idea that the ethical supervenes on the natural. In terms of the first part of the strategy, this suggests that once we make salient the possibility of supernatural beings, specific supervenience theses that posit a naturalistic base become more doubtful. In terms of the second part of the strategy, the same cases fit nicely with the Sidgwickian thesis: if an ethical claim were true in part because of some supernatural truth, it would thereby not be brutely true. As noted in Section 1.1, characterizing what the ethical supervenes on is an open challenge. This merely illustrates how the strategy can be applied to make progress on that challenge.

The general strategy can also be applied to the structural question: for example, Section 1.2 noted that weak supervenience is compatible with the idea that a utilitarian ethical principle is a fundamental truth in some possible worlds, but is false in others. Strong ethical supervenience, by contrast, is incompatible with this idea. Many philosophers believe that the fundamental ethical principles could not vary contingently in this way, because this would again threaten to make the ethical truths brute. If correct, this supports the idea that ethical supervenience is a strong supervenience thesis. On the other hand, assessing whether ethical supervenience is strong or global (or both) might require adjudicating live metaphysical controversies concerning the relationship between strong and global supervenience (for discussion of these controversies, see section 4.3.1 of the entry on supervenience).

What about the modality of ethical supervenience? One might think of this question as seeking to clarify what sort of non-contingency the Sidgwickian commitment requires. If we distinguish logical from conceptual necessity, it is easy to see that the logical supervenience of the ethical is a non-starter. The truth of ‘pain is bad’, e.g., is not secured simply by the logical vocabulary and the syntax of the sentence, in the way that the truth of ‘all bachelors are bachelors’ seemingly is.

The most common view in the literature is that the supervenience of the ethical is a conceptual truth. Here we cannot simply adapt the general strategy used so far, since neither the cases nor the inference to the best explanation from those cases seems to settle the matter. Consider three reasons to think that ethical supervenience is a conceptual truth. First, to adapt R. M. Hare’s canonical example (1952, Sec. 5.2), if I mentioned to you that one possible act was right, and another wrong, despite these acts being exactly alike in all other respects, your initial reaction would be puzzlement, and if I persisted in my view upon interrogation, you might start to worry that I was simply confused or misusing words.

Second, the crucial cases used to support supervenience—like the embezzling banker case—seem to involve conceivability reasoning: we are asked to consider two circumstances that are identical in all base respects, and notice that we cannot make sense of the idea that they differ in ethical respects. Some philosophers find it natural to think that conceivability reasoning first and foremost reveals facts about conceptual possibility and necessity. This can be bolstered by a third (much more controversial) thought. Conceivability reasoning appears to be a priori. But if such reasoning fundamentally concerned the world rather than our concepts, then we would seemingly have a priori access to substantive facts about the world, which many philosophers have found deeply mysterious.

Several sorts of replies are available to these arguments. Consider three examples. First, it is controversial whether the sorts of puzzlement reactions identified by Hare must signal conceptual confusion or misuse (Kramer 2009, Harrison 2013). For example, perhaps we take ethical supervenience claims to be so obvious that when someone appears to deny them, we are inclined to treat conceptual confusion or difference as a charitable hypothesis. One potential piece of evidence for this is that when denial of ethical supervenience is based upon reasoned arguments, such as those mentioned in Section 5 below, a diagnosis of conceptual confusion or difference arguably become less plausible diagnosis.

Second, philosophers unafraid of the ‘synthetic a priori’ can reject the inference from conceivability reasoning to conceptual status. It is notable here that a great deal of work in contemporary metaphysics appeals to something like conceivability reasoning to argue directly for claims about the nature of reality. Third, the very notion of conceptual truth is hotly contested: many philosophers have become convinced that there is no notion of conceptual truth that is both coherent and philosophically interesting (for discussion, see the entry on the analytic-synthetic distinction).

Set aside these challenges for the moment, and consider how we should interpret the idea that ethical supervenience is a conceptual truth. We saw above that there is some support for thinking that ethical supervenience is a strong supervenience thesis. But combining this idea with the idea that the modality of supervenience is conceptual leads to complications. To see the issue, recall the schema for Strong Supervenience:

Necessarily, if anything x has some ethical property F, then there is at least one base property G such that x has G, and necessarily everything that has G has F.

If we interpret the claim that ethical supervenience is conceptual by replacing ‘Necessarily’ in the schema with ‘it is a conceptual truth that’. The result is:

Strong Conceptual.
It is a conceptual truth that if anything x has some ethical property F, then there is some base property G such that x has G, and it is a conceptual truth that everything that has G also has F.

One central problem with Strong Conceptual is that it claims that for every instantiated ethical property, there is a base property such that: it is a conceptual truth that anything that has this base property also has the ethical property. And this consequence will seem defensible only on certain very controversial views about ethics and conceptual analysis.

The implausibility of Strong Conceptual may explain why two of the most influential philosophers who discussed supervenience in ethics - R. M. Hare (1984, 4) and Simon Blackburn (cf. the ‘ban on mixed worlds in 1985, 134, and the contrast between ‘supervenience’ and ‘necessity’ in 1984, 183–4.)—seemed to accept something like weak but not strong conceptual supervenience of the ethical.

However, as noted above, it appears that we have reason to accept something stronger than weak ethical supervenience. It is thus worth considering alternatives that capture that strength without succumbing to the difficulties facing Strong Conceptual. One way to avoid the problem is to interpret the first necessity operator in Strong as conceptual, while leaving the second operator as metaphysical:

Strong Mixed.
It is a conceptual truth that if anything x has some ethical property F, then there is some base property G such that x has G, and it is metaphysically necessary thateverything that has G also has F (compare Dreier 1992, 15).

This avoids the implausible implications that Strong Conceptual has: Strong Mixed says only that it is a conceptual truth that a certain base property (we may not know which) covaries with each ethical property.

Note that Strong Mixed is only one possible mixed-modality supervenience thesis: one could reinterpret either necessity operator, to produce one of a wide variety of possible mixed ethical supervenience theses. For example, the second necessity operator could be interpreted as normative (rather than metaphysical) necessity. Such mixed modality theses have not yet been seriously explored.

Another option is to offer a conceptual version of the Strong Intuitive supervenience thesis mentioned in Section 1.2:

Intuitive Conceptual.
If two conceptually possible entities are alike in all base respects, they are alike in all ethical respects.

Because it does not posit known relations between specific ethical and base properties, Intuitive Conceptual does not face the difficulties of Strong Conceptual. Intuitive Conceptual also has an advantage over Strong Mixed: the latter commits one to both conceptual and metaphysical modality, both of which are controversial. Intuitive Conceptual is a plausible option for philosophers who take there to be a stronger alternative to weak ethical supervenience, but are not prepared to commit themselves to the notion of metaphysical modality.

Among philosophers who reject the idea that ethical supervenience is a conceptual truth, many will insist that the supervenience of the ethical is at least metaphysically necessary. Most such philosophers appear happy to accept the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical. Such philosophers might defend the metaphysical supervenience of the ethical by applying the general strategy suggested at the beginning of this section, while rejecting the case for thinking this strategy has specifically conceptual implications. Other philosophers will reject the idea that we should begin with the sorts of judgments about cases that drove the general strategy. They can instead argue that the metaphysical supervenience of the ethical is supported as an abstract consequence of the best overall empirical theory concerning ethical facts (e.g. Sturgeon 2009, 61).

Other philosophers reject the conceptual and metaphysical supervenience of the ethical, but claim that it nonetheless supervenes nomically or normatively. In general, such supervenience theses are too weak to support the sorts of arguments from ethical supervenience that philosophers have made. Because of this, these theses will be discussed in Section 5.4, which concerns doubts about ethical supervenience.

Finally, how should we decide between ontological and ascriptive supervenience theses? Proponents of ascriptive supervenience take on the obligation of making precise the sort of mistake that ‘supervenience-violators’ are allegedly making, and defending the idea that this is a mistake. The most prominent approach takes the mistake to be conceptual, which involves commitments similar to those taken on by defenders of the conceptual supervenience theses just discussed.

One reason to focus on ascriptive supervenience theses is that some philosophers deny that our ethical thought and talk commits us to the existence of ethical facts and properties. Such philosophers can still grant that if we interpret supervenience in an ascriptive way, it provides important insights into ethics. Further, philosophers who accept that there are ethical facts and properties can also accept ascriptive supervenience theses about ethical thought. Indeed, if we understand Ascriptive as a conceptual claim, then together with realism it could provide the basis for accepting a conceptual-strength ethical supervenience thesis. This means that ascriptive ethical supervenience theses have the potential to be a point of significant common ground between philosophers with widely differing views about the nature of ethical thought and talk. And this might make them especially dialectically powerful in arguments that appeal to ethical supervenience.

3. Arguments from Ethical Supervenience

This section examines arguments in and about ethics that philosophers have made which appeal centrally to ethical supervenience as a premise. The bulk of the section discusses the most influential supervenience arguments in ethics, which have concerned realism and reduction, before considering the significance of ethical supervenience for the epistemology of ethics, and for debates about the existence of ethical principles.

3.1 Arguments against realism

The earliest influential discussions of what we now call supervenience in ethics focused on its significance for substantive ethical investigation. Henry Sidgwick draws from it what he takes to be a ‘practical rule of some value’ for such investigation (1907, 208–9). And G. E. Moore (1922) used the idea as part of his attempt to explain the idea of intrinsic value. Given that Moore and Sidgwick were both ethical realists, it is perhaps striking that the most influential philosophical use of ethical supervenience has been in arguments against ethical realism.

In his argument for error theory, J. L. Mackie briefly claims that supervenience makes trouble for the realist. His quick argument can usefully serve as a prelude to the more detailed discussion to come. Mackie suggests that we think that actions have their ethical properties because they have some natural features. For example, we think a certain action wrong because it is cruel. He denies that this ‘because’ references a conceptual entailment, and thinks this raises two questions: (1) what sort of relation is the connection being referred to? And (2) how do we come to know that actions stand in this relation? (1977, 41). As it stands, Mackie’s questions serve more as a research agenda than an argument. It appears plausible that realists should aim to have something illuminating to say both about the nature of the relation between the ethical and base properties, and a credible epistemology for how we come to know such relations. But Mackie’s questions do not yet constitute an argument that realists cannot achieve these aims.

Simon Blackburn developed the supervenience argument against realism in a considerably more formidable and influential form. The details of Blackburn’s various presentations of his argument (1971, 1984, and 1985) are complex and raise difficult interpretive questions; the reconstruction that follows is a rather free interpretation of Blackburn’s (1984, 183–4). The argument starts with two claims:

  1. It is conceptually necessary that if any two things are naturalistically identical, then they are ethically identical
  2. No specific naturalistic description of an action conceptually entails an ethical description. For example, act-utilitarianism is not a conceptual truth, neither is Kantianism, etc.

Now let ‘N’ be a complete naturalistic description of an action, and ‘E’ be a complete ethical description of an action. Let ‘A’ and ‘B’ name actions.

  1. It is conceptually impossible that A is N&E but B is N&not-E (from 1)
  2. It is conceptually possible that an act is N&E, and also conceptually possible that an act is N&not-E (from (2))
  3. Consider now

    1. A being N&E, and
    2. B being N&not-E:

    (i) and (ii) are each conceptually possible (from 4), but they are not conceptually co-possible: if (i) is true then (ii) is false (from 3) (call this the ban on mixed worlds)

This ban on mixed worlds is supposed to be difficult for the realist to explain. For (2) seems to show that there is no conceptual link between ‘wrong’ and any one of our naturalistic words. And if ‘wrong’ names a property (as the realist claims), then given this conceptual separation, it seems that we should be able to identify conceptual possibilities by arbitrarily ‘mixing and matching’ naturalistic and ethical properties. The ‘ban on mixed worlds’ is exactly a ban on some such mixing and matching, and this appears puzzling.

Consider four possible ways that the realist might reply. First, the realist could seek to debunk the challenge. For example, she might do this by denying that the ethical supervenes with conceptual necessity (see the previous section for discussion). Or she might reject the supervenience of the ethical on the natural (see Section 1.1), and challenge Blackburn to identify a supervenience base for which the argument remains potent.

Second, the realist might seek to explain the pattern of individual conceptual possibility without conceptual co-possibility. For example, if it were a conceptual truth that ethical properties were natural properties, then this would explain the pattern of knowledge suggested here (Dreier 1992, 20). An analogy may help to make this vivid: it might be a conceptual truth that physical properties are natural properties (compare Kim 2011). But which total naturalistic patterns in the world the physical properties covary with is arguably an empirical question. One might take these examples to illustrate a general reply: the pattern is not puzzling because it simply reflects the limitation of our conceptually-based insight into reality (Shafer-Landau 2003, 86).

Third, some realists are prepared to claim more ambitiously that we can give a conceptual analysis of rightness in base terms (e.g. Jackson 1998, Ch. 5). Such philosophers can thereby deny (2), cutting the argument off at the knees. (Dreier 1992, 17–18 suggests that Blackburn’s argument simply begs the question against this sort of reductive naturalist.) Such realists take on the burden of rejecting the most famous argument in metaethics: G. E. Moore’s ‘open question argument’ (1903, Ch. 1). However, it is a hotly contested question what—if any—probative value this argument has (for discussion, see section 2 of the entry on moral non-naturalism).

A fourth reply would be to shrug off the alleged explanatory challenge. The ban on mixed worlds in (5) is supposed to be a conceptual truth. And the ban is a coherent feature of a concept. This means that we could choose to introduce a concept that exemplified that feature. It might thus be suggested that Blackburn’s argument shows only that we have chosen to do so with our ethical concepts (compare Olson 2014, 89–90). One might reply to this last point that it is precisely this choice that needs to be explained. Blackburn argues that the non-cognitivist has a smooth functionalist explanation for why our ethical thought and talk includes the ban on mixed worlds (see Section 3.3 below for discussion), while for the realist, this might just be an unexplained peculiarity.

3.2 Arguments for reduction

As was just noted, a certain kind of reductive naturalist seems to have an easy reply to Blackburn’s argument. In light of this, it is perhaps unsurprising that several philosophers have argued that ethical supervenience theses support reductionist forms of ethical realism against non-reductive forms (Jackson 1998, Ridge 2007, Brown 2011). Consider a few important variants of such arguments.

The first is a simplified version of arguments due to Frank Jackson (1998, Ch. 5) and Campbell Brown (2011). The argument has two steps. The first step is an argument that if the ethical properties strongly (or globally) metaphysically supervene on the base properties, then there is no metaphysically possible ethical difference between states that does not have a correlated base difference between the same states. If we make some liberal assumptions about property types, this entails in turn that there is a base property that is necessarily coextensive with every ethical property.

The second step of the argument is the claim that necessarily coextensive properties are identical. Brown offers a nice motivation for this thesis: we should commit ourselves to the existence of a property only insofar as it can do explanatory work, and the only way for a property to do explanatory work is for it to distinguish metaphysical possibilities (2011, 213).

While both steps of the argument are controversial, the second stage has come in for especially heavy fire (for a careful discussion of the dialectical significance of Jackson’s argument, see Suikkanen 2010). One important basis for doubt is that many contemporary philosophers question whether modality constitutes the fundamental explanatory currency of metaphysics, as Brown seems to presuppose (for an especially influential challenge see Fine 1994, for an especially radical challenge, see Sider 2011, Ch. 12).

The argument for reduction from metaphysical supervenience can, however, be prosecuted within frameworks that reject Jackson’s and Brown’s core motivation and assumptions. Jackson and Brown assume that successful reductions reveal non-obvious identities. This is a powerful model of reduction. For example, a standard way of characterizing the physicalistic reduction of heat is that the heat in a volume of gas is identical to the mean molecular kinetic energy of that volume of gas, which is a physical property. However, there is no consensus concerning how to understand reduction as a metaphysical relation (for a taste of the controversy, see McPherson 2015, Sec. 3, and the entry on scientific reduction and the discussion of reduction in the entry on David Lewis).

The core idea at stake in debates over reduction is that commitment to the existence of the reduced properties should constitute no ontological commitment ‘over and above’ commitment to the reducing properties. Some philosophers have sought to spell out this idea by appealing to real definition rather than identity. Consider an example: one might take oneself to have offered a reduction of the number one, in claiming that: what it is to be the number one is just to be the successor of zero. One important contrast with the identity conception is that on the real definition conception, successful reductions reveal metaphysical structure. Thus, one might say in our example that the number one is ‘built out of’ the number zero and the successor function.

On an essentialist account of modality, all necessities are to be explained by facts about the essences of things. On this sort of view, the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical would seemingly entail that the ethical possibilities are fully explained by the essences of the base entities. As Ralph Wedgwood (2007, Ch.9) points out, when the real definition account of reduction is combined with this essentialist account of modality, this can appear to entail the reduction of the ethical facts to base facts.

Interestingly, Wedgwood reject this reductive conclusion. He argues that some necessary truths (including ethical supervenience theses) can be explained by certain contingent truths, together with facts about essences, and that this sort of explanation does not have reductive implications (2007, Sec. 9.3; for critical discussion of this response, see McPherson 2009, Sec 3, and especially Schmitt and Schroeder 2011).

3.3 Supervenience and anti-realism

As Section 3.1 explained, supervenience arguments were initially used by Mackie and Blackburn to raise doubts about ethical realism. Indeed, it has been widely assumed that the realist faces a challenge here that the anti-realist does not. The issues here are complicated, and it will be helpful to consider common varieties of ethical anti-realism separately.

First, consider ethical nihilism, the thesis that there are no ethical properties. The ethical nihilist might seem to have an easy time explaining ethical supervenience: if there are no ethical properties, there are, trivially, no ethical differences. And if there are no ethical differences, there are no ethical differences without base differences.

This line of reasoning is too quick as it stands. Supervenience is a modal claim, so contingent ethical nihilism—the thesis that there are no actually instantiated ethical properties—cannot explain ethical supervenience. Indeed, as Christian Coons (2011) has shown, it is possible to use supervenience to construct an interesting argument against contingent nihilism. A crucial question here is: what is the modality of the supervenience thesis to be accounted for? If the supervenience thesis we need to explain is conceptual, then even the truth of non-contingent nihilism—the thesis that it is metaphysically impossible for ethical properties to be instantiated—would not do the relevant explanatory work. Only the thesis that the instantiation of ethical properties is conceptually impossible would suffice. (Note that the nihilist might be able to adapt one of the realist replies to Blackburn discussed in Section 3.1, but in this case it would not be easier for the nihilist to explain supervenience.)

The nihilist imagined above does not question the idea that ordinary ethical thought and talk commits us to ontological claims. Other ethical anti-realists, however, will deny this (for discussion, see the entries on moral anti-realism and moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism). Consider two examples of such views.

First, hermeneutic fictionalists about ethical thought and talk argue that such thought and talk is to be understood as a form of pretense or fictional discourse (see Kalderon 2005 for discussion and defense). It will be natural for the hermeneutic fictionalist to reject ordinary supervenience claims as misleading. However, they will presumably still need to account for the considerations that lead other philosophers to accept ethical supervenience claims. The issues concerning ethical fictionalism and supervenience are comparatively unexplored; see (Nolan, Restall, and West 2005, 325–327) for important preliminary discussion.

Second (and much more influentially) some non-cognitivists about ethical thought and talk deny that our ethical claims express beliefs about the ethical character of the world, suggesting instead that they express desire-like mental states. Such a view may make ontological supervenience claims about ethics appear misleading at best. More interesting is the question of what non-cognitivists can say about the sort of ascriptive supervenience thesis discussed in Section 1.4:

Anyone who treats base-identical circumstances as ethically different from each other thereby makes a mistake.

This thesis is a correctness constraint on ethical thought and talk. Prominent philosophers in the non-cognitivist tradition (broadly understood) have characteristically claimed that their views enabled them to explain theses like Ascriptive.

Consider a representative sample of these explanations. R. M. Hare claims that ascriptive supervenience holds because a significant part of the function of moralizing is to teach others our ethical standards, and the only way to do that is to get our audience to see the recognizable pattern that we are prescribing that they follow (1952, 134). According to Simon Blackburn, the presumption of ascriptive supervenience is required by the idea that our ethical attitudes are supposed to be practical guides to decision-making (1984, 186). According to Allan Gibbard (2003, Ch. 5), ascriptive supervenience for ethical thought is explained by a consistency norm on planning states.

Critics of non-cognitivism (e.g. Zangwill 1997, 110–11; Sturgeon 2009) have challenged the rationales offered by Hare and Blackburn. Suppose that we grant that consistency is useful, given the various functions of ethical discourse. It is unclear why this usefulness should force on us a conceptual truth about moralizing. Further, it is arguable that all that is required for these practical purposes is consistency within worlds that are very similar to the actual world. So the idea that such consistency is required over every possible world (as seems to be the case for ethical supervenience) seems like considerably more than the practical considerations require. Gibbard’s rationale has faced related criticism: why must planners be committed to consistency in the sweeping way that Gibbard envisions (Chrisman 2005, 411–12; Sturgeon 2009, 84–87)? If these critics are right, it is not clear that the non-cognitivist has an especially compelling explanation of ethical supervenience. And if they do not, this will complicate their efforts to claim that explaining ethical supervenience is a dialectical advantage against cognitivism.

A further complication arises from the fact that leading contemporary heirs of non-cognitivism (such as Blackburn and Gibbard) have abandoned anti-realism. Instead, they have adopted what Simon Blackburn (e.g. 1993) has dubbed the ‘quasi-realist’ program. This involves the claim that one can, while beginning with the non-cognitivist’s framework, ‘earn the right’ to realist-sounding claims about ethical truth and objectivity (for further discussion see the supplement on quasi-realism and projectivism in the entry on moral anti-realism).

Now consider an ontological supervenience claim: that there can be no difference in ethical properties without a difference in base properties. The quasi-realist program can seem to commit the quasi-realist to accepting this claim. Dreier (2015) argues that this leads to a further challenge to the non-cognitivist: even if she can explain ascriptive supervenience, it is not clear that she can explain ontological supervenience. If this is the case, the most influential contemporary non-cognitivists may find that supervenience is a dialectical burden rather than benefit.

3.4 Supervenience and moral epistemology

So far, this entry has focused on the significance of supervenience for claims about the nature of ethical thought, talk, and metaphysics. However, influential early discussions of this sort of thesis seemed to have something else in mind. For example, Section 2.2 above quoted an evocative passage from Henry Sidgwick. But Sidgwick’s point was not to argue about the metaphysics of ethics. Rather, he was proposing a supervenience-like idea as an epistemological corrective to ad hoc special pleading in one’s ethical reasoning (1907, 209).

The mere fact of supervenience could not play this sort of role: after all, the supervenience of the ethical is compatible with the idea that everyone ought always to do what I want them to do. However, Sidgwick points to an important idea: that we expect there to be a ‘rational explanation’ for any ethical fact. One ambitious way of developing this idea has been suggested by Nick Zangwill (2006). According to Zangwill, a central conceptual constraint on ethical reasoning is the ‘because constraint’: when we judge something to be wrong (or to have another ethical property), we are committed to its having this property because it has some other property. Zangwill claims that this principle “either is, or explains” ethical supervenience (2006, 273). And Zangwill goes on to argue that this constraint has striking epistemological implications: he claims that it entails that our only epistemic access to facts about the distribution of ethical properties is by knowing about the distribution of base properties, and knowing ethical principles that link the presence of base properties to ethical properties (2006, 274). He then argues that our knowledge of these ethical principles could itself only be a priori (2006, 276). If Zangwill is right about this, then the a priori character of moral epistemology can be derived from claims about the supervenience of the ethical.

One worry about this argument is that it might overgeneralize. The ‘because’ structure seems to be shared by other normative domains: it would be very odd to claim that a particular chess move was winning, or that a particular action was illegal, without being committed to their being some general explanation in terms of the rules of chess, or the law, that explains this particular fact. It is not clear in Zangwill’s text what exactly prohibits our knowledge of ethical principles being empirical rather than a priori, as knowledge of legal statutes and the rules of chess are.

3.5 Supervenience and the existence of ethical principles

One traditional assumption about ethics is that our ethical obligations can be expressed by general ethical principles. This assumption has recently been challenged by ethical particularists, who claim that our ethical reasons and obligations cannot be codified. Supervenience might seem to be relevant to this debate. For as Section 3.2 above showed, some philosophers argue that the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical entails that for every ethical property, there will be a base property that is necessarily coextensive with it. Focusing on wrongness, this in turn has the apparent consequence that there is a base property B such that:

It is metaphysically necessary that an action is wrong just in case that action is B.

One might think that Entailment just is the schema for an ethical principle concerning wrongness: for example, if we substitute ‘fails to maximize happiness’ for ‘is B’ we seem to get a clear statement of a utilitarian ethical principle. And this in turn might seem to cast doubt on the coherence of particularism.

There are several reasons to think this line of reasoning is too quick. First, supervenience itself in no way guarantees that B will be some simple base property like happiness-maximization. B might instead be enormously complicated: at the limit, supervenience is compatible with B simply being a disjunction of an infinitely long list of complete base specifications of various possible worlds. Call this the monstrous entailment thesis. The crucial issue is whether the monstrous entailment thesis should count as an ethical principle.

One worry about the monstrous entailment thesis is that the resulting ‘principle’ does not mention repeatable instances, because each disjunct is a complete base description of a possible world (compare Dancy 2004, 87; Tsu 2011, 3). Another worry stems from the assumption that genuine ethical principles have explanatory power. Margaret Little argues that the ‘radical over-specificity’ of theses like the monstrous entailment thesis renders them non-explanatory, and hence inapt to be principles (2000, 286). Finally, we ordinarily assume that ethical principles would be usable by agents (Dancy 2004, 87–8), but the monstrous thesis is clearly not. (For a related argument that the true instance of Entailment could not be monstrous, because it would need to be learnable by ordinary speakers, see Jackson, Pettit, and Smith 2000).

4. Metaphysical Supervenience and Ethical Realism

Blackburn’s argument against ethical realism relies crucially on the assumption that ethical supervenience is a conceptual truth. For thesis (2) was crucial to that argument:

2. No specific naturalistic description of an action conceptually entails an ethical description….

While many find (2) plausible, fewer would be prepared to accept a purely metaphysical version of this thesis, such as:

2*. No base way a world could be metaphysically necessitates that world being a certain ethical way.

This is because thesis (2*) is inconsistent with the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical, which very many philosophers accept. This means that a purely metaphysical variant of Blackburn’s argument will not be plausible.

This does not mean, however, that insisting that ethical supervenience is not a conceptual truth renders it dialectically inert. This section considers the significance of metaphysical supervenience for ethical realism: does it pose a challenge to ethical realism? If so, how can we best understand this challenge? And what resources do different sorts of ethical realist have to meet the challenge?

To focus our discussion, assume this metaphysical variant of Strong Intuitive:

Intuitive Metaphysical.
If two metaphysically possible entities are alike in all base respects, they are alike in all ethical respects.

Recall the Sidgwickian motivation for accepting ethical supervenience, introduced in Section 2. According to this motivation, we should accept an ethical supervenience thesis because doing so rules out the implausible hypothesis of brute ethical contingency. Intuitive Metaphysical clearly satisfies this motivation: it permits no brutely contingent ethical variation. However, suppose that it was not possible to explain why the ethical supervenes on the base properties. Then the very thesis that we used to explain why there was no brute ethical contingency would turn out to be something arguably even more peculiar. It would be a metaphysically necessary connection that nonetheless has what Sidgwick might call ‘arbitrary element in which we have to acquiesce’—in a slogan, a brute necessity.

Some philosophers have argued that there are no necessary connections between ‘distinct existences’, a claim that is sometimes called Hume’s dictum. Hume’s dictum faces at least two formidable challenges. The first is to clarify the dictum in such a way that it is both interesting and a plausible candidate for truth. For example, consider that many non-identical properties are necessarily connected: a surface’s being scarlet entails that it is red, but being scarlet is not identical to being red. Red and scarlet, then, must not count as distinct. This raises the question: what principle are we invoking to adjudicate distinctness? If we use necessary connection as a criterion, then Hume’s dictum turns out to be a trivial way of tracking this way of using the word ‘distinct’. Second, Hume’s dictum is usually defended on directly intuitive grounds. This raises a deep methodological question: if we notice a conflict between Hume’s dictum and another intuitively plausible claim, why should we retain Hume’s dictum and jettison the other claim? (For helpful discussion of Hume’s Dictum, see Wilson 2010).

In light of this, Tristram McPherson (2012) proposes that we focus on the idea of a brute—or inexplicable—necessary connection (for a similar idea in a different context, compare Levine and Trogdon 2009). On this way of thinking, we are entitled to a default ‘recombinability’ assumption about modality: that for any pair of properties F and G, it is possible that there is an x that is both F and G, that x is only one and not the other, and that there is an x that is neither F nor G. However, this default assumption can be defeated. Consider red and scarlet: on one view, to be red just is to be scarlet or crimson or cherry red or… The thesis that this is what it is to be red, if true, would provide a straightforward explanation of why being scarlet supervenes on being red. If we can provide such an explanation of a supervenience relationship, it is unobjectionable. However, if we cannot, we are committed to a brute metaphysical necessity, which we should be loathe to accept, according to McPherson.

This puts us in a position to pose a supervenience-based metaphysical challenge to the ethical realist: given that the ethical properties metaphysically supervene on the base properties, can the realist provide an adequate explanation of this striking modal fact? Different variants of ethical realism have different resources available to address this challenge. The remainder of this section examines some of these resources.

4.1 Reductive explanations of ethical supervenience

As Section 3.2 explained, some philosophers have argued that the supervenience of the ethical entails that the ethical can be reduced. These arguments are quite controversial, but it is perhaps less controversial that a successful reduction of the ethical properties would suffice to explain supervenience.

Consider first a reductive account that identified the ethical properties with some natural or supernatural property. Assuming that natural and supernatural properties are among the base properties, the supervenience of rightness on the base properties would be easily explained on this view: because rightness is a base property, on this view, there clearly cannot be a difference in rightness without some difference in base properties.

Consider next a reductive view on which the modal connection between ethical and base properties followed from the essences (or ‘real definitions’) of certain properties. If essentialist explanations are legitimate, this appears to be a straightforward way of explaining the supervenience of the ethical. Part of the idea of real definition is that necessarily, nothing can survive the loss of one of its definitive properties. So if rightness were given a real definition purely in terms of base properties, then it would again be clear why there could be no difference in rightness without a difference in base properties.

The case from metaphysical supervenience suggested above appears to have no teeth against either sort of reductive theory, for both theories are able to explain supervenience, and hence avoid commitment to a brute necessary connection between the ethical properties and the base properties.

Terence Horgan and Mark Timmons claim that even if the ethical realist endorses reduction, they face a further explanatory burden before they can fully explain supervenience: “Even if goodness, for instance, is identical to some specific natural property, there remains the task of explaining why this natural property, rather than any other one(s), counts as the correct referent of the term ‘goodness’” (1992, 230; emphasis in original). This is a fair explanatory demand, if we interpret it as the familiar challenge to provide a plausible theory of reference for ethical terms (a demand that Horgan and Timmons have pressed incisively). However this challenge does not appear to have anything distinctive to do with supervenience. Either the reductive naturalistic realist can explain the reference of ‘wrong’, in which case she can also explain supervenience, or she cannot explain the reference of ‘wrong’ in which case her view is implausible for reasons that have nothing to do with supervenience.

4.2 Functionalist explanations of ethical supervenience

One influential account of metaphysical structure, especially in the philosophy of mind, has been functionalism. Here is a simplified toy example of a functional analysis: any system that takes some money as an input, and reliably produces a coke as an output, thereby counts as a coke machine. On this account, the kind coke machine is individuated by input-output relations. A functional kind is any kind that can be individuated in this way. Because functional kinds are not individuated by the nature of the stuff that realizes the functional relations, they are often claimed to be paradigmatically friendly to multiple realization. Thus, given my characterization of coke machines, such a machine could be instantiated by a structure composed of metal or of plastic or perhaps even of spooky supernatural stuff. In light of this possibility of multiple realization, the relationship of functionalism to reduction is controversial: many philosophers have taken multiple realizability to constitute a barrier to reduction, but others disagree. (See the entries on functionalism and multiple realization for useful discussion).

Now consider a version of ethical realism that takes ethical properties to be functional properties. Such a view, like the reductionist view, appears well-placed to explain the metaphysical supervenience of the ethical. This is because functional properties necessarily covary with the class of properties that are their possible realizers. If, for example, every complex property that could realize a coke machine is a natural property, then there could be no ‘coke machine difference’ without a naturalistic difference. Similarly, if ethical properties are functional properties that could only be realized by certain of the base properties, then the supervenience of the ethical on the base properties would be smoothly explained.

4.3 Grounding explanations of ethical supervenience

The strategies for explaining ethical supervenience discussed in the preceding two sections are useful to reductionist and functionalist ethical realists. However, many contemporary ethical realists reject both functionalism and reductionism about ethical properties. Most strikingly, several contemporary ethical realists are non-naturalists, claiming that the ethical properties are a distinct and irreducible class of properties (see the entry on moral non-naturalism for discussion). Several philosophers have argued that ethical supervenience poses a distinctive problem for the non-naturalist (Dreier 1992, ms; Ridge 2007; McPherson 2012 ). So it is worth asking what metaphysical resources non-naturalists might have for explaining the supervenience of the ethical.

A salient place to begin is with the grounding relation. As was noted in Section 1, grounding has recently been theorized as an asymmetrical explanatory metaphysical relationship (For an introduction to grounding, see the entry on metaphysical grounding; for a useful discussion of relevant issues in the context of ethics, see Väyrynen 2013). It is thus natural to ask whether the non-naturalist could explain the supervenience of the ethical on the base properties by appealing to the fact that: facts about the base properties fully ground facts about the instantiation of the ethical properties.

A natural question at this point concerns why such a grounding relationship holds. Following Fine (1994) and Rosen (2010), one might argue that many or all grounding facts are themselves explained in essentialist terms. And as Section 4.1 suggested, these essentialist explanations can appear to have reductionist implications. An alternative is to take grounding facts between distinct kinds of properties to be metaphysically fundamental laws (Rosen 2010, Sec. 13 calls these ‘Moorean connections’). This threatens to raise the same concerns that brute supervenience did: Why is there a metaphysical law linking these otherwise distinct properties? One potential option here is to claim that such laws are the most metaphysically fundamental facts about the ethical (cf. Scanlon 2014, Ch. 2; Schroeder 2014). A great deal will potentially hinge on whether such laws are unique to the case of the ethical. If so, positing them may look more like ad hoc pleading than explanation. By contrast, if such laws are ubiquitous in metaphysical explanation (as suggested in Kment 2014, Section 6.2.3), or characteristic of a distinctive range of metaphysical explanations (as proposed by Skarsaune 2015, Sec. 7) then appeal to them may be considerably less problematic.

Of course, this barely scratches the surface of possible metaphysical explanations of supervenience. Among the many other options, replies grounded in appeals to tropes or universals have garnered explicit attention (Ridge 2007, Suikkanen 2010). As with the appeal to grounding, a central question about such strategies is whether they constitute genuine explanatory progress, or whether they simply explain one necessity by appealing to some further brute necessity.

4.4 Analytic and conceptual explanations of ethical supervenience

This and the next subsection consider non-metaphysical replies to the bruteness challenge that can potentially be deployed by a variety of ethical realists, including non-naturalists.

The first strategy appeals to analytic or conceptual truths. Suppose that an ethical realist accepts the popular view that ethical supervenience is an analytic truth. She might put her view this way:

Intuitive Metaphysical is an analytic truth.

The core idea is that the truth of Analytic explains the truth of Intuitive Metaphysical (our paradigmatic metaphysical supervenience thesis). Why do the ethical and base properties covary? On this account, it is perhaps because it is definitional of “ethical” that nothing could count as an ethical property unless it covaried in this way. This strategy claims to meet the bruteness challenge: the necessary connection is explained by the way a property would have to be, in order to be what we talk about when we talk about ethical properties (cf. Stratton-Lake and Hooker 2006).

Consider three brief worries about this strategy. The first is that on some influential contemporary accounts of analyticity, analyticity does not guarantee truth. For example, one account of analyticity is that for a sentence “S” to be analytic in a language L is for competence with L to dispose a speaker to accept “S”. And some philosophers (e.g. Eklund 2002) have argued that there are inconsistent sets of sentences that satisfy this condition. If this is right, Intuitive Metaphysical’s being analytic in English would not guarantee its being true.

The second worry is broadly intuitive. Analytic alone does not appear to guarantee that the supervenience of the ethical follows from the other aspects of the nature of ethical properties. And this suggests that, for all Analytic says, we can conceive of ethical* properties, which have every feature characteristic of ethical properties, except that they do not supervene. But this may lead us to wonder: why give the ethical properties the role in our lives that we do, and ignore the ethical* properties, just because they do not supervene? (This point is due to work in progress by David Faraci.)

The third worry is that even if the truth of Analytic entails the truth of Intuitive Metaphysical, it nonetheless arguably does nothing to explain why the supervenience relationship holds. Consider an analogy: suppose that the infallible oracle tells you that the ethical supervenes on the base properties. The oracle’s testimony entails the truth of Intuitive Metaphysical, but it does nothing to explain why it is true (compare McPherson 2012, 221–222, Dreier 2015). For example, the oracle’s testimony is compatible with Intuitive Metaphysical being true because reductive ethical realism is true, in which case it obviously provides no explanatory aid to ethical realists who deny reduction. It may be helpful here to restate the challenge:

  1. Intuitive Metaphysical is true
  2. Some theories (perhaps: ethical reductionism, ethical functionalism, and some forms of ethical nihilism…) can explain why Intuitive Metaphysical is true
  3. Other theories (perhaps: Moorean non-naturalism) cannot explain why Intuitive Metaphysical is true: Intuitive Metaphysical is just a brute necessity on these views.
  4. Positing a brute necessary connection between properties counts significantly against a theory, relative to its competitors
  5. So considerations of supervenience count significantly against certain theories (perhaps: Moorean non-naturalism), relative to competitors that do not posit brute connections

If claims of analytic truth at best reinforce (1), then appeal to such truths cannot help the realist in her task.

This argument (like the rest of this entry thus far) has followed the common practice of lumping together the notions of analytic truth and conceptual truth. However, in a recent paper, Terence Cuneo and Russ Shafer-Landau (2014) have argued that distinguishing these two permits them to develop an attractive form of moral realism, and also enables them to explain the supervenience of the moral properties. They distinguish analytic and conceptual truth as follows: for a sentence to be analytically true is for it to be true in virtue of the meanings of the terms that constitute it. By contrast, for a proposition to be a conceptual truth is for it to be true wholly in virtue of the essences of its constituent concepts (ibid., 410–11). Concepts, in turn, are to be understood as abstract non-mental objects. One has a propositional thought in virtue of being appropriately related to some of these objects.

Cuneo and Shafer-Landau then offer a ‘reversal argument’, which entails that some conceptual truths about morality are ‘fact-makers’: that is, some of the facts about the distribution of moral properties are grounded in facts about moral concepts (ibid., 418–421). This puts them in a position to avoid the complaint that I just made about Analytic: on their view, conceptual truths really do metaphysically explain (some) of the relations between the moral and the base properties. They then propose that such connections quite generally explain the supervenience of the moral.

It is worth emphasizing the commitments of this ingenious proposal. Consider one central issue. Cuneo and Shafer-Landau argue for the existence of several substantive-seeming conceptual truths about morality. As they admit, their view is quite heterodox in virtue of this. However, they nowhere claim that all necessary moral truths can all be explained as conceptual. That, of course, would be a much stronger claim, and much harder to motivate. However, Intuitive Metaphysical is a quite general modal covariance thesis, and in light of this, only the stronger claim would suffice to explain its truth.

4.5 Ethical explanations of ethical supervenience

Several philosophers have suggested that we can offer ethical explanations of the supervenience relation (Kramer 2009, Ch. 10; Olson 2014, §5.1, Scanlon 2014, 38ff; other philosophers, such as Dworkin 1996 and Blackburn 1998, 311 also appear committed to this idea). For example, one might think that the dictum treat like cases alike! is an ethical requirement of ethical reasoning. Or one might think that all ethical truths are grounded in certain fundamental ethical truths that are relational: for example, a fundamental truth might be that it is wrong to torture someone purely for fun. This truth states a relationship between ethical and non-ethical properties. If all ethical facts are explained by such fundamental ethical truths, then these truths could seemingly explain why there are certain necessary connections between ethical and non-ethical properties.

One worry about this strategy is that one might take a mark of ethical realism to be commitment to a truthmaker thesis, according to which ethical truths are metaphysically explained by (or grounded in) the patterns of instantiation of ethical properties. The normative explanation strategy seems to invert this intuitive order of explanation, by having the distribution of ethical properties explained by ethical truths.

Suppose that we rejected this idea in an especially radical way, insisting instead on the reverse order of metaphysical explanation everywhere. The nature of every property, we might say, is wholly grounded in some relevant subset of the true propositions. Provided that we can recover the idea of metaphysical explanation within this framework, we will be able to isolate the set of propositions that state metaphysically unexplained necessary connections. And it is natural to think that the brute necessities worry could be expressed within this framework as objecting to accepting such propositions. The problem is that fundamental normative principles, as invoked in the ‘normative explanation’ strategy, would seem to be of exactly the objectionable sort.

5. Arguments against Ethical Supervenience, or its Significance

As the preceding sections have shown, philosophers have tried to extract a number of striking conclusions using ethical supervenience as a premise. Part of the motivation for these attempts is that ethical supervenience is widely perceived to be an enormously powerful dialectical weapon: if your view is incompatible with ethical supervenience, then it is in trouble. This section considers challenges to this status.

5.1 Arguments against supervenience from thick ethical concepts

It is now common to distinguish ‘thick’ ethical concepts—like courage—from ‘thin’ ethical concepts—like ought or good (for an introduction to thick ethical concepts, see Roberts 2013) Courage seems like an ethical concept: we expect each other to treat courage as a virtue and not a vice. However, competent use of thick ethical concepts seems to require recognition that only certain sorts of grounds make an ascription of such a concept apt. To adapt Monty Python’s example, it seems conceptually inapt to say that Sir Robin was courageous in light of his running away from his enemies, even if we think that is what he ought to have done.

Jonathan Dancy (1995, 278–9) and James Griffin (1992) have suggested that attention to thick ethical concepts casts doubt on ethical supervenience. Both Griffin and Dancy suggest that indistinguishability between cases in ‘thin’ ethical terms can sometimes be best explained by indistinguishability in ‘thick’ ethical terms, where a further naturalistic explanation is not obviously forthcoming. Dancy suggests that, on the account of thick concepts that he develops, naturalistic indistinguishability does not entail thick indistinguishability (1995, 278), and this leads him to doubt whether the ethical supervenes. One surprising implication of Dancy’s suggestion is that two possible worlds could be wholly non-ethically identical, but be such that Doris’ action is brave in the first world, but not brave in the second.

Griffin, by contrast, concedes that—strictly speaking—the ethical supervenes on the natural in these sorts of case (1992, 319). But he suggests that mere supervenience of this kind is ‘much less interesting’ than a more ambitious alternative relation. The alternative begins by assuming that—perhaps in order for supervenience to play its distinctive role as an alternative to reduction—the ethical and the natural must be precisely distinguishable. Griffin further assumes that the relevant supervenience relationship needs to be explanatorily illuminating. In light of this, the supervenience base would need to be ‘tightened’: we would need to narrow things down from all of the natural properties, to those natural properties that play a role in explaining the ethical status of a thing. Griffin argues that the example of thick ethical concepts provides reason for skepticism that there is an ethical supervenience relation that satisfies his two assumptions (1992, 314–319).

5.2 Arguments against the epistemic credentials of ethical supervenience

Section 2 noted that there are few extended defenses ethical supervenience. This might suggest that the evidence for the supervenience is overwhelming. However, it might instead be a sign that supervenience is a dogma, accepted without adequate critical examination. This section briefly explains two challenges to the epistemic credentials of ethical supervenience.

As was just noted, Griffin worries that the bare claim that the ethical supervenes on the natural would be ‘uninteresting’. Part of Griffin’s concern is that such a thesis would not do the sort of explanatory work made possible by bolder theses. Joseph Raz briefly suggests that this explanatory poverty gives us reason to doubt whether the ethical supervenes. According to Raz, ethical supervenience neither provides more specific theses that allow us to concretely explain the ethical features of reality, nor guarantees that we can find such explanatory theses (2000, 54–5). If we assume that we should accept only those theoretical claims that do substantial explanatory work, then this casts doubt on ethical supervenience as a theoretical claim.

Section 2 above suggested a different explanatory case for supervenience: general ethical supervenience theses serve to explain the host of specific ethical supervenience patterns that we notice. These patterns are perhaps not themselves explanatory. But they may seem difficult to intelligibly deny, at least pending a developed moral epistemology that might adjudicate their epistemic credentials.

Alison Hills (2009) argues that we can seek to undermine the case for supervenience by granting that in many cases ethical difference without naturalistic difference seems inconceivable, and arguing that we should not take inconceivability here to be a good guide to impossibility. She suggests that the appearance of inconceivability may be grounded in our unwillingness to engage in certain distasteful imaginative exercises.

Hills bolsters this case by arguing that if we consider a controversial and low-stakes case—say, whether a certain lie made with benevolent motives is permissible—we are able to conceive of such a lie being either permissible or impermissible. But, she suggests, if we can conceive of it as being permissible, and as being impermissible, we have shown that we are able to conceive of two ethically inconsistent possible worlds. Further, this low-stakes case is easier to conceive of than the possibility of Hitler being a moral paragon, and Hills suggests that this supports the idea that conceivability is grounded in our willingness to imagine certain possibilities, for we presumably have a stronger desire to avoid imagining Hitler as a moral paragon than we do to avoid imagining the lower-stakes case.

One worry for this diagnosis is that it may target the wrong sorts of cases. Consider: I cannot remember the atomic number of plutonium. So it is conceivable to me that plutonium atoms have any of a fairly wide range of numbers of protons. But I do not think that it is possible both that one plutonium atom has n protons, and that some other possible plutonium atom has n+10 protons. If any plutonium atom has n protons, they all do. (This stems from my empirically-derived belief that number of protons is essential to the nature of plutonium). Similarly, I can entertain the possibility that certain lies are either permissible or impermissible. But what is hard to wrap one’s head around is the idea that a certain sort of lie in a certain sort of circumstance is both possibly permissible and possibly impermissible.

A different epistemic approach (suggested by work-in-progress by Gideon Rosen) points out that the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical might strike us as highly intuitively plausible even if it failed in some extremely ‘distant’ modal possibilities. This means that an account that explains why ethical supervenience could fail (but only in such distant modal possibilities) could potentially explain our intuitions of strong metaphysical supervenience.

5.3 Arguments against the dialectical significance of ethical supervenience

This section considers a final possibility: accepting ethical supervenience, but denying on general grounds that it can play a significant role in the sorts of arguments discussed in Sections 3 and 4. Consider two ways of implementing this idea.

First, recall from Section 1.1 the difficulties of identifying a plausible and uncontroversial account of what the ethical supervenes on. Nicolas Sturgeon suggests that one conclusion to draw from these difficulties is that there is no dialectically significant ethical supervenience thesis. For example, he accepts the supervenience of the ethical on the natural, but he suggests that his reasons for accepting it are just his reasons for accepting ethical naturalism (2009, 61). He argues that philosophers who reject naturalism are likewise in a position to reject the supervenience of the ethical on the natural (2009, 62–7).

There are two important potential ways of replying to this argument. First, one might seek a non-parochial argument for ethical supervenience, such as the one suggested in Section 2. However, this might not be fully successful: as noted in Section 2, discussions of supervenience seem unavoidably to involve controversial philosophical commitments, for example to various species of modality or to philosophically interesting conceptual truths. Second, one might be able to find dialectically effective parochial arguments. For example, Sturgeon himself seeks to make such an argument against the non-cognitivist (2009, 83–88). To take another example, most ethical non-naturalists grant at least the strong metaphysical supervenience of the ethical on the non-ethical, which allows the brute necessity challenge posed in Section 4 to have dialectical force against them. However, some philosophers have suggested that the complaint about brute necessities is itself a parochial one. For example, Horgan and Timmons (1992, 227) suggest that the objectionability of brute supervenience connections is a distinctively naturalistic commitment. This thought has been embraced by some non-naturalists. For example, Nick Zangwill (1997, 509) suggests that the bruteness of ethical supervenience can simply be embraced.

A second way to deflate the dialectical force of ethical supervenience is to grant that explaining it is a good thing to do, but deny that this is a particularly weighty consideration in the context of theory-choice (compare Enoch 2011, 147–8). The issues here are far from clear, but it is worth emphasizing two costs to this reply. First, embracing brute ethical supervenience is inconsistent with the essentialist account of modality discussed above. (Recall that according to this account, all necessary truths are explained by facts about essences). Because the essentialist account is one of the most powerful and well-developed accounts of modality, embracing inconsistency with it offers up a significant hostage to fortune. Second, the avoidance of brute necessary connections seems to be a central part of metaphysical methodology. Even if modal structure is not the most fundamental metaphysical structure, it is typically treated as a good guide to such structure (Kment, 2015). It is hard to see why this would be so unless necessary connections disclosed some deeper explanatory relationship. This suggests that the philosopher who wishes to find in ethics an exception to this principle may need to provide a clear methodological reason for doing so.


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Many thanks to Jamie Dreier, David Plunkett, Kelly Trogdon, and Jack Woods for illuminating comments on drafts of this entry. In a couple of places, my formulations are indebted to forthcoming work by Gideon Rosen and Pekka Väyrynen.

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